Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Reasons for Action: Justification vs. Explanation

1. I should note that we find a much broader sense of “explanatory reasons” to mean, not just reasons of an agent that feature in the explanation of her action but effectively anything that features in the explanation of anything. See, e.g., Schroeder 2007, 11.

2. See, e.g., Smith 2003, 146. The claim is contested, e.g., by Hursthouse (1991) in the case of what she calls arational actions and by Norman (2001) in the case of irrational actions. For critical discussion of Hursthouse see, e.g., Mele 2003, 71–76, Smith 1998, 158–161. Dancy's position is a little murky. On p. 3 and p. 136 of his 2000 he seems to endorse the strong constitutive claim but, as Smith notes (2003, 149–150), this does not square at all readily with remarks he makes on pp. 85–86.

3. Frankena's lack of clarity over the distinction comes out when he seeks to explain it (44) by contrasting two sorts of considerations one might offer to a deliberating agent favouring or opposing some course of action, considerations that justify (“because you promised to help Smith”) and considerations that speak to his motives (“because if you help Smith he will remember you in his will”). Matters are not much helped when he further characterizes the distinction (on the same page) as “between reasons for acting and reasons for regarding an action as right or justified.” The first term of the distinction as stated here, “reasons for acting” is applicable equally to explanatory and justifying reasons. The second is no less unhelpful partly because reasons to regard an action as justified are also reasons for performing it, partly because it exhibits Frankena's tendency to identify justifying reasons with specifically moral reasons whereas justifying reasons, as such, need have nothing to do with moral concern.

4. An earlier airing of similar thoughts is his 1995. For another attack on psychologism cf. Collins 1997. Darwall (2003) suggests that the issue between Dancy and others such as Smith over psychologism may be largely verbal. What Dancy calls a “motivating reason”, he suggests, Smith could call simply “the agent's reason” while Dancy himself does deny not that there are features of our psychology such as desires that lead us to act, merely that these are what motivate us. I doubt if Darwall is quite right about this and Dancy would I think agree. In his 2000, pp. 164–171, Dancy considers similarly conciliatory thoughts but insists that, on his view, while there may be scope for causal explanations of action, “they cannot include psychologistic ones except in other than a reason-specifying style.” (2000, 167)