Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Phenomenological Approaches to Self-Consciousness

1. We will use the terms ‘self-awareness’ and ‘self-consciousness’ interchangeably.

2. For some recent interesting new attempts at articulating the differences and similarities between the standard higher-order accounts, Brentano's two-object account, and the non-objectifying approach of the phenomenologists, cf. Kriegel and Williford (2006), and Kriegel (2006).

3. Drawing on Gibson's ecological approach, and the notion that the very flow pattern of optical information provides us with an awareness of our own movement and posture and that all perception consequently involves a kind of self-sensitivity, a co-awareness of self and of environment (Gibson 1966, 111-126), Bermúdez (1998, 128) writes: “If the pick-up of self-specifying information starts at the very beginning of life, then there ceases to be so much of a problem about how entry into the first-person perspective is achieved. In a very important sense, infants are born into the first-person perspective. It is not something that they have to acquire ab initio.” See Gallagher and Meltzoff (1996) for the connection between the developmental research and phenomenological conceptions of self-consciousness. For a more extensive discussion of the similarities between the non-conceptual self-awareness and the phenomenological view, see Zahavi (2002).

4. Husserl's analysis is not inconsistent with the concepts of ecological perception and sensory-motor "affordances" as they are later worked out in Gibsonian psychology. My actual and potential bodily movements specify the possible uses for things that I encounter in the world. This kind of analysis is further developed in Merleau-Ponty's phenomenology of perception and embodiment. This view on perception also shares some obvious similarities with the recent so-called enactive approach to perception. Compare Husserl's views with the following programmatic statement by Alva Noë in the beginning of his book Action in Perception: "Perception is not something that happens to us, or in us. It is something we do. Think of a blind person tap-tapping his or her way around a cluttered space, perceiving that space by touch, not all at once, but through time, by skilful probing and movement. This is, or at least ought to be, our paradigm of what perceiving is. The world makes itself available to the perceiver through physical movement and interaction. … [A]ll perception is touch-like in this way: Perceptual experience acquires content thanks to our possession of bodily skills. What we perceive is determined by what we do (or what we know how to do); it is determined by what we are ready to do. In ways I try to make precise, we enact our perceptual experience; we act it out" (Noë 2004, 1).