Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Reductionism in Biology

1. James Griesemer (2000, 2002) argues for a heuristic use of reduction in the attempt by scientists to relate different scientific theories to one another. This is distinct from the sense of methodological reductionism used here (i.e. it does not focus on how scientists discover molecular mechanisms and develop reductive explanations).

2. The issue of reduction has played a substantial role in both philosophy of mind and philosophy of social science. In the former, a central question is whether and in what sense mental phenomena can be reduced to physical phenomena. Philosophers of mind have developed sophisticated accounts that concentrate on ontological reduction and mereological constitution (e.g. supervenience; see Kim 1998, 2005). In philosophy of social science, key questions include whether different fields of social science can be reduced to economics or whether social science as a whole can be reduced to natural science (Kincaid 1997). Whether reduction is considered within philosophy of biology, mind, or social science, similar ideas and arguments have been used in these different fields (e.g. multiple realization; see Section 4.2).

3. “Now it is true that the ultimate elements of organized matter are precisely those which enter into the composition of Unorganized substances: But by the operation of a power, distinct from Gravitation, molecular attraction, or any of the known imponderable agents which operate on unorganized substances, these elements assume combinations of a character essentially different from those which are the result of ordinary chemical affinities” (Owen, Hunterian Lectures [1837] in Sloan 1992, 209).

4. The mid-twentieth century separation of discussions about relations between domains of science (Nagelian theory reduction) and relations between parts and wholes (explanatory reduction), alongside the older elements from debates about vitalism are concretely visible in David Hull's Philosophy of Biological Science (1974). Chapter 1 is a justly famous discussion regarding the difficulties of effecting theory reduction between classical and molecular genetics, but chapter 5, “Organicism and Reductionism”, has been relatively neglected. It includes a very different set of themes, including vitalism, organization, complexity, and the relations between parts and wholes.

5. Rosenberg's argument contains several controversial premises, such as the need for strict laws in biological explanation and the distinction between molecular and functional biology (for criticisms, see Love 2007, Love et al. 2008). The intersection of natural selection and molecular biology for explanatory reductionism has been explored by Sarkar (2005 [1991]) with much less optimism.

6. In the debate about the relations between classical and molecular genetics, Philip Gasper (1992) dubs this “multiple supervenience” in order to contrast it with multiple realization. Biological entities and processes (including molecular ones) often possess their causal properties extrinsically (i.e. due to features external to the bearer of the property). For example, a particular segment of DNA is a gene as a consequence of its ability to code for a functional product, which depends on both DNA elements external to this gene and non-genetic factors. Being a gene is a property of a DNA segment, but an extrinsic one.

7. The derivation demanded by theory reduction for molecular biology requires that the premises contain a purely molecular specification of the total context. Although Nagel and Schaffner have explicated the notion of theory reduction, they have not actually shown how to effect the molecular deduction. Even Schaffner's most detailed defense of reduction (Schaffner 1993) focuses on the condition of connectability, giving a partial account of how to relate the predicate “dominance” used in classical genetics to expressions from biochemistry. But he does not give a single example of a higher level statement being deducible from some lower level theory, which reductionists would have to show, as theory reduction equals that the condition of derivability be met. Debate over Schaffner's model has focused primarily on the condition of connectability, especially whether a molecular characterization of the notion of a classical gene is possible. Yet as Hull (1974) makes plain, a critic of theory reduction needs no more than an argument against connectability as a necessary condition on reduction, while a reductionist has to defend derivability over and above connectability.

8. One of Schaffner's replies to Hull regarding the one-many objection is that the molecular context of a mechanism can be included in the premises to the extent that it matters. Wimsatt (1976a) rightly points out that stressing the inclusion of context will always rely on how the mechanisms are individuated (see Section 4.3). Schaffner's move to include the total context implies that any two possible situations will have distinct overall molecular configurations, but others view this as the same mechanism in different contexts. Generality requires treating parts of different particular molecular configurations as instantiating the same type of mechanism. A flip-side of this need for generality is that the same type of mechanism can occur in different contexts, possibly with a different effect. This sense in which a one–many relation between molecular and higher level kinds exists does not necessarily preclude some types of reduction but explanations in molecular biology must to be sensitive to this epistemic issue.

9. Higher level laws can have exceptions, e.g. if Md, one of the molecular kinds realizing S, does not cause any of the realizers N1, …, Nj of T. Waters (1990) has argued that explaining such an exception requires appeal to the molecular level and therefore is a form of reductionism. Yet Fodor (1974) argued that a reductionistic approach encourages eliminating the higher level generality in favor of exceptionless lower level laws, while the non-reductionist scientist accepts higher level laws despite exceptions precisely because of the aim to address both the higher and lower level situations.

10. The notions of multiple realization and supervenience were originally developed in philosophy of mind as part of a non-reductive physicalism about mental phenomena. Whether these concepts offer an adequate account of the relation between mental and physical phenomena has been questioned (Kim 1992, 1998). The status of multiple realization in philosophy is currently a subject of debate and may hinge on certain metaphysical commitments about the concept of realization (Gillett 2002, 2003). “Realization” takes on different roles in scientific and philosophical discussions (Wilson and Craver 2007) and the significance of these differences has not yet been analyzed for the situations of multiple realization frequently discussed in philosophy of biology. Biological examples used in these philosophical discussions, such as eyes, have often not been treated with adequate care and precision (Couch 2005).

11. A less common objection concerns whether the domains being reductively related are actually distinct. For example, Russell Vance (1996) has argued against the premise that classical genetics and molecular genetics are separate fields or theories (e.g., “genetics is the area of biological science that seems most immediately amenable to the philosopher's conception of scientific reduction. The main reason for this is that in genetics there are two clearly identifiable theories, bodies of law, expressions of regularity – one molecular and one nonmolecular” [Rosenberg 1985, 90]). While this undermines any attempt at reductively relating classical genetics and molecular genetics, its more general impact can be understood as a caution against presuming that two areas of biology are straightforwardly distinguished (as is often done in theory reduction). One cannot simply assume an individuation of the epistemic units being related reductively.

12. This does not mean that “mechanisms” analyses fully capture all of the features relevant to explanatory reduction already discussed. For example, discussions of temporal organization by mechanisms proponents focus on the representation of time relative to a mechanism (e.g., Bechtel 2006, Machamer et al. 2000). But some reductive explanations in ontogeny rely on temporal representations that are not keyed to the temporal organization of mechanisms (e.g., normal stages). Thus, the issue of temporality in reductive explanations cannot be reduced to the issue of temporality in a mechanism. Additionally, qualitative change in ontogeny, where novel structures emerge out of distinct developmental precursors, does not appear straightforwardly amenable to a mechanisms approach.

13. E.g.: “The heart provides an excellent example both of the huge advances that have been made using the reductive approach and of the severe limits of this approach” (Noble 1998, 56); “Our results suggest that the cellular responses induced by multiplex protein kinase inhibitors may be an emergent property that cannot be understood fully considering only the sum of individual inhibitor-kinase interactions” (Kung et al. 2005, 3587); “Our results therefore point to the need to consider each complex biological network as a whole, instead of focusing on local properties” (Guimerà and Nunes Amaral 2005, 899); “Robustness … is one of the fundamental and ubiquitously observed systems-level phenomena that cannot be understood by looking at individual components” (Kitano 2004, 826); “The molecular reductionism that dominated twentieth-century biology will be superseded by an interdisciplinary approach that embraces collective phenomena” (Goldenfeld and Woese 2007, 369); “Understanding the dynamics of infectious-disease transmission demands a holistic approach, yet today's models largely ignore how epidemics change individual behaviour” (Ferguson 2007, 733); “The collective behaviour of matter can give rise to startling emergent properties that hint at the nexus between biology and physics” (Coleman 2007, 379).

14. “The formalization of supervenience employed here is the application of one due to Jaegwon Kim” (Rosenberg 1978, 373). Referring to Kim's paper “Nomological incommensurables” (read at Oberlin Colloquium in 1977), Rosenberg continues in a footnote: “My debts to this paper are by no means limited to its account of supervenience. In fact, the whole perspective adopted here with respect to the relation between theories involved in reduction, and the bearing of causal and mereological determinism on this relation are inspired by this paper. … The reader is referred to Kim's paper for a fuller account of supervenience and its role in ethics, aesthetics, and the philosophy of mind in general.”