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Medieval Semiotics

First published Fri Dec 19, 2003

This entry intends to give an account of the most important stages of the medieval history of semiotics by providing a general chronological survey of the main sources and theoretical developments of the medieval notion of sign.

1. Semiotics: its place in the framework of scholastic disciplines

To speak of medieval semiotics is not to speak of a precisely defined discipline besides, and distinct from, other medieval arts and sciences; it is rather to speak of a complex field of more or less — mostly more — elaborate reflections on the concept of sign, its nature, function, and classification. In order to understand the enormous extent to which such theories grew during the Middle Ages some basic formal features of the scholastic organization of knowledge has to be kept in mind. First, scholastic learning is essentially a commentary tradition. Most of the writings either are explicit commentaries on what at a time were taken to be canonical texts (as e.g., the works of Aristotle, the Sentences of Peter Lombard, the Grammar of Priscian, or the Summulae Logicales of Peter of Spain or Buridan) or are at least composed with constant reference to the topics treated there. A second point, closely related to the first, is the common scholastic practice of putting great effort into the conceptual analysis of the basic terms and notions. Thus, wherever terms like ‘sign’ (signum) or ‘representation’ (repraesentatio) appeared in the texts commented on, scholastic authors felt obliged either to give an explicit account of these concepts or at least to be able to refer to a place where this has been done. In view of this, the fact that Aristotle in his On Interpretation had incidentally called the word a ‘sign’ (semeion, symbol) of the mental concept or that Augustine had termed the sacrament a ‘sacred sign’ (signum sacrum) became most important for the later development of semiotics. For in both cases the outcome was a large number of detailed explorations of the nature and divisions of sign. Both points combined resulted in a general tendency towards an increasing complexity and refinement of the scholastic discourse. For it is part of the intrinsic logic of any commentary tradition — a close parallel can be found in the Indian tradition of logic and semiotics that we do not discuss here — that all later commentaries, which in many cases are actually meta-commentaries, have to compete with the previous ones and to surpass them in elaboration by taking up, evaluating, or commenting on their arguments and terminological distinctions.

There are various areas within the scholastic system of arts and sciences where a rich tradition of semiotic questions and answers accumulated over the centuries (Maierù 1981; Meier-Oeser 1997, 42-170; Fuchs 1999). Most important are those places located in the realm of the so-called trivium (i.e., grammar, rhetoric and logic), especially in logic where already the determination of its primary subject as well as the discussion of the basic logical notions (like ‘term’ or ‘signification’) gave rise to explicit remarks on the concept of sign. The most relevant loci classici of logical contributions to a general theory of sign and signification are: the comments on Aristotle's introductory chapter of On Interpretation (esp. 1. 16a3-8), “the common starting point for virtually all medieval theories of semantics” (Magee 1989, 8), as well as the commentaries (especially from the 15th and early 16th century) on the first tract of the so-called Summulae Logicales of Peter of Spain, and all texts or parts of logical textbooks that are related to one of the aforementioned passages. Further considerations with relevance to semiotics within the sphere of logic are to be found, though less frequently, in the commentaries on the final chapter of the Prior Analytics (2, 27 70a-b) where Aristotle had outlined his doctrine of inference from signs.[1] Still within the sphere of trivium, various efforts to develop grammar into a regular science matching the Aristotelian standards led, during the second half of 13th century, to approaches to language either starting from the general concept of sign (Bacon, Ps.-Kilwardby) or taking grammar as a theory reflecting on the fundamental structure of sign systems (grammatica speculativa).

A rich source of semiotic material is also to be found in the theologico-philosophical tradition. The loci classici of semiotic discussions in the Commentaries on the Book of Sentences (Liber Sententiarum) of Peter Lombard, the basic scholastic textbook in theology, are particularly the comments on book 1, distinction 1: the sign as subject and means of all instruction; bk. 1, dist. 3: the differences between images and traces and their respective epistemic value; bk. 1, dist. 27: mental concepts, spoken words and their signification; bk. 2, dist. 10: the communication of angels;[2] and, last but not least, bk. 4, dist. 1: the sacramental sign and the sign in general.[3] Outside the philosophical and theological discourse, the notion of sign traditionally played an important role in the theory and practice of medical diagnostics (Maierù 1981: 64ff).

2. The late ancient sources of medieval semiotics

The core set of ideas and doctrines from which medieval philosophers developed their semiotic theories was provided to them mainly by two late ancient authors. Besides Boethius (480-528), who transmitted Aristotelian semantics to the Latin Middle Ages, Augustine's (354-430) doctrine of sign is the most important junction of ancient and medieval theories of sign and signification. Augustine's doctrine also has to be seen as a decisive turning point in the history of semiotics.

2.1 Augustine (354-430)

Augustine's assertions and remarks, even though they do not offer a completely uniform concept of sign, were fundamental to the development of medieval semiotic, and they constituted the only elaborate theory of signs until the 13th century (apart from the original theory of Peter Abelard). In his incomplete early work, De Dialectica, Augustine massively draws on the terminology of the Stoic philosophy of language, though in many points fundamentally modifying its sense.[4] It is especially in the concept of sign where his difference from Stoic doctrines becomes apparent. For according to the most refined theory of Stoic logicians, a sign in the proper technical sense (semeion) was seen as the abstract propositional content of a sentence insofar it is functioning as the antecedent in a true implication by means of which a hitherto unknown truth is revealed. By contrast, Augustine is favoring a reifying concept of sign. A sign, as he defines it in line with the descriptions given by Cicero and the Latin tradition of rhetoric,[5] is “something that shows itself to the senses and something other than itself to the mind” (Signum est quod se ipsum sensui et praeter se aliquid animo ostendit) (Augustine De dial. 1975, 86). The concept of sign, thus defined in terms of a triadic relation (a sign is always a sign of something to some mind), provides the general basis for Augustine's theory of language: “To speak is to give a sign in articulate voice” (Loqui est articulata voce signum dare) (Augustine De dial. 1975, 86). Speech, in further contrast to Stoic semantics, is essentially characterized by its communicative function. A word, by definition, is a “sign of something, which can be understood by the hearer when pronounced by the speaker” (uniuscuiusque rei signum, quod ab audiente possit intelligi, a loquente prolatum) (Augustine De dial. 1975, 86). The communicative function[6] is thus essential to the linguistic sign: “There is no reason for signifying, i.e., for giving signs except to convey into another's mind what the sign-giver has in his own mind” (Nec ulla causa est nobis significandi, id est signi dandi, nisi ad … traiciendum in alterius animum id quod animo gerit qui signum dat) (Augustine De doctr. chr. II 3, 1963, 34: 17-20). In his dialogue De Magistro (On the Teacher), however, written shortly after De Dialectica, Augustine denies that words or signs have the power of ‘showing’ anything in the sense of making something present to the understanding (Non … mihi rem, quam significat, ostendit verbum…) (Augustine De magistro X 32, 1974, 191). For this reason, still influenced by the tenets of the skeptical tradition at that time,[7] Augustine was limiting the capacity of the sign to its admonitory or commemorative function (Augustine De magistro XI 36, 1974, 194).

But in De Doctrina Christiana, after abandoning the skeptical position, Augustine redefines the sign accordingly, claiming that “a sign is something which, offering itself to the senses, conveys something other to the intellect (Signum … est res praeter speciem quam ingerit sensibus, aliud aliquid ex se faciens in cogitationem venire) (Augustine De doctr. chr. II 1, 1963, 33). In contrast to his former view, he is now attributing a fundamental epistemic function to the sign, claiming that “all instruction is either about things or about signs; but things are learnt by means of signs” (Omnis doctrina vel rerum est vel signorum, sed res per signa discuntur) (Augustine De doctr. chr. I 1, 1963, 9). The borderline between things and signs and thus the sign itself is defined functionally rather than ontologically: signs are things employed to signify something (res … quae ad significandum aliquid adhibentur) (Augustine De doctr. chr. I 1, 1963, 9). Augustine divides the sign into the two main classes of natural signs (signa naturalia) and given signs (signa data). “Natural signs are those which, apart from any intention or desire of using them as signs, do yet lead to the knowledge of something else”,[8] as, for example, smoke when it indicates fire, the footprint of an animal passing by, or the countenance of an angry or sorrowful man. “Conventional signs, on the other hand, are those which living beings mutually exchange in order to show, as well as they can, the feelings of their minds, or their perceptions, or their thoughts.”[9] Whether and to what extent such an “intention to signify” (voluntas significandi) can be assumed in cases of animal sign communication Augustine leaves open.[10]

The signs used in human communication are further subdivided with regard to the senses to which they address themselves: “some relate to the sense of sight, some to that of hearing, a very few to the other senses”. The preeminent role among all sorts of “given signs”, that Augustine is claiming for the words, does not result from their quantitative preponderance but rather from the fact that, as he points out, everything that is indicated by nonverbal signs can be put into words but not vice versa (Augustine De doctr. chr. II 7, 1963, 35). ‘Word’ (verbum) in its proper sense means — at least for the early Augustine — ‘spoken word’. Writing (litterae), introduced by man in order to impart permanency to spoken language, is just a secondary system of signs, consisting of “signs of words” (signa verborum) rather than of words itself (Augustine, De doctr. chr. II 8, (Ibid.); De dial. 1975, 86f.).

In close analogy to this devaluation of the written word against the spoken one, Augustine in his later theory of verbum mentis (mental word) is advocating the devaluation of the spoken word and the external sign in general against the internal sphere of mental cognition. It is now the mental or interior word (verbum interius), i.e., the mental concept, that is considered as word in its most proper sense, whereas the spoken word appears as a mere sign or voice of the word (signum verbi, vox verbi) (Augustine, De Trinitate XV 11 20, 1968, 486f.).[11] Thoughts (cogitationes) are performed in mental words. The verbum mentis, corresponding to what later was called the conceptus mentis or intellectus, is by no means a ‘linguistic’ entity in the proper sense, for it is “nullius linguae”, i.e., it does not belong to any particular spoken language like Latin or Greek. So we are confronted with the paradoxical situation that linguistic terminology (e.g., verbum, locutio, oratio, dicere, etc.) is used to describe a phenomenon whose independence from any language is strongly emphasized at the same time.

Despite all the internal ruptures and inconsistencies, Augustine's doctrine of sign is based on a definition of the sign that, for the first time, intends to embrace both the natural indexical sign and the conventional linguistic sign as species of an all-embracing generic notion of sign, thus marking a turning point in the history of semiotics.

2.2 Boethius (480-528)

Even though Boethius, in line with the Aristotelian writings he commented on, focuses on the concept of linguistic signification and hardly ever explicitly speaks of signs (notae) in general (Magee 1989, 61ff.), he is, besides Augustine, the main source for medieval theories of signs. This is explained by the fact that, due to Augustine's influence, the semantics of linguistic signs became the focus of semiotic theory, and that Boethius with his translations of and comments on parts of the Aristotelian Organon (especially Peri Hermeneias) is the most important, and for a long time the only available, source for medieval acquaintance with the semantics of Aristotle and his Neoplatonic commentators of late antiquity. Thus, the medieval philosophers viewed Aristotle's logic at first through the eyes of Boethius, who has made some influential decisions concerning semantic terminology (Engels 1963), as well as the interpretation of the Aristotelian text. What they learned through his writings were inter alia the insight into the conventional character of language, the view that meaning is established by an act of ‘imposition’, i.e., name-giving or reference-setting, and the influential idea that to signify (significare) is to “establish an understanding” (intellectum constituere).

Especially in his more elaborate second commentary on Peri Hermeneias, Boethius discusses at length the interrelations between the four elements of linguistic semeiosis mentioned by Aristotle, i.e., between external objects or things (res), mental concepts or representations (passiones, intellectus), spoken words (voces), and written words (scripta). These elements are arranged so that they build up what Boethius calls the “order of speaking” (ordo orandi) (Magee 1989, 64-92) which is characterized by the fact that among the elements mentioned the former in each case ontologically precedes the latter. Thus, without the existence of things there would be no concepts, without concepts no spoken words, and without spoken words no written ones. This, however, is not reversible in that sense that the use of written characters in any case demands the knowledge of the vocal expressions denoted by them, that there is always a concept behind a spoken word, and that every concept refers to a real thing as its object (Boethius In Periherm. ed. sec., 1880: 21, 28-30). In any case, the ordo orandi determines the direction of linguistic signification: written characters signify spoken words, whereas spoken words primarily signify mental concepts and, by means of the latter, secondaryly denote the things. Thus, scriptura left aside, the remaining three elements are structurally organized along the lines of the prominent ‘semiotic triangle’ according to which signs refer to things by means of concepts (Boethius In Periherm. ed. sec., 1880: 24, 33). In his further discussion of the ordo orandi Boethius divides, with reference to Porphyrius and the Aristotelians (peripatetici), three levels of speech: besides — or rather at the fundament of — written and spoken discourse there is a mental speech (oratio mentis) in which thinking is performed.[12] It is, just like the Augustinian mental word, not made up from words of any national languages but rather from transidiomatic or even non-linguistic mental concepts which are, as Aristotle has claimed, the same for all men.

3. Semiotic beginnings in the 11th and 12th century

In the late 11th century Anselm of Canterbury (1033-1109) revived the Augustinian doctrine of the verbum mentis, combining it with the Aristotelian view on mental concepts outlined in the opening chapter of Peri Hermeneias. Thus, the two aspects of the mental word — which are found more or less implicitly in Augustine's work already — became explicit in Anselm. First: mental words are natural words and thus identical for all human beings (they are “verba … naturalia … et apud omnes gentes eadem”) (Anselm of Canterbury, Monolog., 1968: 25); and second: they are similitudes and mental images of things (similitudines et imagines rerum).[13] Due to this, they signify their objects in a more expressive way (expressius signant) than any other kind of words, and thus they are, as Anselm agrees with Augustine, what has to be termed ‘word’ in its most proper sense (Anselm of Canterbury, Monolog., 1968: 25).

A constitutive factor of the emergence of a medieval theory of signs within the context of grammar and logic is the resumption of Augustine's practice of embedding the concept of language into the generic notion of sign. Already Peter Abelard (1079-1142), in many respects the most important author of the 12th century, points out, that the phenomenon of linguistic signification (significatio vocum), falling into the sphere of competence of logic, does not cover the whole range of sign processes (Abelard: De dial., 1956: 111). For things in the broadest sense may function as signs, too, if they are connected to each other in such a way that the perception of one leads to the cognition of the other. This can be the case when the one thing is an image of the other, when things are either arbitrarily imposed to exercise the function of signifying (significandi officium), as for instance the famous circulus vini, a wreath of foliage, attached outside the tavern, indicating that wine is sold inside, or the conventional gestures of monastic sign languages,[14] or when two things, by being repeatedly noticed in conjunction, are customarily (secundum consuetudinem) associated with each other, or, finally, when they bear some sort of relationship to each other (secundum aliquam earum ad se habitudinem).[15]

Abelard apparently is well aware of the fact that the concept of sign that results from taking into account all these cases as instances of signification is not only general but also unspecific. In order to be able to single out cases of “properly signifying” (proprie significare) from such a ‘pansemiotic’ setting, he introduces a distinction, distinguishing between signs that simply signify (signa significantia) and signs that are, as significative signs (signa significativa), i.e., as bearers of meaning, involved in processes of intended sign-giving (Abelard De dial., 1956: 111; Log. ‘Ingredientibus’, 1927: 336ff).

4. The genesis of an elaborate theory of signs in the second half of 13th century

The genesis of an elaborate theory of signs in the second half of the 13th century is the result of a complex interplay of Aristotelian and Augustinian influences. Since the mid-13th century Augustinian views, until then effective mainly in theological discussions, begin to invade the faculties of arts. Due to this, the sign is increasingly taken as the basic concept of the ‘linguistic science’ (scientia sermocinalis):[16] “Speech is nothing but a sign” (Sermo totaliter signum est), Robert Kilwardby asserts (Kilwardby De ortu scientiarum, 1976, 160). Roger Bacon praises the sign even as the principal instrument of all Liberal Arts.[17] It is true, the consciousness of words being signs is nothing new. From this point onward, however, it gives rise, at first in the framework of grammar theory, to semiotic reflections that go beyond what is known from earlier centuries.

4.1 Ps.-Robert Kilwardby

The unknown author, now commonly named Ps.-Robert Kilwardby, opens his commentary on Priscianus maior (written somewhere between 1250 and 1280)[18] by modifying Augustine's prominent dictum that “all instruction is either about things or about signs” into the stronger and more ‘semiotic-minded’ thesis that “every science is about signs or things signified” (scientia omnis aut est de signis aut de rebus significatis) (Ps.-Robert Kilwardby: Comment. on “Prisc. Maior”, 1975, 1). This statement he takes as starting point of a detailed discussion of the questions of whether there can be a (special) science of signs[19] and, if so, what its relationship towards the sciences dealing with things would be like.[20] Ps.-Kilwardby points out that there are several ‘sciences of signs’ (diversae sunt scientiae de signis) according to the various kinds of signs (Ps.-Robert Kilwardby: Comment. on “Prisc. Maior”, 1975, 3). Since, however, any discipline, in order to meet the Aristotelian standard of science as it began to be accepted at that time, must have a general subject matter, the scientia de signis necessarily contemplates the sign “in terms of a universal notion abstracted from the particular signs” (sub ratione universalis abstracti a particularibus signis) (Ps.-Robert Kilwardby: Comment. on “Prisc. Maior”, 1975, 4). In case of natural signs (signa naturalia) as well as “moral signs” (signa moralia), as e.g., actions in relation to the good or bad will, the theory of signs cannot be separated from the theory of things signified; therefore, these signs fall under natural and moral science, respectively (Ps.-Robert Kilwardby: Comment. on “Prisc. Maior”, 1975, 6). The linguistic signs, however, produced by the human understanding for the purpose of communicating its ideas, are the subject-matter of a rational science (scientia rationalis), the science of signs.

4.2 Roger Bacon (ca. 1214-ca. 1293)

Roger Bacon is probably the most important medieval theorist of sign — at least he is the author of the most extensive medieval tract on signs known so far.[21] Starting from a minute analysis of the notion of sign and its various divisions, Bacon develops both in De signis (ca. 1267) and in his Compendium studii theologiae (1292) a general conception of signification as well as a detailed theory of the linguistic sign, so that here, as in Augustine, semantics is integrated into a broader theory of sign in general. According to Bacon, the concept of sign belongs to the category of relation. To be more precise, a sign, as it was pointed out already in Augustine's definition, is a triadic relation, such that it is — in principle — a sign of something to someone. This way of putting the point, however, gives rise to the question of whether both relata of this relation are equally essential for its existence. What would happen if one of these relata did not exist? What if the designated thing ceased to exist? And what if there were no cognitive power taking notice or even being able to take notice of the sign?

Bonaventura (ca. 1217-1274), one of the most renowned theologians of the time, explicitly places emphasis on the sign's relation to the significate, claiming that

… a sign has a twofold comparison: both to that which it signifies, and to that to which it signifies; and the first is essential and the sign always has it in act, but the second it has in habit; and it is from the first that it is called a sign, not from the second. Whence a circle above a tavern is always a sign, even if no one looks at it.[22]

In direct opposition to this commonly accepted manner of presentation, Bacon lay stress on the ‘pragmatic’ relation to the sign-interpreter, for the notion of sign is, as he claims, “essentially predicated with respect to someone to whom it signifies. … For if no one could conceive something through the sign, it would be void and vain, nay, it wouldn't be a sign.” (Roger Bacon, De signis, 1978, 81). Other than the essential relation of an actual sign to its interpreter, which must be in any a case what was called a ‘real relation’ (relatio realis), the relation to the significate can be a so-called a ‘relation of reason’ (relatio rationis), for, as Bacon adds: “It does not follow ‘a sign is in act, therefore the thing signified exists’, because nonentities can be signified by words just like entities” (Roger Bacon, De signis, 1978, 81). There are other important points in which Bacon deviates from the common opinion: He defines the sign as “that which upon being offered to the sense or intellect designates something to the intellect itself” (illud quod oblatum sensui vel intellectui aliquid designat ipsi intellectui), and emphasizes that, contrary to what the common description says, there are signs which are offered only to the intellect.[23]

Bacon presents a detailed classification of signs[24] by taking up, combining, and modifying elements of several prior sign typologies. The division of the two main classes of natural and given signs is taken from Augustine, the distinction between necessary and probable signs is borrowed from Aristotle (an. pr. II, 27, 70a3-b5), and their subdivision according to their temporal reference is a traditional element in the theories of the sacramental sign.[25]

The general class of natural signs signifying unintentionally by their essence (1) is divided according to the relation between a sign and its significate into the three subclasses of (1.1) inferential signs based on a more or less constant concomitance of sign and significate, (1.2) iconic signs, based on similarity in appearance, and (1.3) signs based on a causal relation between the sign and the signified thing. The signs of inference (illatio) are subdivided into (1.1.1) necessary and (1.1.2) probable signs, both of which are further differentiated according to the three possible directions of temporal reference (present, past, future). Bacon gives to understand that he takes inferential and iconic signs to be signs more properly than the members of third class, i.e., signs based on a causal relation (later in the Compendium studii theologiae he will drop this class entirely). He justifies this by pointing to the fundamental difference between sign relations and causal relation: whereas sign relations are necessarily constituted by an interpreter, causal relations exist independently of any such one alone by reason of the order of nature.[26]

The general class of signs given and directed by a soul (signa ordinata ab anima) (2) is divided according to whether the living being brings forth the sign (2.1) together with a deliberation by reason and choice of will (cum deliberatione rationis et electione voluntatis), or (2.2) by a natural instinct or impulse (instictu naturali et impetu naturae). The reason for distinguishing two modes of natural signifying, as they appear in (1) and (2.1), is, on the one hand, an equivocation of the concept of nature, meaning “substance or essence of something” (substantia sive essentia cuiuslibet), as well as “force acting without deliberation” (virtus agens sine deliberatione) (De signis, 1978, 85f.) and, on the other hand, the insight that, contrary to what holds for the natural signs in the first sense, in the case of the latter there is always a sign-giver, not only someone taking something as a sign. Interjections (2.3) are considered as a hybrid of the two other sorts of given signs.

It has to be noticed that in Bacon's, as well as in any other medieval sign-typology, the classes of signs — even though this is not explicitly stated by the authors themselves — distinguish modes of signifying rather than signs in the sense of sign-vehicles. Therefore, one and the same thing, fact, or event may, in different respects, fall under various and even opposite sign-classes. This fact is especially important for the full account of sign-processes in which spoken language is involved.

The primary intention of Bacon's semiotic analyses is, as it was already with Augustine, to provide the foundations for the semantics of spoken language.[27] According to Bacon, an adequate and complete account of the “difficult issue” (difficilis dubitatio) of what the significate of a vocal expression is has to consider three different aspects: 1) the signification of vocal expressions apart from impositio, i.e., apart from their being endowed with (conventional) meaning by ‘imposition’, 2) their signification according to imposition, and 3) their signification over and above imposition.

1) Each vocal expression may serve independently from its imposition as a natural sign (De signis, 1978, 86f.) Words indicate for instance the speaker being close, and they may ‘tell’ something about him in the same way as an artwork is indicating the skills of the artist. Furthermore, the spoken word is a natural sign implying that the speaker possesses the concept of the object meant by the word according to its regular meaning. For the significative use of language presupposes the presence of a concept in the speaker's mind that corresponds to the object denoted (De signis, 1978, 85f., Comp. studii theol., 1988, 64). Thus, the relation between the vocal expression and the mental concept is, contrary to what was the common opinion since the days of Augustine and Boethius, not a relation of expression but rather of indexical signification.

2) In his account of signification of words regarding their ‘impositio’ Bacon accentuates the arbitrariness of meaning.[28] But even though the first ‘impositor’ (name-giver) is free to impose a word or sign on anything whatsoever, he does perform the act of imposition according to the paradigm of baptism: “all names which we impose on things we impose inasmuch as they are present to us, as in the case of names of people in Baptism”.[29] Contrary to the venerable tradition of Aristotelian, Boethian or Porphyrian Semantics,[30] holding that spoken words, at least immediately, signify mental concepts, Bacon favors the view that words, according to their imposition, immediately and properly signify the things themselves. With this account of linguistic signification Bacon abandons the model of the semantic triangle[31] and marks an important turning point on the way from the traditional intensionalist semantics to the extensionalist reference semantics as it became increasingly accepted in the 14th century.[32]

Bacon is, however, well aware of the fact that the use of names and words in general is not restricted to the meaning endowed through the first act of imposition (the term ‘homo’ does not only denote those men that have been present when the original act of its imposition took place); nor do words cease to be used when their original significata (things signified) no longer physically exist (Bacon, De signis, 1978, 128). Bacon intends to solve the resulting difficulties (which every causal theory of meaning based on the concepts of ‘reference setting’ and ‘reference borrowing’ has to face) by distinguishing two modes of imposition. This can be seen as his most inventive contribution to semantics.[33] Besides the ‘formal’ mode of imposition conducted by a ‘perlocutionary’ vocal expression like “I call this …” (modus imponendi sub forma impositionis vocaliter expressa) there is another kind taking place tacitly (sine forma imponendi vocaliter expressa) whenever a term is applied (transumitur) to any object other than the first name-giver has ‘baptized’ (Bacon, De signis, 1978, 130). Whereas the formal mode of imposition refers either to the mythical situation of a first invention of language or to the act of explicitly coining a new word, the second kind of imposition describes what actually happens during the everyday use of language. This modification of the meaning of words is constantly taking place without the speaker or anyone else being actually aware of it. For just by using language we “all day long impose names without being conscious of when and how” (nos tota die imponimus nomina et non advertimus quando et quomodo) (Bacon, De signis, 1978, 100, 130f.)

3) Even if impositio in the described sense is of pivotal importance for the constitution of linguistic meaning, the signification of words is by no means limited to it: “a vocal expression signifies many things for which it is not imposed, as it signifies all those things that bear an essential relation to the thing for which the word is imposed.”[34] In this way, Bacon claims, words signify, as it were, infinitely many things.[35]

5. Grammatica Speculativa and its critics

The idea, fundamental both for Bacon and Ps.-Kilwardby, that grammar is a regular science rather than a propaedeutic art, is shared by the school of the so-called “modist grammarians” (modistae) emerging around 1270 in the Faculty of Arts of the University of Paris and culminating in the Grammatica Speculativa of Thomas of Erfurt around 1300. The members of this school, taking it for granted that the objective of any regular science was to explain the facts by giving reasons for them rather than to simply describe them, make it their business to deduce the grammatical features common to all languages from universal modes of being by means of corresponding modes of understanding. Thus the tradition of speculative grammar (grammatica speculativa) develops the commonly accepted Aristotelian claim (De Interpretatione 1.16a3-9) that the mental concepts, just as the things, are the same for all men (eadem apud omnes) further to the thesis of a universal grammar based on the structural analogy between the “modes of being” (modi essendi), the “modes of understanding” (modi intelligendi), and the “modes of signifying” (modi significandi) that are the same for all languages. Along this line, Boethius Dacus (Boethius the Dane), one of the most important theoreticians of speculative grammar,[36] states that

… all national languages are grammatically identical. The reason for this is that the whole grammar is borrowed from the things … and just as the natures of things are similar for those who speak different languages, so are the modes of being and the modes of understanding; and consequently the modes of signifying are similar, whence, so are the modes of grammatical construction or speech. And therefore the whole grammar which is in one language is similar to the one which is in another language.[37]

Even though the words are arbitrarily imposed (whence arise the differences between all languages), the modes of signifying are uniformly related to the modes of being by means of the modes of understanding (whence arise the grammatical similarities among all languages). Focusing on the terms of ‘sign’ and ‘signification’, speculative grammar, as a science of general cognitive-linguistic structures, prescinds from all the different national languages — and even from vocal language as such. For it is, as Martinus Dacus points out, not essential for speculative grammar to deal with vocal expressions or with structures of vocal sign systems, because any kind of signs could be the object of the considerations of a modist grammarian. The fact that he is concerned with linguistic signs rather than with gestures or the “language of eyes” is only due to the fact that vocal expressions are, compared to other kind of signs, more apt for human communication.[38]

Soon after 1300 the modistic approach came under substantial criticism. The main point that critics like Ockham oppose is not the assumption of a basic universal grammar, for such a claim is implied in Ockham's concept of mental grammar, too. Two other aspects of modism are in the focus of these criticisms: (1) the assertion of a close structural analogy between spoken or mental language and external reality (consimilis distinctio inter voces vel intentiones in anima significantes et inter ipsa significata) (William of Ockham, Expos. in lIbid. Porphyrii de praed., 1978, 158); (2) the inadmissible reification of the modus significandi adherent to its description as some quality or form added to the articulate voice (dictioni superadditum) through the act of imposition. To say that vocal expressions ‘have’ different modes of signifying is, as Ockham points out, just a metaphorical manner of speaking; for what is meant is simply the fact that different words signify whatever they signify in different ways.[39] According to John Aurifaber (fl. ca. 1300), a vocal term is significative, or is a sign, solely by being used significatively, not on grounds of something inherent in the sound.[40] In order to assign signification a proper place in reality, it must be ascribed to the intellect rather than to the vocal sound (significare est accidens intellectus; sed vox est illud quo significat intellectus) (Aurifaber, Determ. de modis signif., 1967, 226). The criticism of modist grammar is based on a fundamental redefinition of the concept of sign, coming about after the mid-13th century. For the translocation of signification in the proper sense from the word to the intellect is based on the presupposition that, whatever Augustine may have said, mental concepts are signs themselves.

6. Mental concepts as signs

In 12th- and early 13th-century logical textbooks the concept of sign does not play an important role yet. ‘Sign’ in its technical sense is taken as the name of the so-called syncategorematic terms (e.g., omnis [every], nullus [no] as signa universalia or universal signs, quidam [a certain], aliquis [some] as signa particularia or particular signs) (L. M. de Rijk, 1965-67, II/2.383).[41] In line with the text of Aristotle's Peri Hermeneias and its translation by Boethius, only written and spoken words were said to signify. Mental concepts (passiones animae, intellectus, conceptus) were seen as likenesses (similitudines) rather than as signs of things. Once again, it is the mid-13th century where a conceptual change is taking place which, although at first it may seem to be a matter of nuance, turns out to be one of the most important junctures in the history of semiotics: mental concepts — without at first losing their status of being likenesses of things — begin to be characterized as signs of things (signa rerum). It is true that there are some few passages in Boethius, Anselm, and Abelard already pointing in this direction (Boethius, In Periherm. ed. sec., 1880, 24; cf. Magee, 1989, 71; Anselm of Canterbury, Monolog., 1968, 25; Abelard, Log. ‘Ingredientibus’, 1927, 315f.). But it is not until the second half of 13th century that this idea achieves general acceptance and gains relevance to the theory of sign.[42]

The consequences of this view are many: for instance, the rejection, or at least the modification, of Augustine's venerable definition of the sign, and the new possibility to describe the relationship between the concept and its object without referring to the notion of similitude. Furthermore, in the semantic triangle, the Boethian ordo orandi now can be described entirely in terms of sign and significate.[43] Insofar as concepts agree with vocal expressions in their function of being signs, it makes sense to conceive of thought processes as a kind of mental speech (oratio mentalis) showing close analogies to spoken discourse. This again paves the way for the development of a mentalist logic, the principal objects of which are not the vocal terms and propositions any longer, but rather the corresponding mental acts. The definition of mental concepts as signa rerum also provides the basis of a close interconnection of logic and epistemology as it is characteristic especially of the later Middle Ages. In conjunction with this, a redefinition of the notion of signification (significare) is taking place. For where the mental concepts, i.e., the acts of understanding (intellectus), are considered to be signs themselves, the Aristotelian definition of significare (signifying) as to constitute an understanding (constituere intellectum) can no longer be regarded as adequate. As a result, the terminology of ‘representation’ (repraesentatio, repraesentare, facere praesens), originally used mainly in epistemological contexts, achieves an increasing importance for logical semantics by being fused with the terminology of ‘signification’. Finally, the description of mental concepts as signs can also be seen as one of the main motifs for the general account of signs as it emerges in late medieval logic. For it is only under this condition that logic is no longer concerned exclusively with arbitrary signs but also — and even primarily — with natural signs.

7. The sign as a central notion in 14th-century logic

Even though in 13th-century terminist logic ‘significatio’ is seen as the foundation of all ‘properties of terms’ (proprietates terminorum), the generation of William of Sherwood and Peter of Spain is not particularly interested in the concept of signification. Significatio is shortly described as “presentation of some form to the intellect” (praesentatio alicuius formae ad intellectus)[44] or as “representation of a thing by means of a conventional vocal expression” (rei per vocem secundum placitum repraesentatio) (Peter of Spain, Summule logicales, 1972, 79). But the detailed logical discussion starts right away with the concept of suppositio (supposition), i.e., from the capacity of substantive terms to stand for something in a propositional context.

With William of Ockham (ca. 1285-1347/49), however, the concepts of sign and signification begin to take center stage in logic (Biard 1981, 452; Biard 1989). Logic is seen as exclusively concerned with signs, primarily with mental signs, secondarily with vocal or written signs. Ockham integrates the concept of supposition into his definition of sign. He recognizes that the general notion of sign as something that makes something else come into cognition is too broad to be useful in logic and semantic theory; therefore, he adds to the definition the criterion that a sign, as far as its use in logic is concerned, has to be apt to stand for the thing it makes come into cognition, or else it has to be such that it could be added to such a sign standing for something (natum est pro illo supponere vel tali addi in propositione) (William of Ockham, Summa log., 1974, 9).[45] Thus, Ockham's logical concept of sign is restricted to what later will be termed a ‘propositional sign’ (signum propositionale) (John Raulin, In log. Arist. comment., 1500, fol. a5rb). Due to the central position of the notion of sign in his logic, one is entitled to characterize Ockham's logic as “ruled by the concept of sign” (“régie par le concept de signe”) (Biard 1989, 102). Ockham, constantly referring to the notion of sign, ventures in many cases a semiological redefinition of basic logical concepts (Biard 1989, 102-25), which in turn allows him to reformulate traditional ontological issues, as for instance the questions of universals, the number of categories, or the ontological status of relations, as semantic questions.

Ockham's logic marks an important, though not the only important, step in the process that might be described as a progressive ‘mentalization’ of sign. The idea behind this process is the contention that without some sort of ‘intentionality’ the phenomena of sign, signification and semiosis in general must remain inconceivable. This tendency of relocating the notions of sign and signification from the realm of spoken words to the sphere of the mind is characteristic of the mentalist logic arising in the early 14th century, and remaining dominant throughout the later Middle Ages. Words or signs, insofar as they concern rational discourse, were traditionally held to be the essential subject matter of logic. According to mentalist logic, however, the ‘words’ or ‘signs’ primarily relevant to logic are not the spoken words, but the trans-idiomatic mental words (verba mentis) or mental concepts. Thus, in later medieval logic, as already in Burleigh and Ockham, the mental sign will be the focus of logical semantics. According to a distinction introduced by Peter of Ailly (1330-1421) in the second half of 14th century,

…a thing can be called a sign in two senses. In the first sense, because it leads to an act of knowing the thing of which it is a sign. In a second sense, because it is itself the act of knowing the thing. In the second sense we may say that a concept is a sign of a thing of which such a concept is a natural likeness — not that it leads to an act of knowing that thing, but because it is the very act itself of knowing the thing, [an act that] naturally and properly represents that thing (Peter of Ailly, Concepts, 1980, 17).

Even if Ockham's semantics, as well as his theory of mental language governed by a trans-idiomatic mental grammar transforming the theorems of terminist logic into a theory of thought processes (William of Ockham, Summa log., 1974, 11ff),[46] was by no means undisputed, and came under severe criticism by his opponents as well as no less severe modifications by his ‘followers’. What, despite all the differences, logical authors from the 14thcentury on generally have in common is their awareness of the importance of the concept of sign — even though, of course, there were exceptions to this rule. Some realistic-minded theologians, such as John Wyclif (1330-1384) or Stanislas of Znoymo (fl. ca. 1400), harshly criticize the alleged overestimation of the sign by the “teachers of signs” (doctores signorum), as the latter calls them. According to Stanislas, the human ‘errantry through the vain and useless signs’ of logic is nothing but the necessary consequence of the fall of mankind (in penam peccati sumus necessitati in his vacuis et inanis signis erranter ambulare) (Stanislas of Znoymo, De vero et falso, 1971, 207).[47]

8. The concept of sign in scholastic logic of 15th and early 16th-century

With Ockham, the concept of sign becomes a central notion of logical theory. However, as a result of Ockham's focus on the propositional sign as the only sign relevant to logic, initially only a narrow section of semiotic topics were dealt with in logic. In contrast to Ockham, late scholastic terminist logic is characterized by an approach of discussing logico-semantic topics on the basis of a most general understanding of the pertinent vocabulary (e.g., terminus, significare, repraesentare, signum etc.). Due to this practice, topics of semiotic relevance, even though not of direct logical concern, began to accumulate at the margins of the logical discourse. The culmination point of this development is reached in the Paris school of John Major (John Mair, 1469-1547), the most important and most influential center of late-scholastic logical studies.[48]

The members of this school take signification or “to signify” in the general sense of to “make (someone) know (something)” (facere cognoscere) (Petrus Margallus, Log. utriusque scholia, 1520, 148),[49] and conceive it along the lines of the older description of ‘repraesentare’ in its broadest sense according to which the function of representation could be ascribed to all which “in some way contributes to a thing being known” (quod aliquo modo facit ad hoc quod res cognoscatur).[50] Consequently, “to signify” often is characterized as “to represent something to an intellect” (aliquid intellectui respraesentare) (Albert of Saxony, Quaest. in artem vet, 1988, 472; John Raulin, In log. Arist. Comment, 1500, fol. g4vb). In order to make this definition cover cases of non intellectual sign interpreters (animals)[51] as well as the so-called syncategorematic terms which do not properly signify ‘something’ (aliquid), a still more general version was put forward, defining the act of signifying as “to represent something or some things or somehow to a cognitive power (aliquid vel aliqua vel aliqualiter potentiae cognitivae repraesentare) (Gaspar Lax, Parve divis. term., ca. 1502, fol a4vb). This definition roughly expresses what is basically uncontroversial regarding the concept of signification among logicians from late 14th to early 16th century. Even if there were numerous definitional variants of the concept of signification, which often gave occasion to controversies, nevertheless, common to all these variations was their primarily epistemological orientation. Contrary to Ockham's concept of sign, it is not the logical function of referring to a significatum that stands in the foreground, but rather the sign's relation to a cognitive power. In other words, the sign is not primarily characterized by its appropriateness to fulfill a semantic function in the context of a proposition, but rather by its capability to act in an epistemologically efficient way on a cognitive power: “A sign is something that makes think” (signum est res faciens cogitare) (Petrus Margallus, Log. utriusque scholia, 1520, 146). Unlike Ockham's semantic concept of sign, the one favored by the later authors is predominantly pragmatic.

This tendency is already obvious when Peter of Ailly defines the act of signifying as “to represent something, or some things, or somehow to a cognitive power by vitally changing it” (aliquid vel aliqua vel aliqualiter potentiae cognitivae ipsam vitaliter immutando repraesentare) (Peter of Ailly, Concepts, 1980, 16).[52] With the particle “vitally changing it” (vitaliter immutare) entering into the definition of ‘significare’ the relatedness to cognition or to a cognitive power becomes an essential factor of signification. For, as John Gebwiler later underlines: “without such a vital change nothing is signified to whomsoever” (absque vitali immutatione nihil cuipiam significatur) (John Gebwiler, Magistralis totius parvuli artis log. compil., 1511, fol. h4r-h4v).

In view of this it should be clear that the widespread opinion according to which in medieval philosophy the sign was characterized by the “classical definition” or the “famous formula of aliquid stat pro aliquo” (something stands for something)[53] is mistaken. It is suppositio, not significatio, that is characterized by that formula.[54] Even in Ockham's concept of sign, which comes closest to such a description, the aptitude ‘to stand for something’ is just one component of the whole function of the sign. In no case has the sign or act of signifying been conceived as a simple two-term relation of “something standing for something”.

On the basis of an extended notion of sign, the authors of late 15th- and early 16th-century logic discussed at length topics like the different kinds of signification and representation (Gaspar Lax, Parve divis. term., ca. 1502, fol. a5[55] or the traditional distinction of natural and conventional signs, showing that there exist intermediate forms, like those signs that signify by custom (ex consuetudine) (Hagenau, Comment. in prim. et quart. tract. Petri Hisp, 1495, fol. a7v; Conrad Pschlacher, Compendiarius parv. log. Liber, 1512, fol. 6r-6v), which are instituted neither by nature nor by an act of imposition, but rather are established by repetition (frequentatio) (Juan de Oria, Summul. vol. Primum, 1987, 109).

The universality of the concept of sign, according to which in some respect “anything in the world is a sign” (omnis res mundi est signum) (Peter Margallus, Logices utriusque scholia, 1520, 146f.), is counterbalanced by the emphasis laid on the mental sign (signum mentale) providing the basis for the whole range of sign processes. Spoken words, just like any external signs in general, can signify only by mediation of an immediate signification, provided by the mental concepts.[56] Thus, as Petrus a Spinosa says, the whole signification depends on the mental term (tota significatio dependet a [termino] mentali) (Pedro de Espinosa, Tractatus terminorum, cited in Muñoz Delgado, 1983, 152f.) In some respect this claim even goes beyond John Gerson's thesis, that “signification is not properly or aptly understood except with respect to an intellectual nature that is able to use the sign” (Significatio nec proprie nec convenienter accipitur, nisi per respectum ad naturam intellectualem, quae potest uti signo) (John Gerson, De modis significandi, 1706, 816). For what makes any signification possible, the cognitive act, is conceived to be a sign or an act of signification in the most proper sense, so that any other sign or signification can be termed a such only with reference to the mental sign (ipsa cognitio formalis… est propriissima significatio, ita quod alia dicuntur significare per attributionem ad istam) (Hieronymus de S. Marcho, Compendium praeclarum, 1507, fol. B1[57]

Whereas according to Augustine the sign, being an external entity by definition, was precluded from the sphere of the mind, it is now the mental sign, i.e., the mental concept or mental term (terminus mentalis), that is seen as the primary and most principal sign (signum mentale est primum et principalissimum signum, sine quo voces et scripta significare non possunt) (Florentius Diel, Modernorum summulae log., 1489, fol. a5v) as well as the ultimate ground of all signification.[58] Without such an ultimate and immediate signification instantiated in the formal signification of the mental concept, there would be, as John Raulin remarks, an infinite regress (processus in infinitum) in any signification, something like a Peircean ‘infinite semeiosis’.[59] Unlike the infinite semeiosis of Peirce, however, such a regress, according to late medieval authors, would not have the character of a steady and permanent differentiation of signification but rather would be, as John Major calls it, an “abyss in signifying” (abyssus in significando) (John Major: Introd. perutile in Arist. dial. (1527: fol. 14ra), i.e., a process never resulting in a actual signification.

Together with the deliberately extended notions of ‘sign’ and ‘term’ and the emphasis of the role of the mental sign, a fundamental redefinition of written signs, i.e., inscriptions is emerging in logic around 1500. Taking their cue from the view introduced by Peter of Ailly, the later authors free the written sign from its traditional subordination to the vocal sign by immediately subordinating it to the mental sign (Florentius Diel, Modernorum summulae log., 1489, fol. d5v; Peter Tartaretus, Expos. in summulas Petri Hisp, 1514, fol. 37rb-va; Antonius Coronel, Termini, 1506, fol. B3ra-b; Hieronymus Pardo, Medulla dyalect., 1505, fol. 7rb; John Eck, In summulis Petri Hisp., 1516, fol. 5 vb). Thus scriptura, no longer viewed as a secondary sign system and as a mere supplement of vocal speech, is no longer restricted to alphabetic writing. This in turn provides the ground for a dramatic generalization of the notion of written sign as well. When logical discourse extends its boundaries in order to give an account of all sorts of signs, integrating the whole range of signs into the traditional framework of logic and, at the same time, these signs have to be described along the lines of the traditional distinction of mental, vocal, and written terms, then it is the written term (terminus scriptus) that provides the most suitable opportunity for such an integration. This, of course, presupposes a radically extended notion of inscriptions as it arose in Parisian logic around 1500, where an inscription is no longer characterized in terms of its derivative relation to spoken language, but rather in terms of its specific relation to the human sensory apparatus. In this sense, John Major and others define the written term as a “term that can be perceived by a corporeal eye” (terminus scriptus est terminus qui oculo corporali percipi potest) (John Major, Libri quos in artibus in collegio Montis Acuti Parisius regentando compilavit, 1508, fol. 4[60] And Juan de Oria more explicitly states: “A written term is not called so because of being an inscription made up from characters or letters but rather because of representing something to the cognitive faculty by means of sight” (non enim dicitur terminus scriptus, quia sit scriptura ex caracteribus aut litteris constans, sed quia potentie cognitive aliquid proprie representat, mediante visu) (Juan de Oria, Summul. vol. Primum, 1987, 106). The written term being thus defined, even the circulus vini can count as a written term (John Maior , Libri…, 1508, fol. 4va). Some authors extend the notion of writing even further and call terminus scriptus “a term perceptible by senses other than haering” (terminus alio sensu quam auditu perceptibilis) (Peter Margallus, Log. utriusque scholia, 1520, 92) so that every corporeal being perceivable by one of the four external senses different from hearing may be an instance of written terms (omne sensibile corpus quattuor externis sensibus posse esse terminum scriptum) (Peter Margallus, Log. utriusque scholia, 1520, 162f.)

The basic idea behind this theoretical extension of the notion of inscription is the indifference of de sign-function to the material instantiation of the sign. This arbitrariness of the medium of the sign holds for the signs not only with regard to their communicative capacity, but also with regard to their function in logical operations. As Paul of Venice points out, in principle it would be possible to form syllogisms or to draw conclusions by using sticks and stones instead of words or sentences (… possemus cum baculis syllogizare et cum lapidibus concludere) (Paul of Venice, Logica magna, prima pars, Tract. de terminis, 1979, 78). The fact that we, in general, do not do so, and that we do not communicate by means of sensible qualities like warms or smell, but rather use vocal or written terms in the strict sense, is only due to their greater operability (Paul of Venice, Logica magna, prima pars, Tract. de terminis, 1979, 78).[61] For we can utter articulated sounds whenever we want to but cannot produce with the same ease and distinctness the possible objects of the other senses like certain colors or smells.[62]

Extending the notion of terminus opens the horizon for taking into account further semiotic issues, such as the distinction between terms that signify absolutely (terminus absolute significans) and terms that signify on account of circumstances (terminus ex circumstantia significans) (Juan de Oria, Summul. vol. Primum, 1987, 106f.) Whereas spoken or written words are members of the first class, the second class is made up from any other kind of conventional signs, like the toll of bells, the crucifix or the circulus vini. With this distinction, Johannes de Oria underscores the influence of the situational context on the signification of non-linguistic signs. As he notices, it depends on the circumstances of time and place whether the toll of a bell is an invitation to go to the chapter congregation or to a meal; an image of the crucified Christ denotes that he has to be adored only in the situational context of a church building, but not in the studio of the painter or sculptor (imago crucifixi in ecclesia posita, representat quod est adoranda, ubi non sic representaret in domo pictoris vel statuifici) (Juan de Oria, Summul. vol. Primum, 1987, 106f.); a wreath of foliage denotes the vine-selling only when attached outside a tavern, but not in the woods (Peter Margallus, Log. utriusque scholia, 1965, 166). Moreover, the terms that signify on account of circumstances are characterized according to John of Oria by the fact that they regularly signify a state of affairs and thus function as propositional signs (terminus ex circumstantia significans regulariter representat aliquid esse vel non esse. Ex quo fit quod omnis talis terminus est propositio) (Juan de Oria, Summul. vol. Primum, 1987, 106).

Whereas in Western Europe, under the growing influence of humanism, the scholastic tradition of terminist logic came to an end in the third decade of the 16th century, it had a vigorous, though not unaltered, continuation on the Iberian Peninsula until the 18th century. From there it was re-imported to the universities and academic schools in Western Europe, after the late 16th and early 17th century, mainly but not exclusively in Catholic areas. Even if the scholastic doctrine of signs was presented in a so to speak “light version” by authors like Domingo de Soto[63] and Franciscus Toletus, the rudiments of medieval semiotics transmitted through their writings, provided the groundwork on which a great number of 17th-century logicians were developing a highly elaborated sign theory (Meier-Oeser 1997, 171-335). The most important of these are the so-called Conimbricenses, John of St. Thomas (alias John Poinsot), Peter of Candamo and Silvester Aranha, but a large number of texts is still awaiting to be explored.


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Ockham [Occam], William | Peirce, Charles Sanders | Thomas of Erfurt