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Scottish Philosophy in the 19th Century

First published Tue Jan 29, 2002; substantive revision Mon Jan 12, 2009

Philosophical debate in 19th century Scotland was very vigorous, its agenda being set in large part by the impact of Kant and German Idealism on the philosophical tradition of the Scottish Enlightenment. The principal figures are Sir William Hamilton, James Frederick Ferrier and Alexander Bain, and later in the century, the so-called “Scottish Idealists” notably Edward Caird, Andrew Seth Pringle-Pattison, D.G. Ritchie and Sir Henry Jones.

1. The Enlightenment Background

While Scottish philosophy of the 18th century is studied extensively, Scottish philosophy in the 19th century is neglected to the point of being virtually unknown. Francis Hutcheson, David Hume and Thomas Reid and are names familiar to almost all philosophers; Sir William Hamilton, James Frederick Ferrier, Alexander Bain, Edward Caird and Andrew Seth to hardly any. Yet in their day, the names of these philosophers were not only prominent in Scotland, but widely known across Europe. To understand this decline in reputation, it is necessary to see 19th century Scottish philosophy against the background of the century that preceded it.

According to George Davie there is an

opposition…between…two contrasting positions that in their tension provided Scottish philosophy with its central problem: the Berkeleian system, according to which, in the interests of reconciling progress with traditional standards, we are to set aside the instincts of the farmer in favour of the sophistication of the philosopher and to think with the learned while we talk with the vulgar; and the Hutchesonian system, according to which, with the same aim of reconciling material advance with the intellectual principle, we are to respect the instincts of the farmer as against the sophistication of the philosopher and initiate a sort of dialogue between the vulgar and the learned, instead of talking down to the farmer from the standpoint of the philosopher. (Davie 1994: 41-2)

Cast in these terms it is easy to place the two most famous philosophers of the Scottish Enlightenment on either side of the divide. On the side of the first is Hume, whose skeptical conclusions arise from the Berkleyan presupposition asserted in the very first sentence of his Treatise of Human Nature

All the perceptions of the human mind resolve themselves into two distinct kinds, which I shall call impressions and ideas. The difference betwixt these consists in the degrees of force and liveliness with which they strike upon the mind. (Hume 1888: 1)

On the other side is Thomas Reid, for whom the errors of Hume result from the boldness of his starting point.

It is genius, and not the want of it, that adulterates philosophy, and fills it with error and false theory. A creative imagination disdains the mean offices of digging for a foundation, of removing rubbish, and carrying materials: leaving these servile employments to the drudges in science, it plans a design, and raises a fabric. (Reid 1997: 15)

The problem as Reid saw it was that a highly theoretical philosophy was trying to run before it could walk, because in sharp contrast to subjects that are “really sciences”—mechanics, astronomy and optics are the examples he gives—

when we turn our attention inward and consider the phaenomena of human thoughts, opinions and perceptions, and endeavour to trace them to the general laws and first principles of our constitution, we are immediately involved in darkness and perplexity. And if common sense, or the principles of education, happen not to be stubborn, it is odds but we end in absolute skepticism. (Reid 1997: 16)

It is well known that, on Reid's analysis, Hume's skepticism derives in large part from his implicit subscription to the “way of ideas”, a conception of knowledge and experience that finds its origins in Descartes, Malebranche and Locke, and its most dramatic exposition in Berkeley who, though no skeptic, “proved by unanswerable arguments what no man in his senses could believe” (Reid 1997: 20). The antidote to such skepticism is common sense, but not of the robust sort displayed by Dr. Johnson when he purported to refute Berkeley by kicking a stone. “Common sense” can mean two things, in fact: widespread popular conviction on the one hand, or the basic principles at work in human reasoning and belief formation on the other. Widespread conviction can be false, of course, which is why the method of the School of Common Sense was thought suspect by many, described by Kant, for example, as a stratagem by which “the stalest windbag can confidently take up with the soundest thinker” (Kant 1951: 259). But in Reid at any rate, philosophical inquiry into the human mind is not a matter of making popular opinion the test of truth, but of initiating a “dialogue between the vulgar and the learned” (to repeat Davie's happy phrase) in which proper weight is attached to actual minds at work.

There is, then, this deep division within the philosophy of the Scottish Enlightenment, yet it occurs within a context of striking unanimity also. “Wise men now agree, or ought to agree in this, that there is but one way to the knowledge of nature's works; the way of observation and experiment” Reid writes (Reid 1997: 11), thereby endorsing the express intention of Hume to “introduce the experimental method of reasoning into moral subjects” (the subtitle of the Treatise). Both remarks reflect a commitment to the project of a “science of mind”, a project common to all the major Scottish philosophers of the period. Thus George Turnbull (Reid's teacher) writing in 1740 says “I was led long ago to apply myself to the study of the human mind in the same way as to that of the human body” (quoted in Davie 1994: 24)

In short, both division and unanimity are present within eighteenth century Scottish philosophy, unanimity with respect to aim—a science of mind—and division with respect to method—the “principles of common sense” versus “the way of ideas”. This is a tension, however, within only one part of 18th century Scottish philosophy, namely the philosophy of sensation and perception, and not perhaps the most influential part. The Scottish Enlightenment is in many ways more marked by the type of thinking about social and political topics that we find in Adam Smith and Adam Ferguson, as well as Hume, who in this respect take their cue from Hutcheson. The example par excellence is Smith's Theory of Moral Sentiments (1759; 6th edition 1790), where the Humean ambition of countering the “books of divinity and abstruse metaphysics” (Treatise) was further by a sympathetic attention to how human beings in society actually are, and what social forms and political arrangements will best work to their happiness and well being.

In the 19th century, this strand of Enlightenment thinking ceased to be an important part of the philosophical agenda. That agenda was dominated, rather, by the “science of mind” more narrowly conceived, that is to say logic (i.e., the philosophy of truth and reason) and the philosophy of perception. Consequently, from 1810 onwards, when Thomas Brown (1778-1820) took up the Chair of Moral Philosophy at Edinburgh, the story of Scottish philosophy is that of repeated attempts to resolve the tension that lay within that “science”. It is also a story of remarkable continuity. Brown (1778-1820) was a student of Dugald Stewart (1753-1828), who in turn was a student and friend of Reid and himself held the Chair of Moral Philosophy at both Glasgow and Edinburgh. Stewart was enormously highly thought of in his own day, but in retrospect his contribution to the central debate in Scottish philosophy is limited. Brown died prematurely, but he was a prolific writer from an early age and left behind voluminous lectures. These lectures are critical of Reid (though on certain issues Brown way be said to side with Reid against Hume). On publication they were widely and rapturously received, but fell into almost total neglect by 1840. Perhaps their most enduring effect on the debate arose from the re-interpretation and defence of Reid that they induced on the part of the most prominent philosopher of the period—Sir William Hamilton.

2. Sir William Hamilton (1788-1856)

Sir William Hamilton was a graduate of the Universities of Glasgow and Oxford. At Glasgow he studied logic and moral philosophy under George Jardine and James Mylne both of whom are figures included in James McCosh's The Scottish Philosophy. In 1807 at Balliol College Oxford he held the Snell Exhibition, a scholarship that regularly allowed Scottish students of philosophy to spend time at England's oldest university, and he gained an extensive knowledge of Aristotelianism there. From 1811-21 he worked at the Scottish Bar (not altogether successfully) until being appointed Professor of Universal and Civil History at the University of Edinburgh, where he transferred to the Chair of Logic and Metaphysics in 1836, a post he held until his death in 1856.

At the height of his powers, Hamilton was regarded as a major European intellectual figure, and evidence of his stature lies in the fact that Hamilton was included in the series Philosophical Classics, edited by William Knight, Professor of Moral Philosophy at St Andrews, and thus ranked alongside Descartes, Berkeley, Locke, Kant and Hegel. Such an estimation must now strike us as bizarre, yet there is point in asking why his times regarded him in such a favorable light. The answer is that, thanks to two trips he made to Germany during his years as a lawyer, Hamilton acquired an extensive knowledge of German philosophy, little of which had been translated into English and which he could read in the original language. At the same time, he was not only thoroughly versed in the Scottish tradition of philosophy that he had acquired from Jardine and Mill, but an enthusiastic exponent of Reid, whose collected works he edited and annotated extensively. He was thus perfectly placed to broaden the horizons of Scottish philosophy, to push it beyond the narrower confines of Common Sense by bringing to wider attention the importance of Kant, and yet to do so as one profoundly sympathetic to the native tradition. It is precisely for these reasons, in fact, that he is praised by John Veitch in the Philosophical Classics volume devoted to his philosophy.

Hamilton's writings are extensive but arguably his views can be adequately ascertained from three long essays which appeared in the Edinburgh Review—“The Philosophy of the Unconditioned” (1829), “The Philosophy of Perception” (1830) and “Logic” (1833), subsequently republished in a collection of his writings. In the first of these Hamilton recounts the course philosophy had taken in France after “the philosophy of Descartes and Malebranche had sunk into oblivion”(Hamilton 1853: 2). At first there emerged a highly materialist version of Lockean empiricism “a doctrine so melancholy in its consequences, and founded on principles thus partial and exaggerated, [that it] could not be permanent” (ibid: 3). Rescue came from two sources. The first of these was the Scottish Philosophy of Common Sense which showed that there are mental phenomena that cannot be interpreted as any form of sensation and that “intelligence supposed principles, which, as conditions of its activity, cannot be the results of its operation” (ibid: 3 emphasis original). The other source of renewal was German philosophy after Kant, and in particular the Absolute Idealism that was “founded by Fichte, but evolved by Schelling” (ibid.: 6). “The Philosophy of the Unconditioned” is an examination of the most prominent French philosopher to make use of this second source—Victor Cousin—but this provides an occasion for Hamilton to formulate his own solution to the tension between the philosophy of common sense and the way of ideas.

The question at issue can be expressed in a number of different ways. Kant held that we can only have knowledge of phenomena, never of noumena or things in themselves. Clearly this version of phenomenalism, though in many ways the antithesis of empiricism, has elements in common with the “way of ideas” to which Reid objected, which holds that the mind apprehends the world indirectly, through “impressions”. The alternative position, referred to in the 19th century as “presentationism” is often called “direct realism” and holds, as Reid contends, that we directly apprehend the world of real things. Both positions have their difficulties. Those who followed Kant, notably Fichte and Schelling, sought to escape the “scandal” of unknowable things-in-themselves, and those who followed Reid sought to overcome the contention implicit in his approach that our knowledge of the world is “conditioned” by the principle of common sense. Hence the pursuit of a philosophy of the “unconditioned”.

Hamilton's solution, ultimately, is to combine phenomenalism and presentationism. In “The Philosophy of Perception” he engages in the debate by defending Reid against the criticism brought against him in Thomas Brown's postumously published Lectures, and in a very vigorous manner—“It is always unlucky to stumble on the threshold. The paragraph (Lect. xxvii) in which Dr Brown opens his attack on Reid contains more mistakes than sentences” (ibid. 69). Brown claimed that a close analysis of Reid's writings showed that his position on perception was not really that of direct realism but “hypothetical realism”, that is the belief in an external world that cannot be known directly. It is this contention that Hamilton aims to refute, but it is arguable that he misinterprets Brown. Moreover in his notes to Reid's Collected Works, which were composed rather later, he appears to come round to something very like Brown's interpretation and to hold that Reid was not, strictly speaking, a direct realist after all.

If we construe Reid as holding that in the act of perception there are three elements—the physiological modification of the organ, a mental sensation and the perception of an object—then we can contrast this with Hamilton's position which holds that the mental sensation and the perception are simultaneous and in a sense two sides of the same coin. Reid holds, of course, that we do not reason from sensation to perception; the apprehending mind moves from one to the other by a natural, inbuilt instinct—one of the principles of common sense. Hamilton too holds that there is no reasoning process here, but he also thinks that the continuing division that Reid is employing between sensation and perception is incompatible with the idea of immediate perception or direct realism between. Hence his amendment, which so to speak ties the sensation and perception together. But how is this further contention to be sustained? Is it a conceptual truth of some kind, or an empirical observation about how the mind works? Hamilton's writings in general tend to assertion more than argument, and while he has a great deal to say on this point, it does seem that his “solution” to the problem of perception is a an arbitrary stipulation designed to overcome it. At any rate, if we do press the question of its defence, we quickly encounter a new version of the old division, namely whether the perception is to be identified as a manifestation of self-evident principles of common sense, or as a psychological association of ideas. In this sense Hamilton's thesis is still set within the fundamental parameters of the Hume/Reid debate. It was the next major figure in 19th century Scottish philosophy—Hamilton's student and friend James Frederick Ferrier—who made the most strenuous effort to take a different tack.

3. James Frederick Ferrier (1808-1864)

It is a notable fact that the identification of “Scottish philosophy” with “Common Sense” is not one that the 18th century philosophers themselves made. Indeed, it was only in the 19th century that something called “Scottish philosophy” came to self-consciousness, and only then that books with “Scottish philosophy” in their titles began to appear. The most famous of these was James McCosh's encyclopaedic The Scottish Philosophy (1875), and perhaps the most insightful Scottish Philosophy (1885) by Andrew Seth Pringle Pattison But from the point of view of the century's principle philosophical debate, the most interesting is J.F. Ferrier's Scottish Philosophy, the Old and the New (1854). This is because it was expressly written in defence of the contention that it is possible to engage in something called “Scottish philosophy” while departing radically from the tenets of Reid, Stewart and so on. Ferrier writes with great force and feeling.

It has been asserted, that my philosophy is of Germanic origin and complexion. A broader fabrication than that never dropped from human lips or dribbled from the point of a pen. My philosophy is Scottish to the very core; it is national in every fibre and articulation of its frame. It is a natural growth of old Scotland's soil and has drunk in no nourishment from any other land. Are we to judge the productions of Scotland by merely looking to what Scotland has hitherto produced? May a philosopher not be, heart and soul, a Scotsman—may he not be a Scotsman in all his intellectual movements, even though he should have the misfortune to differ in certain respects, from Dr Reid and Sir William Hamilton (Ferrier 1854: 12)

The explanation of the feeling with which Ferrier writes lies in the fact his little book is a response to the charge levelled against him in the contest for Hamilton's Chair of Logic and Metaphysics at Edinburgh (then still in the gift of the Town Council), when he was accused by the Free Church party of departing from “the Scottish philosophy” in favour of some sort of Hegelianism. This charge was almost certainly motivated by the ecclesiastical rivalries generated by the Disruption in the Church of Scotland that took place in 1843, but it is nonetheless true that Ferrier expressly denounces a certain conception of “Common Sense” philosophy, and one which he identifies closely with Reid. Indeed he is not afraid to repeat his objections in his defence of himself.

Suppose we are discussing the subject of salt, and that we say “salt is white and gritty, it is in some degree moist, it is sometimes put into a salt cellar and placed on the dinner table…”…No man would be considered much of a chemist, who was merely acquainted with these and other such circumstances, concerning salt.…So, in philosophy, no man can be called a philosopher who merely knows and says, that he and other people exist, that there is an external world, that a man is the same to day as he was yesterday, and so forth. These are undoubtedly truths, but I maintain that they are not truths in philosophy, any more than those just mentioned are truths in chemistry. Our old Scottish school, however, is of a different way of thinking. It represents these and similar facts as the first truths of philosophy, and to these it has recourse in handling the deeper questions of metaphysics. I have no objections to this, for those who like it—only my system deals with first truths of a very different order; and it denies that the first truths of the old Scottish school are truths in philosophy at all. This is one very fundamental point of difference between the old and the new Scottish system of metaphysics (ibid. : 7)

It is important to note that Ferrier thinks this castigation of one version of “Common Sense” philosophy is quite compatible with claiming the right to be the inheritor of, though not restricted by, the programme of Reid and Hamilton. And there are indeed several points of contact to be observed. The first is this. Ferrier shares with the school of Reid and Hamilton an almost unspoken assumption that the question of mind and world lies at the heart of philosophy. In this they all differ from the alternative conception of moral philosophy as social inquiry, which as we have already noted, is to be found in Ferguson, parts of Hume, and above all Adam Smith. Second, and more importantly perhaps, Ferrier's own philosophical reflections continue to fit Davies description of Scottish philosophy as a “dialogue between the vulgar and the learned”.

Ferrier's reputation rested upon an earlier series of essays on The Philosophy of Consciousness which appeared in Blackwood's Magazine between 1838 and 1843. In these essays he took his stand on the contention that consciousness implies the impossibility of a naturalistic science of mind, and in a later essay robustly defends a version of Berkeleyan idealism. While Reid thought that Berkeley's philosophical position was one that “no man in his senses could believe”, somewhat surprisingly perhaps, Ferrier describes Berkeley as “the champion of common sense…who could have foiled the prince of skeptics at his own weapons” (Ferrier 1865: 301). “Among all philosophers ancient or modern, we are acquainted with none who presents fewer vulnerable points that Bishop Berkeley. His language it is true, has sometimes the appearance of paradox; but there is nothing paradoxical in his thoughts, and time has proved the adamantine solidity of his principles.” (ibid. p. 291) By Ferrier's account, Berkeley settles the issue of sensation and perception with which Hamilton struggled, by seeing that there is a false abstraction here.

The external world in itself, and the external world in relation to us, was a philosophic distinction which he [Berkeley] refused to recognize. In his creed, the substantive and phenomenal were one. And though he has been accused of sacrificing the substance to the shadow, and though he still continues to be charged, by every philosophical writer, with reducing all things to ideas in the mind, he was guilty of no such absurdity…There does not appear to be much justice in the ordinary allegation, that Berkeley discredited the testimony of the senses, and denied the existence of the material universe. He merely denied the distinction between things and their appearances, and maintained that the thing was the appearance and the appearance was the thing. (ibid. : 302-3 emphasis original)

On this interpretation Berkeley espouses a sort of idealism but

genuine idealism, looking only to the fact, and instructed by the unadulterated dictates of common sense, denies…that we can separate in thought objects and perceptions at all; hence this system has nothing whatever to do either with the preservation or the destruction of the material universe; and hence, too, it is identical…with genuine unperverted realism. (ibid. : 309 emphasis original)

In this way Ferrier, despite his disagreements, actually concurs with Reid's strictures on the kind of philosophical theorizing that tries to deploy Newtonian methods in the way that Hume does. Indeed, Ferrier thinks that “the inert and lifeless character of modern philosophy is ultimately attributable to her having degenerated into a physical science” (ibid.: 191), and he condemns the resulting “picture of man” as “a wretched association machine, through which ideas pass linked only by laws over which the machine has no control” (ibid. : 196). His alternative to this externalist conception of “the science of mind” is a return to the introspective examination of human consciousness. “Consciousness is philosophy nascent; philosophy is consciousness in full bloom and blow. The difference between them is only one of degree, and not one of kind; and thus all conscious men are to a certain extent philosophers, although they may not know it” (ibid. :197) In short, the proper engagement of philosophy is a matter of bringing consciousness to a better understanding of itself, which is at least one interpretation of the ambition of Reid's Inquiry.

Ferrier's philosophy, then, constitutes a further excursion in the common sense tradition, but one that sets itself at some considerable distance from Reid. For Reid, Berkeley is the principal architect of “the way of ideas”, and hence though not himself a skeptic, the purveyor of a philosophy that makes radical skepticism inevitable. In sharp contrast, for Ferrier, Berkeley's philosophy (with some additions of Ferrier's own) is the answer to skepticism. It hardly needs to be said that this was a highly controversial position. Moreover, it throws the whole subject of mind and consciousness back into the realms of metaphysical philosophy and hence seems to abandon the shared methodological assumption that, to quote Reid again, “there is but one way to the knowledge of nature's works; the way of observation and experiment” a supposition he wholeheartedly shared with Hume. This implication—that the methods of the sciences are inapplicable to philosophy—somewhat isolated Ferrier within Scottish philosophy. Though he was regarded with great acclaim in continental Europe, Scottish philosophers moved in different directions, some to an intensification of the experimental method, and some to Absolute Idealism. Of the first group, the most prominent and influential was Alexander Bain.

4. Alexander Bain (1818-1903)

Alexander Bain was Regius Professor of Logic at the University of Aberdeen from 1860 to 1880. A man of remarkable gifts, he was appointed to the Chair largely on the strength of distinguished philosophical work he had published while working as a journalist in London. Dissertations on Leading Philosophical Questions (1903), is a collection of his essays published in retirement, though almost all had originally appeared in the journal Mind, a journal he was instrumental in founding, In several of these essays, Bain takes Reid and Hamilton as his starting point and, broadly, follows the same methods. But he pushes them in a much more strongly empirical direction. The most interesting of his Dissertations, in this connection, is entitled “Associationist Controversies” and at the heart of these controversies we can find a distinction between philosophy and psychology which both reveals the significant difference between Bain and Ferrier, and establishes the discipline of experimental psychology in its own right.

We are, at the moment, in the midst of a conflict of views as to the priority of Metaphysics and Psychology. If indeed the two are closely identified as some suppose, there is no conflict; there is in fact, but one study. If, on the other hand, there are two subjects, each ought to be carried on apart for a certain length, before they can either confirm or weaken each other. I believe that in strictness, a disinterested Psychology should come first in order, and that, after going on a little way in amassing the facts, it should revise its fundamental assumptions…I do not see any mode of attaining a correct Metaphysics until Psychology has at least made some way upon a provisional Metaphysics (Bain 1903: 38)

Bain can be interpreted as a practitioner of the “science of mind” no less than Reid or Hume. But whereas in Reid and Hume the distinction between philosophy and psychology as the modern world understands it, was unclear, it is one of Bain's chief claims to enduring significance that, as this quotation reveals, he brought the distinction between psychological and metaphysical questions to prominence, and in what we would call his research programme he gave priority to the former. The conclusion to be drawn is that Bain, like Ferrier, can be seen to stand in the tradition of Scottish philosophy in the sense that he adopted its methods. But in contrast to Ferrier, he did so in ways that further removed the question of sensation and perception from the realms of traditional metaphysics, and pressed the study of the mind in the direction of empirical psychology.

One notable feature of this development lies in the fact that Bain was one of the principal exponents and defenders of “associationism”, whose origins, arguably, are to be found most clearly in Hume's Treatise. Associationism is the application of empirical observation to the relation between ideas and experiences. What it seeks is observed regularities, in the hope of formulating psychological laws that will enable us to order the contents of mind. Two such principles—Contiguity and Similarity—were widely accepted, and identified by Bain as being employed by Reid and Hamilton. A third—Contrast—was more disputable, and in “Associationist Controversies' Bain is principally concerned with the nature and identifiable independence of principles such as these.

However, for present purposes his arguments are interesting chiefly not so much for their elaboration of associationism, but for the light they throw on the development of Scottish philosophy in the nineteenth century. One point in particular seems to me illuminating. In the dispute between Reid and Hume with respect to the operations of the mind one of the fundamental points of difference is this. Reid is trying, in the main, to establish basic principles of the mind's operation which will vindicate its rationality, and hence avoid the depths of skepticism into which Hume's account forces it. Hume, on the contrary, declares that “reason is nothing but a wonderful and unintelligible instinct in our souls which carries us along a certain train of ideas…[and that this] habit is nothing but one of the principles of nature, and derives all its force from that origin” (Hume 1888 : 179), Reid's purpose is precisely to show that the basic operations of the mind are those of intelligibility. Now in terms of this difference, Bain is of Hume's persuasion. This is revealed not merely in his striking deployment of decidedly Humean terminology when, for instance, he contrasts the perception and the memory of a thing in terms of “vividness” (Bain 1903: 42). It is even more evident when he asserts that “The flow of representations in dreaming and madness offers the best field of observation for the study of associations as such” (ibid: 45).

What this remark reveals is that Bain is interested first in establishing empirical laws with respect to the contents of the human mind. The reason that he thinks dreaming and madness are the best places to start is precisely because he sees that the pursuit of rational principles, that is to say, philosophically coherent principles, is likely to distort our observation by inclining us to see rational connections rather than empirical associations, or as he puts it “associations as such”. In this respect he is employing Hume's rather than Reid's conception of human nature. Certainly he reserves judgement on the final outcome of these investigations with respect to philosophy, arguing only for the priority of psychology over metaphysics and not, as Hume may be said to do, for the elimination of the second by the first. But so far as the science of mind that had been such a marked feature of Scottish philosophy goes, Bain clearsightedly pursues its more empirical ambitions.

For Ferrier the empirical laws of association that Bain seeks are not “truths in philosophy”. No one can be called a philosopher who merely knows and says, that in dreaming or madness this mental representation tends to be associated with that. The philosopher aspires, rather, to make sense of experience, and the whole point about the experience of the dreamer or the madman is that no sense is to be made of it. By contrast, the empirical psychologist, seriously committed to the experimental method, does not, in the end, render consciousness intelligible; he or she simply describes how the mind works.

With Ferrier and Bain, then, the tension within Scottish philosophy that Davie has identified is resolved in radically different ways, the first by a return to metaphysics, the second by an advance to psychology. Both can claim to be inheritors of the Scottish tradition, but both in their different ways may be said to have brought about its demise. With Bain, the nature of the demise is evident; the philosophy of mind is replaced by empirical psychology. With Ferrier, the nature of the demise is rather different. Faced with the prospect of returning to Berkeleyan metaphysics, several prominent Scottish philosophers preferred to look elsewhere, namely to Germany and Hegel. The result was that as the century ended a group of philosophers based chiefly in the Universities of Glasgow and St Andrews and known as the Scottish Idealists came to prominence.

5. The Scottish Idealists

In his illuminating study Scottish Philosophy, importantly subtitled A comparison of the Scottish and German answers to Hume, Andrew Seth Pringle-Pattison remarks:

The thread of national tradition, it is tolerably well known, has been but loosely held of late by many of our best Scottish students of philosophy. It will hardly be denied that the philosophical productions of the younger generation of our University men are more strongly impressed with a German than with a native stamp (Seth Pringle-Pattison 1885:1-2)

Pringle-Pattison does not say who it is he has in mind, but a knowledge of the period makes it relatively easy to surmise. In fact Seth himself (he changed his name to Pringle-Pattison in 1898) is normally identified as one, being joint editor with R B Haldane of Essays in Philosophical Criticism (1883), which came to be regarded as the Scottish Idealists' philosophical manifesto. The reference to “a German stamp”, however, may be somewhat misleading. An interest in, and a knowledge of, Kant can be found to go back to Hamilton, and far from being regarded as a threat to the Scottish tradition was recognized (by Veitch, for instance) as an important part of its enrichment. The German philosophy referred to here, then, is that which emanated from Hegel.

The Secret of Hegel is the title of a very large book by James Hutchison Stirling, first published in 1864. Stirling is credited with bringing Hegel to the attention of British (and not just Scottish) philosophy for the first time, though a wit at the time remarked that if Stirling did know the secret of Hegel, he had kept it to himself! Though Stirling was, in modern terms, a layman (he held no university post) the book was well received, and it is a matter of some consequence that it contained significant criticism of Hamilton. In fact, Stirling subsequently published a short but highly critical volume entitled Sir William Hamilton: being the philosophy of perception. An analysis (1865). With these two books we can chart the diminishing interest in and influence of the Common Sense tradition within Scottish philosophy and the increasing influence of German Idealism and Hegel in particular, culminating in the first complete translation into English of Hegel's Phenomenology of Spirit in 1910 by J.B. Baillie, Regius Professor of Moral Philosophy at the University of Aberdeen.

Of the Scottish Idealists the most prominent and influential was Edward Caird (1835-1908). A graduate of the University of Glasgow, after a period at Oxford he returned in 1866 to become Professor of Moral Philosophy at Glasgow, a post he held for almost 30 years, before returning to Oxford to become Master of Balliol. Caird was an admirer of Kant, who believed nevertheless that Kant had failed to capitalize fully on his own insights, and that the full import of his philosophy could be uncovered with the help of Hegel. The aim of philosophy, on this interpretation, was the ultimate reconciliation of seemingly incompatible elements in human experience—religion and science, freedom and causality, reason and desire, for instance, but above all and at its most abstract, subject and object (or mind and body). The employment of these distinctions is essential to making human experience intelligible, but once they are held to be absolute error and confusion arises. Materialism makes the distinction between mind and body absolute and seeks to explain the former in terms of the latter; Cartesianism works in reverse. Both result in rendering the relation mysterious.

The solution lies in the Hegelian perception that our knowledge is perfected conceived when its objects are conceived as parts of a whole, or Absolute. This way of understanding, however, is not something to be accomplished simply. Human understanding evolves as human experience increases and our knowledge expands. Accordingly, Caird, Pringle-Pattison and the other Scottish Idealists welcomed the growth of natural science, and especially biology, as providing important new material for the further evolutionary development of human understanding as a whole.

Three consequent problems can be said to have occupied them chiefly. The first was to avoid the charge of “mentalism” or “panpsychism”. The Idealist contention that materialism is false leads easily to the counter accusation that the world is made of mental stuff. This charge is often leveled at Berkeley, interest in whom greatly increased among Scottish philosophers at this time (Alexander Campbell Fraser, Professor of Logic and Metaphysics at the University of Edinburgh being the editor of a new collected edition of Berkeley's works). Ferrier, Fraser and Seth all deny that Berkeley's immaterialism amounts to mentalism, but it became common to distinguish between “subjective Idealism” and “Absolute Idealism”, the latter being the doctrine the Scottish Idealists espoused.

Appeal to “The Absolute”, however, brings another danger—a threat to the reality of individual finite minds. There is a risk that the individual subject is reduced to a modification of the one Absolute universal mind. Pringle-Pattison addresses this point in several of his writings, partly because he sees it to be a problem that the other Idealists (notably Caird) failed to avoid.

The third issue is religion. How does “the Absolute” relate to “God”? This was not simply a question internal to Idealist philosophy, but of far wider cultural and intellectual concern, partly because of the threat that Darwinian biology and Biblical “higher” criticism seemed to pose for Christian theism, and partly because of the rise of anthropological inquiry and the new “science of religions”. A special opportunity to address these questions arose with the establishment in 1882 of the Gifford Lectures at the four Scottish Universities. Several series of these important lectures were given by the principal Scottish Idealists, and subsequently published—The Evolution of Religion (1891-2) by Edward Caird (widely regarded as his philosophical masterpiece), Naturalism and Agnosticism (1896-8) by J.S. Ward, and The Idea of God in the light of recent philosophy (1912-13) by A.S. Pringle-Pattison, are three of the most important. All of them deploy the resources of Idealist philosophy to defend a version of theism that is compatible with evolutionary biology. They do so in part by interpreting the concept of “evolution” philosophically so that both thought and religion are understood to evolve, no less than biological organism.

Did Scottish Idealism constitute a revitalization and continuation of the Scottish philosophical tradition, or its demise? Ferrier was ferocious in his criticism of Reid, though adamant about the Scottishness of his philosophical endeavours. Caird expressly identifies what he sees to be a crucial defect in the appeal to “Principles of Common Sense”, and has been generally been regarded as a something of a fifth columnist as far as Scottish philosophy was concerned. George Davie describes him as “a very untypical Scotsman and one quite exceptionally apathetic to educational customs of the country” (Davie 1961: 86). However, this remark reflects the fact that over the course of the nineteenth century Scottish philosophers were concerned not only with philosophical debates of the kind reviewed here, but with the place of philosophy in the university curriculum. As a result, from Hamilton onwards, several of them wrote essays on educational reform and gave evidence to the many commissions of inquiry into the universities that were held. Caird's indifference to the national tradition of philosophical education, if that is what it was, was simply the other side of his desire to bring Scottish philosophers into the wider context of contemporary European philosophy which was, of course, dominated by German Idealism. That he was neither alone nor unsuccessful in this ambition is evidenced by the fact that he inspired and recruited so many other subsequently distinguished figures. Ferrier and Pringle-Pattison were Idealists independently of Caird, but Sir Henry Jones, who also came to occupy the Chair of Moral Philosophy at Glasgow, and J.H. Muirhead, founder of the enduring Muirhead Library of Philosophy, a long series of major philosophical works published in London, were students of Caird.

The continuity or otherwise of Scottish Idealism with Reid and Common Sense, however,is less important to philosophy in Scotland than the fate of Idealism. In 1903, the Cambridge philosopher G.E. Moore published an essay entitled “The Refutation of Idealism”. It is arguable that Moore did not understand what he was aiming to refute, but his essay began a return to ascendancy by the British empiricist tradition that spelt the end of British Idealism. For over fifty years, both Reid and Hegel disappeared from the curriculum and conscientiousness of philosophers in Scotland.


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Hume, David | Reid, Thomas | Scottish Philosophy: in the 18th Century