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Scientific Realism

First published Wed Jun 12, 2002

It is easier to define scientific realism than it is to identify its role as a distinctly philosophical doctrine. Scientific realists hold that the characteristic product of successful scientific research is knowledge of largely theory-independent phenomena and that such knowledge is possible (indeed actual) even in those cases in which the relevant phenomena are not, in any non-question-begging sense, observable. According to scientific realists, for example, if you obtain a good contemporary chemistry textbook you will have good reason to believe (because the scientists whose work the book reports had good scientific evidence for) the (approximate) truth of the claims it contains about the existence and properties of atoms, molecules, sub-atomic particles, energy levels, reaction mechanisms, etc. Moreover, you have good reason to think that such phenomena have the properties attributed to them in the textbook independently of our theoretical conceptions in chemistry. Scientific realism is thus the common sense (or common science) conception that, subject to a recognition that scientific methods are fallible and that most scientific knowledge is approximate, we are justified in accepting the most secure findings of scientists "at face value."

1. Introduction

We defined scientific realism above as the common sense (or common science) conception that, subject to a recognition that scientific methods are fallible and that most scientific knowledge is approximate, we are justified in accepting the most secure findings of scientists "at face value." What requires explanation is why this is a philosophical position rather than just a common sense one. Consider, for example, tropical fish realism -- the doctrine that there really are tropical fish; that the little books you buy about them at pet stores tend to get it approximately right about their appearance, behavior, food and temperature requirements, etc.; and that the fish have these properties largely independently of our theories about them. That's a pretty clear doctrine, but it's so commonsensical that it doesn't seem to have any particular philosophical import. Why is the analogous doctrine about science a philosophical doctrine?

The answer is that -- setting aside skepticism about the external world -- there are no philosophical arguments against tropical fish realism, whereas important philosophical challenges have been raised against scientific realism. The dimensions of scientific realism, understood as a philosophical position, have been largely determined by the responses scientific realists have offered to these challenges. It will be conceptually useful (and approximately historically correct) to see the development of scientific realism as a response to four consecutive challenges, as follows.

  1. The Empiricist Challenge: This is the challenge regarding knowledge of unobservable "theoretical" entities raised by logical empiricists and their allies and underwritten by arguments from the underdetermination of theory choice by observational data.
  2. The Neo-Kantian Challenge, First Version: This is the challenge raised by Hanson (1958) and Kuhn (1970) who argue from the theory dependence of methods (and, especially, of observation) to the conclusion that a realist conception of the growth of approximate scientific knowledge cannot be sustained, given the semantic and methodological incommensurability (Kuhn's term) occasioned by revolutionary changes in science.
  3. The Neo-Kantian Challenge, Second Version: This is the (somehow) related, but (somehow) less relativist conception represented by Putnam's ("internal realist") and Fine's ("natural ontological attitude") critiques of "metaphysical" versions of scientific realism.
  4. The "Post-modern" Challenge: This is a challenge (to both realism and empiricism) arising from recent literary, sociological and historical studies in the emerging "science studies" tradition. It is grounded in the conception that such phenomena as science, knowledge, evidence and truth are social constructions, in some sense or other which implies that one should reject the idea that scientific practices achieve an approximate representational fit, of some sort or other, between the content of scientific theories and the world or reality.

We will discuss these challenges in the sections below.

2. The Empiricist Challenge: Knowledge Empiricism and the Underdetermination Argument

It is easy to characterize the basic empiricist underdetermination argument against scientific realism. Call two theories empirically equivalent just in case exactly the same conclusions about observable phenomena can be deduced from each. Let T be any theory which posits unobservable phenomena. There will always be infinitely many theories which are empirically equivalent to T but which are such that each differs from T, and from all the rest, in what it says about unobservable phenomena (for formalized theories, this is an elementary theorem of mathematical logic). Evidence in favor of T's conception of unobservable phenomena ("theoretical entities") would have to rule out the conceptions represented by each of those other theories. But, since T is empirically equivalent to each of them, they all make exactly the same predictions about the results of observations or experiments. So, no evidence could favor one of them over the others. Thus, at best, we could have evidence in favor of what all these theories have in common--their consequences about "observables"--we could confirm that they are all empirically adequate--but we could not have any evidence favoring T's conception of unobservable theoretical entities. Since T was any theory about unobservables, knowledge of unobservable phenomena is impossible; choice between competing but empirically equivalent conceptions of theoretical entities is underdetermined by all possible observational evidence. [For an important alternative formulation of the notions of empirical adequacy and empirical equivalence, see van Fraassen 1980; see also Demopoulos 1982.]

Several points about this simple and powerful argument are important.

1. It needs fixing up. As it stands, the basic underdetermination argument is fatally flawed. Suppose that T is some ordinary middle-sized scientific theory, like, e.g., the laws of Newtonian mechanics. According to the argument as it stands if T* is some other middle-sized theory empirically equivalent to T, then no evidence could favor T over T*, or vice versa. For ordinary scientific theories this is wrong. Scientists routinely supplement theories with well established auxiliary hypotheses in order to obtain observational predictions from them. [In fact, no observational predictions can be deduced from Newton's laws unless they have been so supplemented, and this is true for lots of fundamental scientific theories; see Kitcher 1982 for a nice discussion.] So, even if T and T* are empirically equivalent, it could still happen that they yield different observational predictions when supplemented by appropriate auxiliary hypotheses, in which case there could be observational evidence favoring one over the other.

So, it is probably best to think of the underdetermination argument as applying, not to "small" theories, but to "total sciences," large-scale conceptions of the world that might represent the total scientific conception of the world at a time. Such a conception would already contain all of the auxiliary hypotheses which were legitimate by its lights, so the problem just mentioned does not arise. In this revised form the underdetermination argument says that--whatever our best scientific conception of the world may be at any given time--we will ever have any evidence that it embodies knowledge of unobservables.

2. It rests on (a particular interpretation of) an extremely plausible doctrine about factual knowledge. Traditional empiricism attributed to experience or sensation two different roles: experience was the source of all of our ideas--of the raw material for thinking--and experience was the only basis we have for justifying beliefs abut matters of fact. The first of these doctrines of empiricism has fallen on hard times, but the second doctrine (called knowledge empiricism by Bennett 1964) enjoys widespread support. In particular, it is an epistemological doctrine to which almost all scientific realists subscribe. The logical empiricist challenge to scientific realism arises from a quite plausible interpretation of knowledge empiricism according to which what it says is that there can be no evidence which rationally distinguishes between two empirically equivalent total sciences (call this doctrine the evidential indistinguishability thesis, or the EIT).

3. It is part of a selectively skeptical program of anti-metaphysical "rational reconstruction." The basic aim of the logical empiricists' project was to solve the demarcation problem, the problem of distinguishing science (good) from "metaphysics" (bad), by appealing to arguments like the underdetermination argument. The result was supposed to be that scientific claims are meaningful and knowable (early on, logical empiricists identified these two properties) whereas "metaphysical" claims, because they are about unobservables, are (at least) unknowable and (according to early versions of logical empiricism) meaningless.

Now almost all actual science is conducted largely in a vocabulary consisting mainly of "theoretical terms": terms apparently referring to unobservables. It was definitely not the logical empiricists' project to reject such science. They intended to be selectively skeptical: to be skeptics about "metaphysics" but not about science. So, they embarked on a project of providing "rational reconstructions" of actual scientific theories and methods which were designed to eliminate any apparent commitments to knowledge of unobservables while still portraying actual scientific practices as sources of knowledge (see, e.g., Carnap 1932, 1959).

In the case of scientific theories, the basic logical empiricist approaches were variations on the idea of instrumentalism, the view that scientific theories were predictive instruments and that the knowledge they represent is limited to what they predict about the observable properties of observables. In the case of scientific methods, strategies for rational reconstruction have not been so easy to formulate. Here's the problem. Almost all of the methods scientists actually use in conducting experimental or observational studies are theory dependent: they depend for their justification on knowledge reflected in previously established theories. Kuhn's (1970) discussion of "normal science" makes this point especially clearly, but all of the logical empiricists were acutely aware of it. Moreover, in sciences like physics, chemistry, molecular biology and astronomy, almost all of those methods seem prima facie to rest on knowledge of unobservable phenomena (just think about the presuppositions of the design of any experiment in chemistry). What the project of rational reconstruction must show is that (almost) all of these methods can be reconstructed in such a way that their application, as guides to the identification of empirically adequate theories, does not require positing knowledge of unobservables.

4. The task of rationally reconstructing actual scientific methods has been the most significant challenge facing logical empiricism and related anti-realist approaches. Instrumentalism and its variants provide a simple reconstruction of the content of scientific theories that pretty exactly fits the requirements of the project of rational reconstruction. The depth of the theory dependence of scientific methods, and the extent to which they seem to depend on knowledge of unobservables, has posed a deeper challenge for logical empiricists and their allies. The fate of operationalism illustrates this challenge. Operationalism was a proposal for rationally reconstructing the use of "theoretical terms" (terms that apparently refer to unobservables) in science by treating those terms as being completely defined in terms of particular operational procedures, thereby eliminating the apparent references to unobservables.

Here's what operationalism says. For any theoretical term (say, for example, "electron density") we can "rationally reconstruct" the use of that term by treating it as having an analytic operational definition in terms of laboratory procedures and instrumentation. So, for example, the operational definition of "electron density" might be given by a sentence of the form

(*) The electron density in a region, R, is given by the value, x, if and only if E applied to R yields the value x,

where E is an instrument such that -- prior to rational reconstruction (but not after) -- scientists would have thought of it as a procedure for measuring electron density.

The analyticity of operational definitions like (*) is essential to the project of rational reconstruction. Operationalism is not, for example, the idea that electron density is defined as whatever magnitude instruments of sort E reliably measure. On that conception (*) would represent an empirical discovery about how to measure electron density, but -- since electrons are "unobservables" -- that's a realist conception not an empiricist one. What the project of rational reconstruction requires is that (*) be true purely as a matter of linguistic stipulation about how the term "electron density" is to be used.

Since (*) is supposed to be analytic, it's supposed to be unrevisable. There is supposed to be no such thing as discovering, about E,, that some other instrument provides a more accurate value for electron density, or provides values for electron density under conditions where E doesn't function. Here again, thinking that there could be an improvement on E with respect to electron density requires thinking of electron density as a real feature of the world which E (perhaps only approximately) measures. But, that's the realist conception which operationalism is designed to rationally reconstruct away.

In actual, and apparently reliable, scientific practice, changes in the instrumentation associated with theoretical terms is utterly routine, and apparently crucial to the progress of science. Scientists routinely replace one instrument with another in order to achieve (as they would say) more accurate measurements of some unobservable magnitude -- often in the light of new theoretical developments -- or to permit measurement of it under conditions for which previous instrumentation was inadequate. According to an operationalist conception, these sorts of modifications would not be methodologically acceptable. Most logical empiricists were not willing to accept this conclusion. After all, they intended to rationally reconstruct the best of actual scientific practice. So most logical empiricists felt compelled to reject operationalism.

Examples such as these made it clear that -- in apparently reliable scientific practice -- scientists behave as though (1) they obtain knowledge of unobservable (as well as observable) phenomena by deploying instruments which (perhaps indirectly) detect them, and (2) their theory dependent methodology in these and other matters is informed by knowledge of unobservables as well as of observables. In particular, they appear to improve, or extend the range of, procedures for measuring or detecting unobservable phenomena in the light of theoretical knowledge of those phenomena.

These features of scientific practice stimulated the articulation (largely by philosophers in the empiricist tradition) of two different but related arguments for scientific realism, to which we now turn our attention.

3. Realist Responses to the Empiricist Challenge: The Senses Extended and Explanations Rehabilitated

3.1 Extending the Senses

The fact that scientists, apparently justifiably, treat certain instruments and procedures as ways of detecting and measuring unobservable (as well as observable) phenomena led several philosophers (see especially Feigl 1956, Maxwell 1962) to adopt what amounts to a non-empiricist (or, perhaps, more flexibly empiricist) understanding of knowledge empiricism according to which (1) the special epistemic role of the senses derives from the fact that they are the only detectors we have built in to our bodies, but (2) the range of phenomena we can detect and measure can be broadened by extending the range of our senses through the use of instruments and procedures whose justification is theory dependent. Thus knowledge of phenomena "unobservable" by traditional empiricists standards is possible. This sort of focus on laboratory detection and manipulation in defense of realism finds perhaps its most energetic expression in the writings of Hacking (see, for example, Hacking 1982).

3.2 Explanation Rehabilitated

The conception that instruments, designed with the help of theoretical understanding, can extend the range of the senses so as to provide information about unobservable phenomena surely has to be a component of any even remotely plausible defense of scientific realism. Still, by itself the idea that instruments can extend the senses is inadequate as a rebuttal to the basic underdetermination argument. Here's why. The basic idea behind the extending-the-senses approach to defending scientific realism is that -- as scientists' knowledge of unobservable phenomena improves and as instrumental design becomes more sophisticated -- measurement and detection would become possible for phenomena hitherto beyond the reach of reliable detection and measurement; think of going from light microscopes, to electron microscopes, to x-ray crystallography devices (which can produce images of atomic structures within crystals).

That has to be the realist's conception, but consider the effect of underdetermination arguments. Suppose that, at some stage in the process of the improvement of theories and instruments, certain phenomena, D, posited by existing theories are detectable by the extended senses, but others are not. Let T be the total science of the time, and let T* be a theory empirically equivalent to T with respect, not to their observational consequences, but with respect to their consequence regarding the phenomena in D. The basic underdetermination argument can be repeated with respect to T and T*, leading to the conclusion that T does not reflect any knowledge of phenomena outside D. Thus there is no evidential basis for any extension of measurement and detection beyond D. Since this argument is applicable at any stage of any supposed extension of the senses, it challenges -- in the name of knowledge empiricism -- any extension of the senses.

3.3 Explanation as Evidential

Considerations such as these seem to have focused the attentions of realists on what we might call extra-experimental standards for theory assessment. To see what these are, let's examine the EIT mentioned earlier. Why would a knowledge empiricist defend the EIT? An obvious answer is that she might think that the only consideration which ever justifies accepting one theory, T, over a rival, T*, is that some prediction about observables obtained from T has proven to be true, whereas a prediction from T* about the same experiment or observation has proven to be false.

But is anything like this right? Pretty obviously -- and pretty obviously by empiricist standards -- no. Here's why. Consider any case in which observations in some set, O, provide us with good scientific evidence to accept some theory, T, such that T applies to an range of observable cases not represented in O (that is, consider any case of scientifically justified induction). In any such case there will always be infinitely many pair-wise empirically inequivalent theories such that (a) each of them is empirically inequivalent to T and (b) each of them is compatible with all the observational data ever collected. This is just the Humean point that induction is not deductively valid. If we have sufficient scientific evidence to justify our accepting T, that evidence must justify our rejection of each of these other theories. [Note that this conclusion must be accepted whether one is an empiricist or a scientific realist regarding the interpretation of T and its rivals, since the theories in question are pair-wise empirically inequivalent and are empirically inequivalent to T.]

Let T* be one of these rivals to T. T* is empirically inequivalent to T, so it would be possible in principle to run a crucial experiment to discriminate between T and T*. But, rational standards for the assessment of scientific evidence dictate that we are justified in rejecting T* even though no such experiment has been run! So, there must be rational standards for the assessment of scientific evidence in addition to the standards which say that evidence for or against a theory can be provided by the success or failure of observational predictions derived from the theory. Let's call these standards extra experimental. They solve the equation (!):

(!) T’s observational predictions have been thus far confirmed + Y = There is good scientific evidence favoring the empirical adequacy of T,

AND, both realists and empiricists agree, they are capable of adjudicating between competing substantive conceptions of the world (because they can adjudicate between empirically inequivalent theories).

So, realists and empiricists agree that it isn't true that rational standards for the assessment of scientific evidence dictate that choice between competing theories must always be based on the results of crucial experiments. Where does that leave the underdetermination argument against knowledge of unobservables?

Almost all scientific realist responses to empiricist anti-realism in the last three decades can be understood as variations on the idea that the solution to (!) -- which empiricists must agree exists on pain of abandoning selective skepticism for skepticism about induction -- also solves (!!):

(!!) T's observational predictions have been thus far confirmed + Y = There is good scientific evidence favoring the (approximate) truth of T, even of its claims about unobservables.

Defenses of realism along these lines (see, e.g, Boyd 1983; Byerly and Lazara 1973; Lipton 1993; Miller 1987; McMullin 1984; Psillos 1999; Putnam 1972, 1975a, 1975b) deploy somewhat different resources, but one thing they have in common is that they reflect, and participate in, what might be called the rehabilitation of explanation in recent philosophy of science. An obvious reply to the EIT is that it ignores the role of explanation as an evidential standard: perhaps one, among a family of empirically equivalent theories, is to be preferred because it explains observable phenomena better than the others, even though it makes the same observational predictions. The standard logical empiricist treatment of explanation, the deductive-nomological account (see Hempel 1942, 1965; Hempel and Oppenheim 1948), responds by identifying the explanatory power of a theory with its predictive power.

Over the last several decades a great many philosophers have been critical of some aspects or other of this reduction of explanation to prediction (see, e.g., Boyd 1985; Kitcher 1981; Lipton 1991; Kitcher and Salmon 1989; McMullin 1984, 1987; Miller 1987; Salmon 1984, 1989). In the context created by this critical work, the notion of explanation, as an independent component of rational scientific methodology, has been to some extent rehabilitated.

A closely related development is also important. Goodman 1954 drew the attention of philosophers of science to the important point that only some hypotheses, the projectible ones, are in the running for confirmation by observations, and that projectibility judgments are in some way or other a posteriori judgments informed by previously established theories and practices. What has become pretty clear is that, however they are to be philosophically analyzed, projectibility judgments are in fact judgments of plausibility in the light of previously established theories (Boyd 1999; Lipton 1991, 1993), and that plausibility of the relevant sort is a matter of the sort of unification with those theories which has explanatory import. So, explanation, in its own right, and as an aspect of projectibility judgments, appears to play a crucial role in the assessment of observational evidence for scientific theories.

To a good first approximation, the following characterize the conditions under which observations, O, substantially confirm a theory T:

  1. T is projectible (that is, theoretically plausible in the light of the best established science).
  2. The observations in O either confirm predictions obtained from T, or validate explanations based on T or both.
  3. For each of the projectible alternatives, A, to T which address the same questions, the observations in O provide evidence against the predictions and/or explanations underwritten by A.
  4. The observations in O were obtained under conditions which embody controls for each of the experimental artifacts or errors of sampling which are suggested by projectible conceptions of the relevant observational or experimental conditions.

The basic strategy of defenses of realism which argue that the solution to (!) -- which empiricists accept -- also solves (!!) involves arguing that the considerations of explanatory power of the sort indicated in characterizations like 1.-4. successfully adjudicate between empirically equivalent theories, so that knowledge of unobservables is sometimes obtained.

3.4 Two Explanationist Strategies for Defending Realism

There is a (very) rough division between two versions of the strategy in question. One strategy, let's call it local explanationism, (perhaps reflected in McMullin 1980, 1987; Miller 1987; and Lipton 1993) involves arguing that the relevant explanation-involving, extra-experimental criteria do, in some cases, successfully adjudicate between empirically equivalent theories, so that some scientific knowledge of unobservable phenomena is actual. An alternative approach, the abductive strategy, (see, e.g., Boyd 1983, Psillos 1999) treats scientific realism itself as a scientific hypothesis which is supported by the fact that it provides the only viable explanation for the such success as methodological principles like 1.-4., above, have as guides to the identification of empirically adequate theories. The justification of inductive methods in science is, therefore, provided by scientific realism, understood as itself an a posteriori scientific hypothesis.

There are interesting differences between these approaches, and between the various different versions of each, but certain empiricist challenges can be raised against all or most of them. Fine (1984, 1986a) has offered two very significant, and closely related, criticisms of the abductive strategy. First, Fine argues, the strategy begs the question against anti-realist positions by treating scientific explanatory power as carrying evidential weight in philosophy. After all, the dispute between empiricist anti-realists and realists is, in the first instance, a dispute about whether a theory's explanatory power can count in favor of the claims it makes about unobservables. [van Fraassen 1980 makes similar criticisms; he and Laudan 1981 each also challenges the claim that scientific realism provides the best explanation for the reliability of scientific methods in identifying empirically adequate theories.]

Fine's second criticisms is more abstractly epistemological. He points out that, according to the realist who adopts the abductive strategy, the methods of science are to be philosophically justified by appeal to a posteriori scientific findings, i.e., by appeal to the scientific realist's scientific explanation for their reliability. This approach, he argues, violates the philosophical requirement that the justification for the methods in a domain of inquiry should be grounded in methods more secure than the methods being justified.

Plainly these criticisms represent serious challenges to the abductive strategy. Importantly, they also challenge any version of the local explanationist strategy unless it incorporates an a priori (as opposed to an empirical scientific) defense of the evidential relevance of the explanatory power of theoretical claims about unobservables. There are two reasons to doubt that such an a priori defense is available.

In the first place, philosophical defenses of epistemological positions almost always rest, at least in part, on appeals to philosophical "intuitions" regarding particular cases. Although many philosophers regard the deliverances of philosophical intuitions as justified a priori, in fact epistemic intuitions about particular cases deliver to us the results of our trained (or, in some cases, untrained) judgments regarding the domain of inquiry in question. They are reliable guides to matters epistemological just in case -- and to the extent that -- the training in question has itself been relevantly reliable (Boyd 1999).

For philosophers of science, the relevant training centrally includes training in the methods and findings of the relevant sciences. Since, "pre-analytically" at least, those methods countenance inductive inferences to explanations involving unobservables, and since the most celebrated findings often incorporate the results of such inductions, a very significant burden of proof would rest on someone who maintained that her philosophical arguments in favor of accepting inductive inferences to explanatory theories about unobservables did not, at least tacitly, rest on intuitions which beg the question against empiricist anti-realism.

Moreover, there are independent reasons to doubt that there could be an a priori defense of accepting the results of inductive inferences to the best explanation, whether or not that explanation posits unobservables. To a good first approximation, typical scientific explanations offer accounts of the causal mechanisms or processes by which some phenomena are brought about, and scientists evaluate the explanatory power of a theory by trying to assess the likelihood that mechanisms or processes posited by the theory operate to produce the relevant effects. Their judgments in these matters are, almost always, informed by experiments and observations but they are nevertheless highly theory dependent, ordinarily relying heavily on previously established "background" theories concerning the relevant sorts of causal mechanisms and processes (for accounts with this flavor see, e.g., Lipton 1993, Psillos 1999, Boyd 1985). Such judgments are reliable only to the extent that those background theories are relevantly approximately accurate.

In consequence, any defense of the practice of counting the explanatory power of a particular theory as providing evidence in its favor would appear to require a defense of the proposition that the findings of the relevant background sciences are relevantly approximately accurate. While, in some cases, this may be a justified conclusion, its justification could hardly be a priori (for an account somewhat more sympathetic to a prioricity for certain cases, see Miller 1987). Exactly similar arguments regarding theory dependent judgments of projectibility provide additional prima facie support for the same anti-a prioristic conclusion (Boyd 1999).

In the light of these challenges, there is a strong case to be made that any defense of scientific realism must rest on a conception according to which both scientific methods and methods in the philosophy of science, must lack a priori justifications. Such a conception of science, and of the relevant parts of philosophy, would thus be non-foundational and, presumably, naturalistic (see Psillos 1999). [For a somewhat different naturalistic conception, see Kitcher 1993. For an excellent discussion of competing metaphilosophical conceptions in the philosophy of science and their relation to debates about realism see Wylie 1986.]

3.5 Realism and Approximate Truth

Whether or not the defense of scientific realism requires the adoption of a non-foundationalist conception of knowledge, it almost certainly requires the articulation of a conception of approximate truth. It is central to any plausible realist conception that, at least sometimes, the historical development of scientific theories reflect progress by successive approximation to the truth -- about unobservables as well as about observables, and it is central to arguments for realism that involve the rehabilitation of explanation as an epistemic notion that relevant improvements in approximate knowledge are typically reflected in improvements of method. So, realist philosophy of science relies heavily on the notion of approximate truth.

Laudan 1981 raises against scientific realism (and especially against abductive arguments for realism) the "pessimistic meta-induction." He points out that there are lots of real historical cases in which scientific theories which have been predictively successful and have contributed positively to scientific methodology have not been true, so that the truth of scientific theories need not be posited in order to explain the successes of scientific practice.

The obvious realist reply is that what must be posited is the approximate truth the relevant theories (see Hardin and Rosenberg 1982 and Laudan 1984). Articulation of this reply raises important issues, since any consistent theory can be represented as approximately true in certain respects, Moreover, as Laudan points out, many of the historically important and methodologically significant theories are, by our current lights, deeply false in some important respects. Efforts to develop an appropriate account of approximate truth in science include Niiniluoto 1987, Oldie 1986, Weston 1992, Boyd 1990.

One novel approach to the problem of approximation is provided by Worrall's structural realism (Worrall 1994; for a critique see Psillos 1995, 1999). The basic idea here is that the most serious departures from the truth in scientific theories tend to be errors about the natures of the basic phenomena rather than about their structural relations. In the light of this generalization, the structural realist proposes accepting the claims about causal structures (even unobservable ones) posited by well confirmed theories while withholding acceptance from what those theories say about the natures of the phenomena so related. To a good first approximation, one might think of structural realism as the view that, for any well established scientific theory, T, one should accept the Ramsey sentence obtained from T by replacing each theoretical term in T by a new variable, and then prefixing, to the resulting open sentence, existential quantifiers over those variables, where the quantification is understood to range over causal structures in nature.

Aside from its importance as a contribution to the literature on approximate truth, structural realism is significant in two other ways. In the first place, it reflects a general tendency in the literature on scientific realism to worry about the extent to which scientific realists must portray scientific knowledge as potentially resolving genuinely metaphysical questions. Putnam's internal realism and Fine's natural ontological attitude (discussed below) may be seen as important ontologically deflationary approaches to this question.

The other significance of structural realism lies in the fact that the distinction upon which it relies -- that between causal structures and natures -- may have been, in a certain sense, challenged by philosophers like Shoemaker (1980) who hold that properties, magnitudes, states and the like are defined by their contributions to the causal powers of things. It is an interesting question whether approaches to metaphysics like Shoemaker's are compatible with the approaches to approximation informed by structural realism.

4. The Neo-Kantian Challenge: First Version

Hanson (1958) and, especially, Kuhn (1970 -- first published 1962; see Scheffler 1967, Shapere 1964 for early discussions) raised significant challenges to scientific realism, arguing from the theory dependence of methods (and, especially, of observation) to the conclusion that a realist conception of the growth of approximate scientific knowledge cannot be sustained The intellectual impact of their work in the philosophy of science has been very different from the impact it has had in the rest of the humanities and in many of the social sciences. In the later disciplines the impact of Kuhn, especially, has been to underwrite the sort of anti-realist "postmodernism" discussed later in this essay. In the philosophy of science, by contrast, the impact of Hanson and Kuhn has been mainly to stimulate the articulation of naturalistic or causal conceptions of reference and essentialist conceptions of the definitions of scientific kinds and properties. [I am here presenting what might be thought of as the "standard" conception of Kuhn's position and of responses to it. There has been a recent revival of interest in Kuhn among analytic philosophers and others, and alternative readings of Kuhn are possible (see, e.g., Hoyningen-Huene 1993 and the papers collected in Hoyningen-Huene and Sankey 2001). Whatever the merits of less standard interpretations of Kuhn, it was the standard conception of his arguments that occasioned the realist responses discussed here.]

That arguments proceeding from the theory dependence of scientific methods and of measurement should have been deployed against realism is initially surprising. After all, most of the significant arguments for scientific realism emphasize theory dependence. Moreover, Kuhn's discussion of what he calls normal science seem to have exactly anticipated the abductive argument for realism discussed above. He insists that the success of research in normal science is explained, in significant part, because scientific practitioners have, as a result of their understanding of the paradigmatic theory, a quasi-metaphysical knowledge of the basic (and often unobservable) causal factors involved in the phenomena they study.

Where Kuhn's account departs from a realist conception of the growth of approximate knowledge is in his treatment of what he calls scientific revolutions. Although most empiricist philosophers of science had recognized the theory dependence of scientific methods even before the work of Hanson and Kuhn, it was Hanson's and Kuhn's work which made it clear that accepting the theory dependence of scientific methods raise the possibility of incommensurability between competing scientific theories (or paradigms): the possibility that in science there might be disagreements between theoretical perspectives such that there do not exist methods for their resolutions which are both rational and fair (to the competing positions).

What each author claimed was that this situation had actually obtained in important historical cases where, according to a realist perspective, one might think that the rational application of scientific methodology had resulted in the replacement of one theory by a more nearly accurate one. What was especially striking -- and challenging to a realist conception -- was Kuhn's claim that among the "scientific revolutions" where this had occurred was the transition from Newtonian mechanics to special relativity at the beginning of the 20th century.

What is important in understanding the realist response to Kuhn's claim about this particular historical case is that there are lots of experimental results (like, e.g., those which are ordinarily understood to reflect the increase of mass of particles in a cyclotron) such that they certainly look like cases in which a methodology -- including measurement procedures -- which is acceptable by both Newtonian and relativistic standards adjudicates in favor of the relativistic conception. Lots and lots of relativistic effects are such that they can be, apparently, detected and measured using instruments whose design begs no questions against either of the competing "paradigms." The transition from Newtonian mechanics to special relativity certainly looks like a textbook case of rational progression from, one theory to an even more accurate one.

Against this picture Kuhn argues that no such successive approximation occurred because Newtonian mechanics and relativity theory do not share a common subject matter regarding which the latter is a better approximation than the former. For example -- he argues -- the term "mass" as it occurs in Newtonian mechanics does not refer to the same magnitude as does the term "mass" in relativistic mechanics because "Newtonian mass is conserved; Einsteinian is convertible with energy. Only at low relative velocities may the two be measured in the same way, and even then they must not be conceived to be the same (102)."

In giving this remarkable argument Kuhn was tacitly relying on a conception of the referential semantics of scientific terms probably derived from the work of Carnap (see Carnap 1950; there are important controversies about the proper interpretation of Carnap -- see, e.g., Friedman 1987, 1991 -- but they are irrelevant to our story). The conception in question is a version of the standard empiricist "descriptivist" conception that the referent of a term is picked out by a description which constitutes the analytic definition of the term in question. According to the version Kuhn relies on, the analytic definition of a scientific term is provided by the most basic laws containing the term. Thus, as the example of "mass" illustrates, any change in the fundamental laws involving a scientific term must involve a change in referent (or reference failure, a possibility Kuhn 1970 does not discuss).

4.1 "Causal" and Naturalistic Theories of Reference

What was important for the development of realist philosophy of science was the fact that most philosophers of science were, at least tacitly, themselves inclined to some version of analytic descriptivism. The anti-realist consequences which Kuhn (and Hanson) derived from descriptivist conceptions let to the articulation by realists of alternative theories of reference. Characteristically, these theories followed the lead of Kripke (1971, 1972), whose work was mainly concerned with the semantics of modality, and Putnam (1972, 1975a, 1975b), whose work was mainly concerned with issues in the semantics of scientific terms. Each of them advocated a "causal" theory of reference according to which the reference relation between a term and its referent was a matter of there being the right sort of (chain of) causal relation(s) between uses of the term and (instances of) its referent. Numerous variations on this naturalistic theme -- some assigning importance to descriptive elements as well as causal relations in the establishment of reference -- have been proposed (see, e.g., Boyd 1999, Dretske 1981, Enç 1976, Field 1973, Kitcher 1992, Miller 1987, Papineau 1987, 1993, Psillos 1999). It is by now pretty well accepted that some departure from analytic descriptivism, involving some causal elements, is a crucial component of a realist approach to scientific knowledge.

4.2 Realism and the Revival of Essentialism

Kuhn's analytic descriptivism assigns to the analytic definition of a scientific term the role of fixing its referent. Once that role is assigned to other ("causal," "naturalistic") features of term use, it becomes possible to explore the issue of non-analytic a posteriori definitions of the kinds, magnitudes, etc. to which scientific terms refer. The work of Kripke and Putnam just cited gave rise to a class of theories according to which scientific kinds, etc. have real rather than nominal definitions ("real essences" rather than "nominal essences" in the sense of Locke 1689). The paradigm example is that the real definition, or essence, of water is described by the formula "H2O". It is by now a standard feature of realist conceptions of science that they incorporate some version or other of the idea that scientific kinds, categories, etc. (natural kinds) possess such real definitions (for interesting discussions of the development of this realist conception with special reference to biological kinds see Wilson 1999a, 1999b).

The idea that natural kinds possess such definitions has been consistently linked, in the realist literature, to discussions of the projectibility of predicates and hypotheses (Goodman 1954, Quine 1969). Only by reference to kinds (etc.) with real rather than nominal definitions -- only by, in some sense or other, "cutting the world at its (a posteriori defined) joints" -- are we able to fit our language use to the world in such a way as to make reliable induction and explanation possible (Boyd 1999; Psillos 1999; Putnam 1972, 1975a, 1975b; Sismondo 1996; Wilson 1999b).

One further point about real essences is important. The stock example of a real definition (H2O for water) might suggest that real definitions of scientific kinds (etc.) must, like logical empiricists' ideal nominal definitions, specify necessary and sufficient conditions for kind membership. In fact, examination of cases in those sciences which study complex phenomena indicate that some natural definitions may consist of families of imperfectly "clustered" properties, with the result that the kinds they define do not have precisely determinate boundaries (Boyd 1999, Wilson 1999b; but see also Hacking 1991a, 1991b). Realism may imply that there is, in that sense, vagueness in nature (contrast Putnam 1983).

4.3 The Metaphysics of Social Construction

Kuhn tacitly adopts a semantic conception according to which the most basic laws in a paradigm are exactly true by linguistic convention. He also claims that such laws provide quasi-metaphysical knowledge of basic causal factors. His claim that these laws are exactly true is what leads him to conclusions about the (semantic) history of recent physics which are prima facie implausible, and it is this feature of his semantic conception against which causal or naturalistic theories of reference are mainly directed.

The example of the semantics of the names of fictional characters indicates that the linguistic conventions operating in fiction make it possible to establish it by convention that certain claims about a character are approximately true without thereby establishing their exact truth. Versions of Kuhn's social constructivist position could, therefore, be formulated according to which the establishment of a paradigm imposes by convention, on the phenomena scientists study, a quasi-metaphysical structure which makes the central laws of the paradigm approximately (but not necessarily exactly) true.

Although Kuhn never considered this version of constructivism, it fits well with the tradition of anthropological relativism to which Kuhn's position is often assimilated. It is not refuted by arguments for causal or naturalistic theories of reference, nor does it entail wildly implausible claims about incommensurability in recent science. It is, however, pretty clearly an anti-realist position -- one which has resonances with the sorts of "postmodern" anti-realism discussed later in this essay. A realist rebuttal to it is available if one makes explicit, and defends, a piece of common, and philosophical, sense about the metaphysics of conventionality: the no non-causal contribution thesis (2N2C). According to 2N2C, human social practices make no non-causal contribution to the causal structure of the world, and are in that way metaphysically innocent (see Boyd 1999).

5. The Neo-Kantian Challenge: Second Version

Structural realism represents one attempt to defend scientific realism while being modest about its metaphysical implications. Putnam's "internal realism" and Fine's closely related "natural ontological attitude" (NOA) represent other attempts to follow scientific realists in taking the findings of science at "face value" while avoiding realism's excessively metaphysical understanding of those results (Putnam 1978, 1981, 1983a; Fine 1984, 1986a, 1986b, 1991; for a nice exposition see the Introduction to Papineau 1996; for critiques see Glymour 1982; Millikan 1986; Newton-Smith 1989a, 1989b; McMullin 1991; Papineau 1987).

"Internal realism" and NOA are not easy to explicate and are, almost certainly, not the same position. Nevertheless they share some important elements in common.

5.1 An Analogy with Phenomenalism

An analogy with issues regarding knowledge of the external world may be helpful here. One classical early logical empiricist response to questions about our knowledge of (observable) external objects was the phenomenalist strategy of representing external objects as "logical constructions" analytically defined in sense-datum terms (see, e.g., Carnap 1928). That certain experience patterns constituted experiences of, e.g., chairs was supposed to reflect, not a discovery about some epistemically important metaphysical relation between chairs and those patterns, but, instead, the implication of the analytic definition of "chair" in the sense-datum language.

Nevertheless, nothing in the phenomenalist project was supposed to preclude the possibility that psychologists studying perception might discover that those very experience patterns are caused by light reflected off chairs and stimulating the retina is particular ways. This would be unobjectionable as a bit of empirical science, but it was not to be understood as positing an epistemically relevant relation of detection and representation between the experiential pattern and chairs, understood as experience-independent features of the world. It could not be understood as a component in philosophical justification of the claim that we know about, and "chair" refers to, experience-independent chairs.

By contrast, non-foundationalist "causal" or "reliabilist" conceptions of perceptual knowledge in the tradition initiated by Goldman (1967, 1976) would treat the relevant discovery both as an empirical scientific discovery and as a component of a (naturalistic) philosophical (and epistemically relevant) explanation of why our chair beliefs sometimes represent knowledge about (experience independent) chairs. Similarly, if the psychological findings in question were incorporated into a suitable empirical theory of language use they could, on a causal or naturalistic conception of reference, underwrite the philosophical conception that "chair" refers to (experience independent) chairs.

5.2 Non-Foundationalist Epistemology Again

What this suggests is that a defense of realism against internal realism or NOA must follow the lead of non-foundational causal theories of knowledge, and of perception in particular, in insisting that scientific findings about, e.g., the measurement and detection of theoretical entities, and about the reference of scientific terms have philosophical as well as scientific relevance (see, e.g., Boyd 1999, Byerly and Lazara 1973, Hacking 1982, Psillos 1999).

5.3 Challenges Regarding the Epistemology and Metaphysics of Reference and Kinds

The arguments Putnam offers in defense of internal realism are complex, and (as the critiques cited indicate) both controversial and sometimes hard to explicate. Nevertheless, it seems pretty clear that Putnam attributes to "metaphysical realism" something like the following commitments:

  1. Reference is a relation between linguistic entities and entirely extra-linguistic (and in that sense independently existing) natural kinds. Natural kinds (magnitudes, etc.) are, somehow or other, out in the world, and available for discovery and naming. There is a single set of such natural entities somehow given by the structure of the world itself, independently of human practice.
  2. The reference relation between natural kind (magnitude, etc.) terms and their referents is a purely causal matter, where the purity in question is a matter of the reference relation's being definable without significantly acknowledging descriptive elements or human intentions.

If one accepts this picture of scientific realism, understood metaphysically, then it is natural to think that what makes the associated conception of truth a correspondence conception is that reference is seen as a relation between terms and such independently existing kinds. The realist correspondence conception, so conceived, is subject to two important challenges.

First, if we think of natural kinds as things somehow independent of linguistic and methodological practices, then there are lots of natural kinds out there, and it is difficult to see how the causal conception of reference fixing could explain how a natural kind term could ever have a unique referent. This problem is exacerbated if one thinks of reference as being purely causal in the way just indicated, since intentional and descriptive factors, which might otherwise be thought to reduce the ambiguity of the reference relation, are set aside. Such considerations seem to be the basis of the "model theoretic" arguments in Putnam 1978, 1980) against "metaphysical realism."

Secondly, reference to natural kinds is supposed to explain the inductive successes of scientific practice, so there must be some quite intimate connection between natural kinds and the conceptual machinery of the sciences. If one thinks of realist theories as entailing that natural kinds are independent of that machinery, it is hard to see how the explanation could work unless it rested on something like a objective idealist theory according to which natural kinds are somehow metaphysically "fitted" for explanation and induction independently of the relevant practices. Such an assumption is profoundly at odds with the philosophical naturalism and metaphysical materialism ordinarily associated with scientific realism. This sort of consideration appears to underwrite aspects of Putnam's criticism of materialist metaphysical realism in "Why There Isn't a Ready Made World" (Putnam 1983a).

5.4 Realist responses

Of these two challenges, the first has received much more attention from scientific realists. There has been widespread acceptance of the view that descriptive and/or intentional factors must figure in any scientific realist account of reference (e.g., Boyd 1999, Enç 1976, Kitcher 1992, Papineau 1979, Psillos 1999).

Much less has been said by realists about the sense, if any, in which scientific realism is committed to there being natural kinds (etc.) which are independent of us. Psillos (1999), for example, discusses problems with pure causal theories of reference extensively, but takes it to be a basic posit of scientific realism that "…the world has a definite and mind-independent natural-kind structure" (xix). Boyd (1999) offers an alternative approach according to which, like natural kind terms and classificatory practices, natural kinds themselves should be thought of as social artifacts deployed in achieving an appropriate fit or accommodation between inductive and explanatory practices and relevant causal structures.

Whether the intrusion of descriptive and intentional notions into realist accounts of reference, or the treatment of natural kinds as social artifacts, is compatible with the main spirit of scientific realism depends on the sense(s) in which scientific realism should be understood as entailing that the phenomena scientists study are "mind independent." A possible response to this question, compatible with the proposals just mentioned, is that the relevant sense of mind independence is fully captured by the no non-causal contribution doctrine discussed earlier.

6. The "Post-modern" Challenge

Most recent work in the relatively new discipline of science studies (see, e.g, Biagioli 1999; Galison 1987; Latour and Wolgar 1979; Latour 1987; Pickering 1984, 1995; Pinch 1985; Shapin 1982, 1994; Shapin and Schaffer 1985) and a significant body of work in feminist philosophy of science or feminist aproaches to particular science (see, e.g., Alcoff and Potter 1993; Antony 1993; Antony and Witt 1993; Conkey and Spector 1984; Fuss 1989; Gero and Conkey 1991; Harding 1986, 1987, 1991; Harding and Hintikka 1983; Harding and O'Barr 1987; Hartsock 1987; Haslanger 1993; Keller 1983: Longino 1989, 1990; Tuana 1989; Wright 1996; Wylie 1991, 1993, 2000; Wylie and Okruhlik 1987) has been to some extent influenced by, or has engaged with, anti-realist "postmodern" conceptions according to which such phenomena as science, knowledge, evidence and truth are social constructions, in some sense or other which implies that one should reject the idea that scientific practices achieve an approximate representational fit of some sort or other between the content of scientific theories and the world or reality.

Although serious interchanges between scientific realism and these approaches have not developed to the level of exchanges between, e.g., scientific realist approaches and logical empiricist or neo-Kantian ones, a number of philosophers of science have defended a realist approach against post modern relativism and skepticism (see, e.g., Boyd 1999; Kitcher 1993; Papineau 1998; Pettit 1998; Sismondo 1993a, 1993b, 1996). Several factors are probably important in determining the dimensions of the dispute between realists and postmodernists.

6.1 Boundary Work

Sociologists of science have identified a feature of scientific work which is especially important when new (sub)disciplines are being established. Practitioners of emerging disciplines devote considerable effort to distinguishing the approach of their new disciplines from the approaches of more fully established disciplines, often by adopting a substantially adversarial stance towards them. This phenomenon has been played out in the establishment of science studies and (to a somewhat lesser extent)feminist philosophy. In each of these cases, mainstream realist and empiricist approaches to epistemology have been special targets of such adversarial stance taking. In the case of science studies, to a very good first approximation, the "boundary work" foundations of the emerging discipline rest on a critique of epistemology and of the correspondence conception of truth. This perfectly ordinary, and non-culpable, boundary work resistance to traditional epistemology and the correspondence theory has proven to be a barrier to communication between mainstream philosophers of science and others in science studies.

6.2 Postmodern Responses to Naive Empiricist Conceptions of Objectivity

There is a prevalent conception of scientific objectivity which is historically associated with empiricist conceptions of science, even though it is sufficiently naive that probably no professional empiricist philosopher of science ever defended all of its components. According to it, the objects of scientific study are natural kinds (etc.) which are

  1. independent of human practices,
  2. defined by
    1. eternal,
    2. unchanging,
    3. ahistorical, and
    4. intrinsic

    necessary and sufficient membership conditions;

  3. referred to in
    1. fundamental,
    2. exceptionless,
    3. eternal, and
    4. ahistorical

    laws; and

  4. discovered by the deployment of
    1. eternal,
    2. ahistorical,
    3. politically and culturally neutral, and
    4. foundational

    scientific methods.

To a significant extent, anti-realist postmodern conceptions of science take these components of naive empiricism to be definitive of the notion of scientific objectivity. Postmodern students of science hold -- correctly (Boyd 1999; Sismondo 1993a, 1993b, 1996; Knorr Cetina 1993) -- that nothing in actual scientific practice even remotely fits these criteria for objectivity. On this basis they often reach the anti-realist conclusion that scientific research never achieves objective knowledge. It is characteristic of defenses of realism against postmodern anti-realism that they deny, about one or more of the components mention, that they are necessary for objective knowledge.

6.3 "Quantum Superposition" of Conceptions of Social Construction

There are, in the literature and in intellectual discourse, roughly three versions of "social constructivism," the view that science is the "social construction of reality."

  1. Neo-Kantian social constructivism. This is the view discussed earlier according to which the adoption of a scientific paradigm successfully imposes a quasi-metaphysical causal structure on the phenomena scientists study.
  2. Science-as-social-process social constructivism. This is the view that the production of scientific findings is a social process subject to the same sorts of influences -- cultural, economic, political, sociological, etc. -- which affect any other social process.
  3. Debunking social constructivism. This is the skeptical position according to which the findings of work in the sciences are determined exclusively, or in large measure, not by the "facts," but instead by relations of social power within the scientific community and the broader community within which research is conducted.

These are quite distinct positions. For example, 1. and 3. are mutually inconsistent, and 2. is compatible with either 1., or 3., or with standard logical empiricist and scientific realist conceptions. Nevertheless, in science studies and in other disciplines influenced by postmodernism they tend to become conflated.

In the first place, many practitioners in such disciples, for reasons rehearsed above, take 2. to imply that traditional realist and empiricist conceptions are mistaken. Moreover, having adopted 2., they tend to adopt a position which looks like a quantum superposition of 1. and 3., oscillating between thinking of scientific practice as (really) constructing the (quasi-metaphysical) truth and denying that it leads to truth in any metaphysically interesting sense.

The inconsistencies involved are made clearest in cases in which scientific theories of race and gender are said to be "social constructions." Often the intent here is to engage in scientific and political criticism but, in so far as the neo-Kantian, and the fully debunking conceptions of social construction are simultaneously operative, authors often have a difficult time finding the resources for saying that such theories are really (really!) false. [For discussions of these conflations and their impact on methodological and political criticism see Sismondo 1993a, 1993b, 1996; Knorr Cetina 1993; Boyd 1999.]

6.4 Naturalism and the symmetry thesis

In one of the founding documents of contemporary science studies, Barnes and Bloor (1982) criticize a tendency in the history, philosophy, and sociology of science to treat true and false scientific theories asymmetrically: explaining the acceptance of true theories as the ordinary and to-be-expected result of applying the scientific method, but explaining the acceptance of false theories by appealing instead to the operation of "social factors." They propose that explanations for the acceptance of scientific theories should be symmetrical, appealing to the same sorts of factors in explaining the acceptance of true and false theories.

In science studies, it has been nearly universal to accept the symmetry thesis and to interpret it as requiring that truth or the facts not be treated as among the factors involved in explaining the adoption of scientific theories. Almost certainly, a defense of scientific realism in the light of the symmetry thesis will require insisting that a naturalistic scientific realism does, by considering facts of all sorts potentially relevant to the explanation of the acceptance of scientific theories, satisfy the requirements of the symmetry thesis. The locus classicus for this approach is Antony 1993; it is developed in Sismondo 1999.

6.5 Essentialism

One of the most important sources of resistance to scientific realism among feminist philosophers has been the conception that realism underwrites essentialism and that essentialism is a central component of racist and sexist ideology (see Fuss 1989 for a discussion). A naturalistic version of scientific realism does entail a sort of essentialism about natural kinds (etc.) but that sort of essentialism need not have the form suggested by the stereotype of scientific objectivity discussed above, and need not be inimical to critiques of scientific racism or sexism (Boyd 1999, Sismondo 1996). In particular, it is compatible with the sort of realist naturalism discussed here that social categories like race and gender might have as their essences a certain role in the stabilization or justification of particular sorts of historically situated oppression and exploitation. Similarly, realist naturalism is compatible with the view that some social categories (like races and genders) or psychological categories (like mental illnesses) are real, but are in some respects artifacts of classificatory (and other) social practices (see, e.g., Hacking 1986a, 1986b). All that is required by naturalistic realism is that the contribution of social practices not violate 2N2C.

6.6 Concluding Remark

Scientific realism is, by the lights of most of its defenders, the sciences' own philosophy of science. Considerations of the significant philosophical challenges which it faces indicate that it can be effectively defended only by the adoption of a metaphilosophical approach which is also closely tied to the science, viz., some version or other of philosophical naturalism.


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Feyerabend, Paul | Kuhn, Thomas | scientific explanation | scientific knowledge: social dimensions of