Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Mon Jan 20, 2003; substantive revision Wed May 20, 2009

Reference is a relation that obtains between expressions and what speakers use expressions to talk about. When I assert ‘George W. Bush is a Republican’, I use the proper name ‘George W. Bush’ to refer to a particular individual, an individual about whom I go on to speak. Although it questionable whether all words refer, there are several types of words (including proper names) which are arguably of the referring sort. These will be discussed below. The central question concerning reference is: How do words refer? What, in other words, is the “mechanism” of reference? Subsidiary questions concern the relation between reference and meaning and reference and truth. Some philosophers have thought that the nature of reference is able to shed light on important metaphysical or epistemological issues. Other philosophers are not so sanguine. Indeed, some philosophers deny that reference is a substantive relation deserving of philosophical scrutiny.

1. Introduction

We use language to talk about the world. What we say in talking about the world is generally meaningful and oftentimes true. Such is the case when (in the appropriate sort of setting), I assertively utter:

  1. George W. Bush is a Republican.

How do we manage to do such things? How (for instance) do I manage to talk about George W. Bush and thereby say meaningful and true things about him? In a word: Reference. More picturesquely, we are able to use language to talk about the world because words, at least certain types of words, somehow ‘hook on to’ things in the world — things like George W. Bush. Proper names — expressions like ‘George W. Bush’ — are widely regarded as paradigmatic referring expressions. Although it may seem implausible to suppose that all words refer, that all words somehow ‘attach to’ bits of reality — several different types of words are arguably of the referring sort. These include: proper names, natural kind terms, indexicals, and definite descriptions (all of which will be discussed below.)

The central issues, the central questions, concerning reference are three: (i) What is the mechanism of reference? In other words, in virtue of what does a word (of the referring sort) attach to a particular object/individual? (ii) What is the relation between reference and meaning? For instance, is the meaning of a word to be identified with the mechanism by which it refers? Or is the meaning of a word perhaps the reference itself? (iii) What is the relation between reference and truth? More particularly, does the reference of a word, or its mechanism of reference, somehow enter into the truth conditions of assertive utterances of sentences containing that word?

The focus in this article will be on the first of these three questions, that concerning the mechanism of reference, although some attention will be given to the other two questions as well. Indeed, as will become evident in what follows, addressing the first question is simply not possible without giving at least some attention to the second and third questions. Theories of proper names will be considered first, as proper names are considered by many to be referring terms par excellence, and the means by which proper names refer is arguably unique to such expressions. Afterward, other terms often classified as ‘referring’ terms will be considered: natural kind terms, indexicals, and (singular) definite descriptions. A few remarks will then be made about expressions not typically thought of as ‘referring’ expressions — such as quantifiers, prepositions, verbs, and adverbs. In the penultimate section of the article, some possible connections between both reference and reality and reference and knowledge will be briefly discussed. Finally, a few words will be said about so-called ‘negative’ views of reference, according to which reference is not a substantive relation between language and reality, worthy of serious philosophical study.

2. Three Theories of Reference for Proper Names

Proper names are paradigmatic referring expressions. If there are terms that refer — that somehow ‘attach to’ things in the world — then proper names are surely among them. What are proper names? For the purposes of this article, one might think of proper names as at least roughly co-extensive with the sorts of expressions that ordinary (non-philosophical) folk call ‘names.’ Expressions like ‘George W. Bush’, ‘Barcelona’, and ‘Mount Everest’ are thus to be counted as proper names. What do these expressions have in common? In virtue of what do they constitute a genuine class of linguistic expressions? They are syntactically simple expressions that refer, or at least purport to refer, to particular objects/individuals. Thus, ‘George W. Bush’ refers to a particular man, ‘Barcelona’ refers to a particular city, and ‘Mount Everest’ refers to a particular mountain. And even though it is questionable whether expressions such as ‘Santa Claus’ and ‘Sherlock Holmes’ actually refer to anything at all — there can be no doubt that they at least purport to refer: to Santa Claus and Sherlock Holmes, respectively. They thus count as proper names for present purposes.

There are many theories concerning the means by which proper names refer. We will consider three of the more popular (and plausible) kinds of such theories: description theories, causal theories, and ‘hybrid’ theories, the latter of which combine elements of description and causal theories.

2.1 Description Theories

According to description theories of proper names, a proper name, as used by a speaker, refers via the descriptive content associated (by the speaker) with that name. This descriptive content is thought to uniquely determine the name's referent. Thus, when a speaker uses the name ‘N’ and in doing so succeeds in referring to a particular object or individual x, he manages to do so because he thinks of N as the (unique) F, and x is in fact the (unique) F.

As descriptivists Frege (1892) and Russell (1919) acknowledge, the content in question may vary from one speaker to the next. Indeed (according to Russell) such content may vary across time for one and the same speaker. Thus, while I may associate with ‘Bush’ the current U.S. president, his wife may associate with the same name my husband. When Bush is no longer president, my identifying content will no doubt change — perhaps to something like the U.S. president who compromised on the issue of government-funded stem cell research. If Bush and his wife were to divorce, her identifying descriptive content would no doubt change as well — perhaps to my ex-husband. In either case, the individual referred to by means of the name is determined (is ‘picked out’) by the particular descriptive content the speaker associates with that name. Because the descriptive content in question often seems specifiable by means of a definite description (an expression of the form the F), such theories are often (even if somewhat misleadingly[1]) known as ‘description theories’ of proper names.

The motivation for description theories of proper names is two-fold. First, such theories are easily expanded into plausible theories of meaning (or ‘semantic content’). So expanded, the description theory is able to accommodate the very sorts of cases that prove problematic for Millian accounts of the meaning of proper names. (Here, we will begin to see the connection between reference and meaning.) A ‘Millian’ theory (after J.S. Mill, 1867) claims that the meaning of a proper name is simply its bearer. Cases that prove difficult from such theories include: identity statements between co-referring names, sentences containing ‘empty’ names, true negative existentials, and propositional attitude attributions. Second, an expanded description theory of meaning (in contrast to its Millian competitor) provides an account of reference: it says (in effect) that the mechanism by which an expression refers (its associated descriptive content) is its meaning.

Let's begin by looking at the sorts of cases that prove problematic for the otherwise intuitive doctrine of Millianism, according to which the meaning of a proper name is simply its bearer. Consider the following four sentences:

  1. Hesperus is Phosphorus.
  2. Santa Claus lives at the North Pole.
  3. Vulcan does not exist.
  4. Fred believes that Cicero, but not Tully, was Roman.

The Millian view has problems with these sorts of cases. Suppose (as is in fact the case) that ‘Hesperus’ and ‘Phosphorus’ refer to the same thing (the planet Venus). Suppose as well that ‘Santa Claus’ and ‘Vulcan’ refer to nothing,[2] and that Fred is a perfectly rational agent, and thus not inclined to harbor contradictory beliefs. Then, Millianism would predict that (2), which seems informative, is trivial; it would predict that (3), which seems meaningful is meaningless (on account of a meaningless subject term); it would predict that the intuitively true and meaningful (4) is absurd, as its meaningfulness presupposes the existence of what it denies exists; and it would predict that (5), which attributes seemingly consistent beliefs to Fred, attributes to him beliefs that no minimally rationally agent could possibly entertain (simultaneously). Of course, Millians have made attempts to respond to these concerns.[3] The usual strategy is to claim that the intuitions surrounding utterances of sentences like (2) through (5) are the result of mistaking what is merely communicated (or implicated) for the proposition literally expressed. Thus, although what is literally expressed by (2) is trivial, what is communicated is not; although there may be no proposition literally expressed by (3) or (4), propositions are nonetheless communicated by utterances of those sentences. Finally, although an utterance of (5) is likely to express a falsehood — assuming Fred is a rational agent — such an utterance may nevertheless communicate something true (if Fred has two distinct ‘modes of presentation,’ or ways of thinking about, the famous Roman orator).

In contrast to the Millian approach, which involves ‘explaining away’ wayward intuitions, the descriptive approach embraces these same intuitions as accurate. In particular, the descriptivist might claim (as many description theorists do) that the reference-fixing descriptive content associated with a proper name constitutes the meaning of that name. Thus, not only does the current U.S. president determine the reference of the name ‘Bush’ (as I now employ that name), its meaning also constitutes the meaning of that name. If we allow that proper names that are co-referring can have different descriptive meanings, then we can account for the informativeness of (2) and for the fact that (5) ascribes consistent beliefs to Fred. Just suppose that the meaning of ‘Hesperus’ is the brightest evening star, the meaning of ‘Phosphorus’ is the brightest morning star. Then (2) expresses the informative claim (or ‘proposition’) that the brightest evening star is the brightest morning star. Suppose that ‘Cicero’ means the most famous ancient orator and ‘Tully’ means the guy called ‘Tully’ by the English. Then (5) ascribes consistent beliefs to Fred: the belief that the most famous ancient orator was Roman and the belief that the guy called ‘Tully’ by the English was not Roman. Moreover, if we allow that proper names that don't refer nevertheless have associated descriptive meanings, then we can account for the meaningfulness of sentences like (3) and (4). Thus, by claiming that the reference-fixing descriptive content of an expression is its meaning, description theories of reference are able to provide intuitive accounts for those cases that prove problematic for Millianism.

Moreover, as noted above, Millianism — in contrast to its competitor, expanded descriptivism — does not come equipped with an answer to the central question of reference — even if it can be supplemented with an answer to this question (such as the causal theory of reference, discussed in the next section). The description theory effectively constitutes an answer to this very question: a proper name refers to its bearer in virtue of the fact that that entity ‘satisfies’ the descriptive content associated with that name.

The central problem with the description theory is that proper names are not semantically equivalent to singular definite descriptions. Ruth Barcan Marcus (1961) articulates the point in terms of her thesis that proper names are ‘tags’. To say that proper names are tags is, for Barcan Marcus, to say that they have no linguistic meaning and are therefore not semantically equivalent to any singular descriptions of their references. Proper names do not, contra the description theory, refer by way of the descriptions they allegedly stand for; they refer directly to their bearers. Barcan Marcus's (1961) view is thus a version of what has come to be known as the “Direct Reference” theory of names. Important consequences of this theory include, as Barcan Marcus (1961) notes, the necessity of identity statements between co-referring proper names.[4] Other important consequences include the dissolution of puzzles involving substitutivity in modal contexts (Barcan Marcus 1993).

Nearly a decade later, Saul Kripke, in a trio of lectures subsequently published as Naming and Necessity (1980), proposed a similar view of proper names.[5] For Kripke, as for Barcan Marcus, proper names refer directly, without the mediation of any associated descriptive content. And Kripke, like Barcan Marcus before him, makes note of an interesting consequence of this view: the necessity of identity statements between co-referring proper names. However, Kripke articulates his version of the Direct Reference theory, not in terms of the notion of tagging, but in terms of the notion of “rigid designation,” a notion that applies not only to proper names, but to definite descriptions and natural kind terms as well.

This brings us to Kripke's three well-known objections to description theories (1980).[6] There is: the problem of unwanted necessity (sometimes referred to as an ‘epistemic’ problem); the problem of rigidity (sometimes referred to as a ‘modal’ problem); and the problem of ignorance and error (sometimes referred to as a ‘semantic’ problem).[7] The first and second problems apply only to expanded description theories of reference: theories that claim that the meaning of a proper name is its reference-fixing description. The third problem applies to the ‘basic’ versions of the description theory as well: to those versions that claim only that the reference of a proper name is determined by the associated descriptive content, a content which needn't be construed as the name's ‘meaning.’

To see these problems, consider assertive utterances of the following sentences:

  1. Aristotle (if he existed) was a philosopher.
  2. Aristotle was fond of dogs.
  3. Einstein was a genius.

Suppose that, for a particular speaker Fred, the definite description that expresses the meaning of ‘Aristotle’ is ‘the last great philosopher of antiquity’. Then, if expanded descriptivism is correct, a sentence like (6) should sound (to Fred) trivial, analytic, necessary. It should sound as trivial, necessary and analytic as ‘bachelors are unmarried’ or ‘squares have four sides’ — at least to Fred. But it probably won't; even Fred would admit that Aristotle might never have gone into philosophy. Had things been different, Aristotle might (for instance) have died in infancy. This is the problem of ‘unwanted necessity.’

Now let's consider just such a ‘possible world’: a world in which Aristotle died in infancy. Suppose that this possible world is, in other respects, pretty much like the actual world. And suppose, for the moment, that we adopt the description theory. Then, sentence (7), as used by English speakers in the actual world, would arguably be true of such a possible world just in case Plato was (in that possible world) fond of dogs! For given the suppositions in question, Plato would arguably have satisfied the description associated with ‘Aristotle’ (by hypothesis ‘the last great philosopher of antiquity’). But it seems intuitively implausible to suppose that the name ‘Aristotle’ — as we in fact use that name in the actual world — could be used to refer to anyone other than its actual world referent: Aristotle. Of course, had things been relevantly different, the name ‘Aristotle’ might have been used to refer to Plato (say), but given how the name is actually used, it cannot be used by speakers to refer to Plato in this — or any other possible — world in which Plato exists. All this suggests that names are rigid: such that they refer to the same individual in every possible world in which that individual exists. But definite descriptions, in contrast, do not appear to be rigid: the definite description ‘the last great philosopher of antiquity’ might well refer to (or ‘denote’) Plato in a world where Aristotle dies in infancy. This suggests that names are semantically different from descriptions, which in turn suggests that the mechanism by which a name refers cannot be identified with some definite description. This is the problem of ‘rigidity.’

Now let's move on to the problem of ‘ignorance and error.’ Suppose that Fred believes of Einstein only that he was a physicist. Then, he will fail to refer to Einstein via his use of ‘Einstein’ because the associated descriptive content — a physicist — fails to pick Einstein out from among countless other physicists. This is the problem of ‘ignorance.’ Suppose now that Fred believes that Einstein was the inventor of the atomic bomb. (According to Kripke (1980) many speakers believe this.) The description theory would then predict what is surely false — that when such a speaker utters a sentence like (8), he refers not to Einstein but to Oppenheimer (the person who did in fact invent the atomic bomb). This is the problem of ‘error.’

For these and other reasons, many have rejected description theories in favor of causal or hybrid theories. Not everyone, though, has rejected the description theory. Searle's (1983) response to Kripke's three-pronged challenge basically claims that the theory refuted by Kripke (the so-called ‘Frege-Russell’ theory) is a strawman, and that a plausible version of the description theory (namely, Searle's) can circumvent each and every one of Kripke's objections. One need only acknowledge that the reference-fixing content associated with the use of a given name needn't be the sort of content expressible by a single definite description, or even by an open disjunction of such expressions. For there is no reason to insist that reference-determining content must be expressible linguistically. Rather, the reference-fixing content is identical to the totality of ‘intentional content,’ mental content a given speaker associates with the name in question. The referent will be whatever object/individual fits the bulk of this content. Moreover, such content (which might vary widely from speaker to speaker) is not to be regarded as giving the meaning of a name, where the ‘meaning’ of a name is construed as something like a definition. Once these acknowledgments are made, the problems noted by Kripke are easily avoided (according to Searle). In response to the problem of unwanted necessity, Searle effectively bites the bullet. On his view, it is indeed a necessary truth that Aristotle (for instance) satisfies a significant chunk of the intentional content associated (by the speaker) with the name ‘Aristotle’. But this does not mean that ‘Aristotle was a philosopher’ is on par with ‘bachelors are unmarried’. For the associated descriptive content is not in any way ‘synonymous’ with the name; it does not define the name, it merely fixes its reference. In response to the rigidity problem, Searle points out that intuitions of rigidity are easily enough accommodated: one can simply rigidify the reference-fixing description. Thus, ‘Aristotle’ refers (in all possible scenarios) to the individual who actually did such-and-such. Finally, in response to the problem of ignorance and error, Searle points out that once all of the relevant intentional content is taken into consideration, the problem of ignorance and error simply does not arise. For associated with ‘Einstein’ will of course be the content individual whom others in my community call ‘Einstein’. If this content, which might well be sufficient to pick out Einstein, has significant weight for the speaker, it could effectively ‘trump’ any divergent content. It might thus succeed in ‘picking out’ the right individual: Einstein. (And if it didn't, that would only show that the speaker wasn't really referring to the individual others in his community call ‘Einstein’.)

Despite Searle's ingenious defense of the description theory, many have found it ultimately implausible. Although there has been surprisingly little response to Searle's vigorous defense of his particular version of descriptivism, the general sentiment among contemporary philosophers of language seems to be skepticism about any version of descriptivism for proper names.[8] This is due (in part) to the conviction of many contemporary philosophers of language, that there is something ‘magical’ about description theories of reference. Such theories appear (according to these philosophers) to imbue the mind with a rather curious property: one that allows its contents to ‘magically’ attach to things outside of it. Causal theorist Michael Devitt (1990), echoing Hilary Putnam (1981), makes this very complaint. He first makes the general point that nothing inside an object is sufficient to determine its relation to something outside it. He then applies this principle to the case at hand, asking pointedly (p. 91):

How can something inside the head refer to something outside the head? Searle sees no problem: It just does. That's the real magic.

Evans (1982, p. 298) had made much the same point earlier, when he wrote:

What makes it one rather than another of a pair of identical twins that you are in love with? Certainly not some specification blue printed in your mind… If God had looked into your mind, he would not have seen with whom you were in love, and of whom you were thinking.

The point is clear: mental content, however detailed, is simply not sufficient to ‘pick out’ out some extra-mental entity. Fortunately, there are promising and well-developed alternatives to descriptivism. In particular, there are both causal and hybrid theories of reference. It is to the first of these two alternatives that I now turn.

2.2 Causal Theories

The causal theory was adumbrated by Kripke[9] (1980) as an alternative to the description theory of nominal reference. The central idea underpinning this sort of theory is that (the use of) a name refers to whatever is linked to it in the appropriate way, a way that does not require speakers to associate any identifying descriptive content with the name. The causal theory is generally presented as having two components: one dealing with reference fixing, the other dealing with reference borrowing. Reference is initially fixed at a dubbing, usually by perception, though sometimes by description. Reference-fixing is by perception when a speaker says, in effect, of a perceived object: “You're to be called ‘N’.” Reference-fixing is by description when a speaker stipulates, in effect: “Whatever is the unique such-and-such is to be called ‘N’.” (As noted by Kripke (1980), the name ‘Neptune’ was fixed by description, stipulated by the astronomer Leverrier to refer to whatever was the planetary cause of observed perturbations in the orbit of Uranus.) After the reference-fixing, the name is passed on from speaker to speaker through communicative exchanges. Speakers succeed in referring to something by means of its name because underlying their uses of the name are links in a causal chain stretching back to the dubbing of the object with that name. Speakers thus effectively ‘borrow’ their reference from speakers earlier in the chain but borrowers do not have to be able to identify lenders; all that is required is that borrowers are appropriately linked to their lenders through communication. However, as Kripke points out, in order for a speaker (qua reference borrower) to succeed in using a proper name to refer to the object/individual the lender was using the name to refer to, he must intend to do so. Thus, I may use the name ‘Napoleon’ to refer to my pet cat, even if the lender of the name used it to refer to the famous French general. For in such a case, I do not intend “to use the name to refer to the individual the lender used it to refer to.”

The most serious problem with the causal theory of reference (as sketched by Kripke) is that it appears to be at odds with the phenomenon of reference change. Gareth Evans cites the case of ‘Madagascar’, once used to refer to a portion of the African mainland, which now refers to the African island. Marco Polo was apparently the first speaker to use the name to refer to the island. He was under the impression — a misimpression — that such was how the name was actually used. The problem is this. When Marco Polo used the name, he surely intended to refer to whatever was referred to by the person(s) from whom he acquired the name; his intention was not to introduce a novel use of the name. But the individual(s) from whom Polo acquired the name intended (by hypothesis) to use the name to refer to a portion of the African mainland. How, then, did it come to refer to the island? Evans goes on to provide an imaginary case that makes the same basic point.

Two babies are born, and their mothers bestow names upon them. A nurse inadvertently switches them and the error is never discovered. It will henceforth undeniably be the case that the man universally known as ‘Jack’ is so-called because a woman dubbed some other baby with that name. (1982, p. 301.)

In developing a version of the causal theory designed to handle reference change, Devitt (1981) contends plausibly that a name is typically ‘grounded’ in its bearer in numerous perceptual confrontations after the initial dubbing. These subsequent groundings are thus semantically significant and are thus capable of effecting reference change. Given a sufficient number of such groundings over a sufficient period of time, reference change may occur. Thus, ‘Madagascar’ was able to shift reference from the mainland to the island once perceptually-based groundings in the island became established. The island was effectively dubbed ‘Madagascar’ by means of such groundings. And the man known by all as ‘Jack’ is not so-called because, years earlier, someone dubbed another individual that name. He is so-called because numerous uses of ‘Jack’ are grounded in him.

Although the causal theory (as revised by Devitt) provides a plausible account of nominal reference, its advocates will need to supplement their theory of reference with a theory of meaning — a theory that accounts for the fact that proper names appear to have some sort of meaning or ‘cognitive content.’[10] For as it stands, the causal theory of reference does not provide any answers to the questions of cognitive significance that so bothered description theorists like Frege and Russell.

2.3 Hybrid Theories

Reference change is not the only problem faced by the causal theory of reference. Evans (1973) provides several examples of uses of proper names that are most naturally accounted for via a hybrid theory, according to which the reference of a proper name (as used by a speaker) is the dominant causal source of the body of descriptive information the speaker associates with the name. Consider, for instance, the following hypothetical case discussed by Evans:

An urn is discovered in which are found fascinating mathematical proofs. Inscribed at the bottom is the name ‘Ibn Khan’ which is quite naturally taken to be the name of the constructor of the proofs. Consequently it passes into common usage amongst mathematicians concerned with that branch of mathematics. ‘Khan conjectured here that…’ and the like. However suppose the name was the name of the scribe who had transcribed the proofs much later; a small ‘id scripsit’ had been obliterated. (1982, p. 306)

Intuitively, we want to say that the name as used by contemporary mathematicians refers to the ancient mathematician — not to the scribe. But the (unamended) Kripkean causal picture would predict that the name refers to the scribe. After all, contemporary mathematicians no doubt intend to use the name to refer to the individual called — by those in the ancient community — ‘Ibn Kahn.’ Their intention is not to introduce a novel use of the name. On Evans' view, however, the name refers to the ancient mathematician, since it is the mathematician who constitutes the ‘dominant causal origin’ of the descriptive information associated with the name: mathematician who proved such-and-such. Because the ancient mathematician is responsible for the existence of the proofs, he is arguably the ‘dominant causal source’ of the descriptive information associated with the name ‘Ibn Kahn’.

The advantages of Evans' theory appear to be considerable. Evans himself claims that his theory effectively combines the virtues of the descriptive theory with those of the causal theory, while avoiding their respective vices. Like description accounts, it accounts for cognitive significance (of the sort evidenced by sentences like (2) through (5)) as well as reference; like causal accounts, it preserves the intuition that one cannot refer to something with which one has no causal link whatsoever. Moreover, Evans' theory avoids the problem of ignorance and error. For it denies that reference is determined by ‘fit’ or ‘satisfaction’ of any sort of descriptive content.

Michael Devitt's (1981) version of the causal theory is also a ‘hybrid’ theory of sorts. Although his theory of reference borrowing is a purely causal one, there is a descriptive element in his theory of reference-fixing. This descriptive element is needed to handle what Devitt calls the ‘qua problem,’ a problem entailed by the view that reference-fixing is a purely causal, non-descriptive, event. This is simply false, according to Devitt. In order to fix the reference of a name, the namer must at least know what kind of object he is naming. Thus, in order to name a certain dog ‘Spot’, I must at least know what kind of thing the nominatum-to-be is: I must at least know that he is (say) an animal. If I think he is merely an inanimate spot in my field of vision, I will not have succeeded in naming him. Now, to know what kind of object one is naming is to conceptualize that object, to think of it as an object of a certain sort, as (in other words), satisfying a certain predicate. It is thus to think of it qua such-and-such. Thus, if an act of reference-fixing is to be successful, the reference-fixer must think of the referent-to-be under a certain description — one that that object or individual ‘fits.’

3. Other Terms

3.1 Natural Kind Terms

Putnam (1975) extended Kripke's views of proper names to so-called ‘natural kind’ terms. These are terms that refer (naturally enough) to kinds of things that are found in nature. The ‘kinds’ in question are kinds of the sort studied by scientists, whether biologists, chemists, or physicists; they are kinds individuated by underlying structure: a structure that purportedly explains the more superficial properties of the kind. Thus, the expressions ‘tiger’, ‘gold’, and ‘H2O’ are natural kind terms. ‘Dust bunny’ and ‘cow patty’ are not — despite the fact that they refer (loosely speaking) to ‘kinds’ of things ‘found in nature.’ The traditional view of such terms sees them as descriptive in content, where the descriptive content of such terms determines their reference. That is, the kind is referred to in virtue of the fact that it ‘satisfies’ the properties expressed by the associated descriptive content. The motivation for such a view is two-fold. First, it provides intuitive analyses in cases where a purely referential account of meaning proves unintuitive; second, in contrast to an account of the latter sort, a descriptive account of natural kind terms offers an explanation of reference. The intuitiveness of the descriptive view is brought out by seeing how it might handle cases that a purely referential account of natural kind terms would have trouble with. Consider, for instance, assertive utterances of the following sentences:

  1. Furze is gorse.
  2. Gnomes are mythical creatures.
  3. Unicorns don't exist.
  4. Fred believes that filberts, but not hazelnuts, are sweet.

(9) seems informative, (10) meaningful, (11) both meaningful and true, and (12) appears to attribute consistent beliefs to Fred. A purely referential account of meaning, according to which the meaning of a natural kind term is nothing other than its bearer, would predict that the first is trivial, the second and third meaningless,[11] and the fourth as attributing inconsistent beliefs to Fred. In contrast, suppose that we adopt a description account of meaning. Then, provided co-referring terms can have different descriptive contents, and provided empty kind terms have descriptive contents, we can explain the informativeness of (9), the meaningfulness of (10) and (11), and the fact that (12) does not ascribe inconsistent beliefs to Fred. (The explanation here parallels the descriptive explanation for (2)–(5).). But according to Putnam (1975), it would be a mistake to suppose that natural kind terms refer via descriptive content ‘inside the head of’ the competent speaker. I can refer to such things as furze (gorse) and filberts (hazelnuts) even if the descriptive content I associate with the expression in question is not ‘uniquely satisfied’ by such things — indeed, even if the content in question is satisfied by (say) walnuts or cashews. (This is basically the problem of ‘ignorance and error.’) Putnam made the same basic point via a number of thought-experiments. Thus, I refer to elm trees when I use the term ‘elm’; and I refer to beech trees when I use the term ‘beech’. But the descriptive content I associate with these terms may well be the same — something like deciduous tree of some sort. Thus, it cannot be what is inside my head that determines what I refer to. Consider the famous ‘Twin Earth’ thought-experiment. Oscar and Twin Oscar refer to different kinds of substances (H2O, XYZ) when they use the term ‘water’ — this despite the fact that their psychological states are identical, that (more particularly) the descriptive content they associate with the term (clear, odorless, colorless liquid, that falls from the sky and accumulates in lakes, rivers, and oceans) is the same. The moral is: the reference of a natural kind term cannot be determined by what's ‘in the head.’ So, if meanings are reference-determiners, they are not in the head. (And if they are in the head, they are not reference-determiners.)

This brings us to the Putnam/Kripke causal view of reference. It is similar to Kripke's account of nominal reference; indeed, it is more or less an extension of that account. Reference is initially fixed at a dubbing, either by perception or description of samples of some particular natural kind. The reference is then to whatever has an internal structure identical to that of the samples. In the case of water, this would be having the chemical structure H2O. Speakers at a dubbing are able to lend their reference to others via communicative exchanges, and these others can then lend reference to still others. Speakers who are ignorant as to the properties of the kind in question can nevertheless use the natural kind term to refer to the members of the kind because underlying their uses are causal chains stretching back to a reference-fixing.

Putnam thought that his causal account of natural kind terms could be extended to artifactual kind terms. These are terms that refer to kinds of man-made objects: pencils, clocks, telephones, and so forth. Putnam motivates his causal account of artifactual kind terms by appealing to intuitive considerations, to ‘thought-experiments.’ Suppose we were to discover that pencils are not artifacts, but organisms. We would still call them ‘pencils’ and would be correct in doing so. This shows that the reference of such expressions cannot be fixed via some description of the form artifact the function of which is to…

Perhaps. But that only shows (at most) that the description in question cannot be of the particular form in question. Perhaps the relevant description is one of the form: that which has such-and-such a function. There need be no mention of the notion of an ‘artifact’. In fact, a descriptive view, according to which the reference of such terms is fixed by a function-specifying description, is intuitively plausible. Why? Presumably because artifacts are not individuated by anything ‘hidden,’ but by something transparent — their function. Since function is transparent, it is not implausible to suppose that reference is determined by a description that specifies the function in question. Does that mean that one must know the reference-fixing description in order to refer to the kind in question? No, only that non-experts effectively defer to experts who do know (and don't just theorize about) the relevant reference-fixing descriptions.

3.2 Indexicals

What are indexicals? They are expressions the reference of which depends on the context in which they are used, where ‘context’ is construed as incorporating (inter alia) speaker, hearer, time, and place. Examples of such expressions include: ‘I’, ‘here’, ‘that’, ‘he’, ‘she’, ‘now’, and ‘me’. The traditional (Frege/Russell) view is that the reference of such expressions is fixed by some sort of descriptive content associated by the speaker with the expression, and that the reference-fixing description is the meaning, the propositional contribution, of the expression. The motivation for such a view is largely intuitive. Such expressions certainly do seem to have meanings of some sort, and these meanings seem to have something to do with how the expressions refer. Thus, for instance, the meaning of ‘I’ is arguably the speaker of this utterance and refers to that individual; the meaning of ‘now’ is arguably the time of this utterance and refers to that time. And so on. Some of the problems with this view are brought out by Kaplan (1989). The central problem (according to Kaplan) is with the idea that reference-determining descriptions constitute the propositional content of an expression. As Kaplan points out, such a view violates our intuitions about ‘what is said.’ Thus, consider an assertive utterance of:

  1. He [pointing] is tall.

Suppose first, that Fred is pointed to during the utterance; now suppose that we go back in time and that Bill is pointed to during the utterance. Intuitively, different things would have been said, but not so according to the descriptive account of indexical content and reference, according to which the subject term means the same thing in both cases — something like the demonstrated male. This leads to Kaplan's ‘Direct Reference’ view of indexicals, according to which ‘character’ determines reference in a context. Reference in a context is ‘content,’ that is, an expression's contribution to ‘what is said.’ Character is more like linguistic meaning than reference and is supposed (according to Kaplan) to account for cognitive significance. The character of an expression provides the rules for its correct application. Thus, the character of ‘I’ will be a rule specifying that the expression refers to the speaker in the context of utterance; the character of ‘you’ will be a rule specifying that the expression refers to the audience in the context of utterance. And so on.

Although widely accepted, some have expressed concerns with Kaplan's direct reference account of indexicals. Nunberg (1993) thinks that indexicals have descriptive uses: uses that are semantically significant, that are relevant to what is said. To see this, consider the following two sentences:

  1. I thought you were my mother.
  2. He who hesitates is lost.

Suppose that there is a knock on the door and you assume that it is your mother, whom you are expecting. You then open the door, see that the visitor (x) is a friend, and utter (14) upon opening the door. You arguably mean by that utterance something like I thought that the person at the door was my mother. It seems implausible in the extreme that you meant that you thought that x, your friend, was your mother! You would never mistake the one for the other. In the utterance of a proverb like (15), ‘he’ arguably means whoever. Since there is no contextually specified male, x, you cannot mean any such person. There are of course responses that a direct reference theorist might make. For instance, such a theorist might claim that to suppose that the descriptive use is semantically significant is to conflate the pragmatic with the semantic; it is to mistake what is merely communicated for what is actually said. This is just the sort of line taken by some Russellians in response to the contention that definite descriptions have a semantically significant referential use. (See below for details.)

3.3 Definite Descriptions

A definite description is simply an expression having a certain grammatical form: namely, the F. The central question here is whether or not a quantificational theory of descriptions — Russell's in particular — is adequate to handle the data of what Donnellan has called the ‘referential use’ of descriptions. Some background is needed to understand this issue.

Russell (1905) famously opposed both Meinong (1904) and Frege (1892), claiming that definite descriptions are not genuine referring expressions, they are not ‘logically proper names.’ In other words, their propositional contribution is not (simply or at all) their denotation. Russell's arguments appeal to intuitions (he would no doubt call them ‘facts’) about truth value and meaningfulness. Thus, consider assertive utterances of the following two sentences:

  1. The King of France is bald.
  2. The Queen of England has three sons.

(16) is meaningful, though certainly not true — ‘plainly false,’ according to Russell. Russell's ‘Theory of Descriptions’ predicts that (16) is meaningful but false, expressing a (false) proposition to the effect that there exists exactly one king of France and that whatever is king of France is bald. (17), according to Russell, should get the same kind of analysis as (16), and so pace Frege, it cannot be about its referent: the Queen of England. Indeed, it is about nothing at all: for definite descriptions are not referring terms, but existential quantifiers. More specifically, the ‘proposition expressed’ by the assertive utterance of a sentence of the form The F is G is one to the effect that there is exactly one F and whatever is F is G. Strawson (1950) claimed that Russell's theory was the result of overlooking certain fundamental distinctions, including that between referring and meaning. Attend to these distinctions, and you will see that definite descriptions are indeed referring expressions, not quantifiers. This does not mean that they are logically proper names; only that speakers use them to talk about particular objects/individuals, not to assert that things of a certain sort exist. Thus, consider an assertive utterance of:

  1. The King of France is wise.

According to Strawson, such an utterance would be neither true nor false — because nothing is referred to. Indeed, nothing has been asserted (stated or said). (On Russell's view, the statement is false as it involves the false claim that there exists a unique king of France.) The meaning of the description, on Strawson's view, is given by a rule: one to the effect that it is to be used in cases where there is a (contextually) unique king of France to whom one is referring. Donnellan (1966) thought that definite descriptions were ‘ambiguous’ in that they had two different uses, and that these were relevant to what is said, to the ‘statement’ made. One of these uses — the so-called ‘attributive use’ — was captured by Russell's theory but not Strawson's; the other use — the ‘referential use’ — was captured by Strawson's theory but not Russell's. Or so Donnellan claimed. Thus, suppose that Smith is found brutally murdered and it is claimed (on account of the heinousness of the crime) that:

  1. The murderer of Smith is insane.

Suppose that the speaker has no idea who the murderer is. Then, the description is used attributively — to say something about whoever (uniquely) murdered Smith — and Russell's analysis applies. That is, the statement is true just in case there is a unique murderer of Smith and whoever murdered Smith is insane. But now suppose that Jones is accused of Smith's murder and that the speaker believes that Jones is guilty. In attempting to say something about Jones, the speaker comes out with an utterance of (19). Then, the description is used referentially, merely to pick Jones out so as to say something about him, and the statement is thus true just in case Jones is insane — even if he is innocent and the actual murderer (Robinson) is quite sane. Russell's theory, according to Donnellan, cannot accommodate the referential use, and so is incomplete at best. Kripke's (1977) response was that Donnellan was mistaking pragmatic facts for semantic facts, speaker reference for word reference. Kripke claimed that the referential use of definite descriptions was both genuine and interesting, but was not semantic and so was not relevant to Russell's theory. As Kripke claimed, the truth value of:

  1. The man in the corner drinking champagne is happy tonight.

depends on whether the man in the corner drinking champagne is happy. This is so even if the speaker intends to refer to someone else, a man in the corner who only appears to be drinking champagne — but is in fact drinking sparkling water. In such a case, the speaker may say something true (or false) about the individual to whom he intends to refer. Nevertheless, the truth value of the sentence itself will not depend upon the properties of the speaker's referent, but on those of the semantic referent: on those of the description's denotation. Thus, according to Kripke, Russell's theory of descriptions, though perhaps not without its problems, is not undermined by the referential use of descriptions. Although many have accepted at least the basics of Kripke's rejoinder to Donnellan, the debate over the referential use — over whether it undermines Russell's theory of descriptions — continues unabated.[12]

3.4 Non-Referring Expressions

It seems almost obvious that there are expressions that refer. But do all (meaningful) expressions refer? Intuitively, at least, there appear to be many sorts of expressions — perfectly meaningful expressions — that do not refer, that are not used to refer. Consider, for instance, the following five sentences:

  1. Nobody runs faster than me.
  2. Fred is tall.
  3. Do it for the sake of the children.
  4. Yes, I am very proud of you and the children.
  5. She skipped happily.

Consider the italicized words in each and ask yourself what they might be used to refer to. ‘Nobody’ certainly doesn't refer to anyone; ‘Fred’ refers to Fred but what does ‘tall’ refer to? A property? But what's a property and do such things really exist in a sense that would allow them to be objects of reference? This is controversial. What about ‘sake’ (and other nouns like ‘behalf’ and ‘dint’)? And what of ‘yes’, ‘very’, ‘of’, and ‘and’? What do adverbs like ‘happily’ refer to? A way or manner of some activity? Again, is it plausible to suppose that such things exist in a sense which enables them to be objects of reference? Not obviously. The point is simply this: some perfectly meaningful expressions do not seem to be referring expressions, in which case a theory of how they refer, of how their reference relates to the meaning or truth of sentences in which they occur, would be beside the point. It seems more reasonable (or at least more intuitive) to suppose that such expressions derive their meaning from something other than reference. Consequently, attempts to devise theories of reference for such expressions are rather uncommon, though certainly not unheard of. Frege (1952) had a highly systematic conception of reference on which reference is assigned to every constituent of a sentence that is relevant to determining its truth value. (Quantifiers, for instance, are said to refer to second level concepts.) Much later, Montague (1960) constructed a semantic theory on which expressions of the sort in question have referents. But it is fair to say that the sense in which such expressions might be said to refer is not an intuitive one, but one that is highly technical and theory-laden.

4. Other Issues: Reference, Reality, and Knowledge

Reference is arguably the central notion in the philosophy of language, with close ties to the notions of meaning and truth. But one might wonder whether reference has implications for philosophical issues that go beyond the philosophy of language proper. Many have thought that it does, and many of these philosophers have seen connections between reference and reality — the nature of which is the subject matter of metaphysics. One of the oldest metaphysical problems — the so-called ‘problem of non-being’ — involves the notion of reference. Many others have seen connections between reference and knowledge — the nature of which is the subject matter of epistemology. One of the newest epistemological problems — presented via Putnam's infamous ‘brain in a vat’ thought-experiment — also involves the notion of reference. In contrast, there are philosophers who believe that reference — construed as providing a substantive link between language and the world — is not a subject worthy of serious philosophical study. Various reasons have been given for this negative attitude toward reference, including: (i) reference is inherently indeterminate (Quine, 1960), (ii) the notion of reference is without theoretical value (Davidson, 1984), and (iii) all that one can say about reference is what is embodied by instantiations of a schema like [a] refers to a. Before looking briefly at these negative views, let's look at a possible connection between reference and reality.

4.1 Reference and Reality

Consider the following sentence:

  1. Pegasus does not exist.

Surely this sentence is true. More precisely, its assertive utterance would express a true proposition. After all, we all know that Pegasus is a purely mythical creature. Yet, the truth of (26) would seem to imply that Pegasus in some sense is: that Pegasus has being of some sort. Otherwise, how could we refer to the mythical horse and say truly of it that it does not exist? Thus, Pegasus — as well as other things that don't exist — are; they have being; otherwise we could not coherently (and truly) deny that they exist. Or so claimed Meinong (1904). How do we avoid commitment to what Quine (1961) famously called Meinong's ‘bloated universe’?[13] One solution (Quine's) is to distinguish sharply between meaning and reference, and then claim that although ‘Pegasus’ has no reference, it does have a meaning. In particular, its meaning is given by a definite description which is to be interpreted a la Russell (1905). Thus, (26) gets analyzed as (something like):

  1. There does not exist a unique winged horse.

More precisely:

  1. It is false that there exists a unique winged horse.

And this sentence is clearly true — and we can say that it is true without being committed to the being of Pegasus. In effect, the solution claims that certain expressions that look like names are not names in the logical sense: their meaning (if any) is not their reference. Such expressions are instead abbreviated Russellian descriptions. Such descriptions do not have meaning in isolation — in particular, they do not mean what they denote — and they may in fact denote nothing. Rather, they have meaning only in the context of the sentence in which they occur, a sentence whose assertive utterance expresses a complex existential proposition to the effect that there exists a unique F and whatever is F is G. This is not the only way out of Meinong's universe of non-existent beings, however. Some philosophers have argued that names of fictional and mythical creatures refer to existent objects — abstract objects in particular. Nathan Salmon (1998) has recently advocated a version of this general view. Salmon claims that ‘Pegasus’ and the like refer to existent things — to abstract entities, man-made artifacts.[14] On such a view, (26) is actually false. Pegasus, a man-made artifact, does indeed exist and so can be referred to. Intuitions to the contrary are to be explained by a conflation of speaker meaning and word meaning, the former of which may involve a proposition to the effect that Pegasus does not exist as a physical object. This way of looking at the problem of non-being allows Salmon to salvage Millianism: the view that the meaning of a proper name is nothing more than its reference.

4.2 Reference and Knowledge

Now let's turn to issues of reference and knowledge, looking specifically at Putnam's envatted brains. Putnam purports to arrive at a substantive conclusion, that we are not brains in vats, with the assistance of a particular theory about the nature of reference — the causal theory. The basic argument is this: If you were a brain in a vat, you could not think that you were; but you can think that you're a brain in a vat; so you cannot be a brain in a vat. The reason for this is that thinking you are a brain in a vat requires causal links to things which (if you are a brain in a vat) don't exist. These are the sorts of causal links between thought and reality that would make thinking you are a brain in a vat possible in the first place. So you can't have such thoughts — if those thoughts are true. You can in fact have such thoughts, so they must not be true.

The literature responding to Putnam's argument is enormous. Some who have responded to Putnam have interpreted his argument as a refutation of skepticism; other respondents have interpreted the argument as having a considerably more modest (metaphysical) conclusion: that I am not a brain in a vat. One of the most influential responses to Putnam's argument, given this more modest conclusion, was put forth by Tony Brueckner (1986). Brueckner contends that the argument doesn't seem to yield the conclusion that Putnam promised — that I am not a brain in a vat — but only the significantly different conclusion that my use of ‘I am not a brain in a vat’ is true. Some subsequent literature has explored the legitimacy of the ‘disquotation’ step that's needed to get from where Putnam gets us to where he promised to get us. Another influential criticism of Putnam's argument was first made by Peter Smith (1984). Smith argues that Putnam's argument won't work against certain ways of construing the brain in a vat hypothesis. But Smith's criticism, though compelling, responds only to Putnam's argument construed as a refutation of skepticism. After all, the skeptic needs only one coherent skeptical hypothesis to motivate his position.

How does all this relate to the causal theory of reference? The sentiment among some epistemologists is that the sort of semantic externalism underpinning the causal theory is simply not strong enough to support a refutation of skepticism. Thus, suppose we accept the reasonable view that the content of some thoughts/expressions is not completely determined by what is going on inside one's head. Suppose that such contents are at least partly determined by the nature of items one has been in causal contact with. Even then, it is not clear that we have the basis for concluding that skepticism is incorrect even if we end up with a priori considerations supporting the metaphysical conclusion that we're not brains in vats. (See DeRose 2000 for more on this view.)

5. Negative Views of Reference

Thus far, this article has been concerned largely with what might be called ‘positive’ views of reference. Reference, construed as a relation between bits of language and bits of reality, is assumed to be a genuine, substantive relation worthy of philosophical scrutiny. Accounts (whether descriptive, causal, or hybrid) are then given of what constitutes this link. Moreover, some philosophers (as just noted) believe that referential theories have important implications for metaphysical and epistemological issues. But not all philosophers are so sanguine about the possibility or theoretical importance of reference. In closing, I will discuss briefly some ‘negative’ views of reference. Quine (1960) has argued that reference is inherently indeterminate or ‘inscrutable.’ By this, Quine means that there is no fact of the matter as to what our words refer to. It is not that our words refer to something but we are unable to determine what that is. Rather, there is no such thing as what our words refer to. Nevertheless, Quine does not go so far as to say that our words fail to refer in any sense. His view is rather that it makes sense to speak of what our words refer to only relative to some purpose we might have in assigning referents to those words. Quine's argument for the inscrutability thesis involves an application of the thesis that empirical theories are underdetermined by their supporting evidence. For any body of empirical evidence we might have about speakers of a given language, there will be a number of competing theories as to what their words refer to. Such theories will be empirically equivalent: equally consistent with the empirical data. One theory might say that in the language in question, ‘gavagai’ refers to rabbits; another might say that it refers to undetached rabbit parts; a third might say that it refers to time-slices of rabbits. Quine's views on underdetermination can be applied to one's own language. The result is that the available evidence no more forces the speaker to the conclusion that by ‘rabbit’ he means rabbits, than it forces him to conclude that by ‘rabbit’ he means undetached rabbit parts or time-slices of rabbits. If a speaker observes himself using the word ‘rabbit,’ the evidence he amasses will give equal support to all three theories, as well as to many others. So, according to Quine, for any given body of empirical evidence, there will be numerous competing theories as to what the words one uses refer to. And there will be no principled way of adjudicating between these theories.

Davidson's instrumentalist views on reference are even more radical than Quine's. Davidson (1984) claims that reference is a theoretically vacuous notion: it is of absolutely no use in a semantic theory. His basis for endorsing this position is his conviction that no substantive explanation of reference is even possible. The problem is that any such explanation would have to be given in non-linguistic terms — but no such explanation can be given. As he puts it (1984, p. 220): If the name ‘Kilimanjaro’ refers to Kilimanjaro, then no doubt there is some relation between English (or Swahili) speakers, the word, and the mountain. But it is inconceivable that one should be able to explain this relation without first explaining the role of the words in the sentences; and if this is so, there is no chance of explaining reference directly in non-linguistic terms.

However, this does not mean that there is no hope for semantics. On the contrary. On Davidson's view, a Tarskian theory of truth for a language is at the same time a theory of meaning for that language. The point here is that a Davidsonian theory of meaning has no place for the notion of reference.

Similar in spirit to Davidson's views are the views of the deflationists. Such theorists claim that there is nothing more to referential notions than is captured by instances of a schema like ‘arefers to a. Such a schema generates claims like ‘Fregerefers to Frege. Such views are often accompanied by, and motivated by, a deflationary theory of truth, according to which to assert that a statement is true is just to assert the statement itself.[15]

Despite these ‘negative’ views of reference, the nature of the relation between language and reality continues to be one of the most talked about and vigorously debated issues in the philosophy of language.


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