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Space and Time: Inertial Frames

First published Sat Mar 30, 2002; substantive revision Wed Nov 4, 2009

A “frame of reference” is a standard relative to which motion and rest may be measured; any set of points or objects that are at rest relative to one another enables us, in principle, to describe the relative motions of bodies. A frame of reference is therefore a purely kinematical device, for the geometrical description of motion without regard to the masses or forces involved. A dynamical account of motion leads to the idea of an “inertial frame,” or a reference frame relative to which motions have distinguished dynamical properties. For that reason an inertial frame has to be understood as a spatial reference frame together with some means of measuring time, so that uniform motions can be distinguished from accelerated motions. The laws of Newtonian dynamics provide a simple definition: an inertial frame is a reference-frame with a time-scale, relative to which the motion of a body not subject to forces is always rectilinear and uniform, accelerations are always proportional to and in the direction of applied forces, and applied forces are always met with equal and opposite reactions. It follows that, in an inertial frame, the center of mass of a system of bodies is always at rest or in uniform motion. It also follows that any other frame of reference moving uniformly relative to an inertial frame is also an inertial frame. For example, in Newtonian celestial mechanics, taking the “fixed stars” as a frame of reference, we can determine an (approximately) inertial frame whose center is the center of mass of the solar system; relative to this frame, every acceleration of every planet can be accounted for (approximately) as a gravitational interaction with some other planet in accord with Newton's laws of motion.

This appears to be a simple and straightforward concept. By inquiring more narrowly into its origins and meaning, however, we begin to understand why it has been an ongoing subject of philosophical concern. It originated in a profound philosophical consideration of the principles of relativity and invariance in the context of Newtonian mechanics. Further reflections on it, in different theoretical contexts, had extraordinary consequences for 20th-century theories of space and time.

1. Relativity and Reference Frames in Classical Mechanics

1.1 The Origins of Galilean Relativity

The term “reference frame” was coined in the 19th century, but it has a long prehistory, beginning, perhaps, with the emergence of the Copernican theory. The significant point was not the replacement of the earth by the sun as the center of all motion in the universe, but the recognition of both the earth and the sun as merely possible points of view from which the motions of the celestial bodies may be described. This implied that the basic task of Ptolemaic astronomy—to represent the planetary motions by combinations of circular motions—could take any point to be fixed, and that, as Copernicus suggested in the opening arguments of “On the revolutions of the heavenly spheres,” the choice of any particular point required some justification on other than astronomical grounds. As the basic programme of Ptolemy and Copernicus gave way to that of early classical mechanics, this equivalence of points of view was made more precise and explicit. Galileo demonstrated that the Copernican view does not contradict our experience of a seemingly stable earth, through a principle that, in the precise form that it takes in Newtonian mechanics, has become known as the “principle of Galilean relativity”: mechanical experiments will have the same results in a system in uniform motion that they have in a system at rest. Therefore the experiments claimed as evidence against Copernicus—e.g., that a stone dropped from a tower falls to the base of the tower, instead of being left behind—would happen just as they do whether the earth were moving or not, provided that the motion is sufficiently uniform. See Figure 1.

figure 1
Figure 1: Galileo's Argument
If the earth is rotating sufficiently uniformly, a stone dropped from the tower will fall straight to the base, just as a stone dropped from the mast of a uniformly moving ship will fall to the foot of the mast. In both cases the stone's vertical motion will be smoothly composed with its horizontal motion. Hence a sufficiently uniform motion will be indistinguishable from rest.

1.2 Philosophical Controversy Over Absolute and Relative Motion

Leibniz, later, articulated a more general “equipollence of hypotheses”: in any system of interacting bodies, any hypothesis that any particular body is at rest is equivalent to any other. Therefore neither Copernicus' nor Ptolemy's view can be true—though one may be judged simpler than the other—because both are merely possible hypothetical interpretations of the same relative motions. This principle clearly defines (what we would call) a set of reference frames, differing in their arbitrary choices of a resting point or origin, but agreeing on the relative positions of bodies at any moment and their changing relative distances through time.

For Leibniz and many others, this general equivalence was a matter of philosophical principle, founded in the metaphysical conviction that space itself is nothing more than an abstraction from the geometrical relations among bodies. In some form or other it was a widely shared tenet of the 17th-century “mechanical philosophy”. Yet it was flatly incompatible with physics as Leibniz himself, and the other “mechanists,” actually conceived it. For the basic program of mechanical explanation depended essentially on the concept of a privileged state of motion, as expressed in the assumption that bodies maintain a state of rectilinear motion until acted upon by an external cause. Thus their fundamental conception of force, as the power of a body to change the state of another, likewise depended on this notion of a privileged state. This dependence was clearly exhibited in the vortex theory of planetary motion, in which every orbit was explained by the balance between the planet's inherent centrifugal tendency (its tendency to follow the tangent to the orbit) and the pressure of the surrounding medium.

For this reason, the notion of a dispute between “relativists” or “relationists” and “absolutists” or “substantivalists”, in the 17th century, is a drastic oversimplification. Newton, in his controversial Scholium on space, time, and motion, was not merely asserting that motion is absolute in the face of the mechanists' relativist view; he was arguing that a conception of absolute motion was already implicit in the views of his opponents—that it was implicit in their conception, which he largely shared, of physical cause and effect. The general equivalence of reference-frames was implicitly denied by a physics that understood forces as powers to change the states of motion of bodies.

Newton therefore held that physics required the conception of absolute space, a distinguished frame of reference relative to which bodies could be said to be truly moving or truly at rest. Assuming, as both Newton and Leibniz did, that states of motion could be distinguished by their causes and effects, the distinguished status of this frame of reference is physically well founded—and metaphysically well-founded for a metaphysics that, like Newton's or Leibniz's, takes force to be a well-founded notion. On Leibniz's conception of force, in particular, a given force is required to generate or to maintain a given velocity—for objects “passively” resist motion, but maintain their states of motion only by “active” force—so that, on dynamical grounds, “every body truly does have a certain amount of motion, or, if you will, force.” This implies that there is in principle a distinguished frame of reference in which the velocities of bodies correspond to their true velocities, i.e. to the amounts of moving force that they truly possess, and it implies that in any frame that is in motion relative to this one, bodies will not have their true velocities. In short, such a conception of force, if it could be applied physically, would give a precise physical application of Newton's conception of absolute space.

1.3 Galilean Relativity in Newtonian Physics

The difficulty with Newton's view of absolute space comes from the Newtonian conception of force. If force is defined and measured solely by the power to accelerate a body, then obviously the effects of forces—in short, the causal interactions within a system of bodies—will be independent of the velocity of the system in which they are measured. So the existence of a set of equivalent “inertial frames” is imposed from the start by Newton's laws. Suppose that we determine for the bodies in a given frame of reference—say, the rest frame of the fixed stars—that all observable accelerations are proportional to forces impressed by bodies within the system, by equal and opposite actions and reactions among those bodies. Then we know that these physical interactions will be the same in any frame of reference that is in uniform rectilinear motion relative to the first one. Therefore no Newtonian experiment will be able to determine the velocity of a body, or system of bodies, relative to absolute space. In other words, there is no way to distinguish absolute space itself from any frame of reference that is in uniform motion relative to it. Newton thought that a coherent account of force and motion requires a background space consisting of “places” that “all keep given positions in relation to one another from infinity to infinity” (1726, p. 412). But the laws of motion enable us to determine an infinity of such spaces, all in uniform rectilinear motion relative to each other, and furnish no way of singling out any one as “immovable space.”

Oddly enough, no one in the 17th century, or even before the late 19th century, expressed this equivalence of reference-frames more clearly than Newton himself. Newton explicitly derived it from the laws of motion as Corollary V:

Corollary V:
When bodies are enclosed in a given space, their motions in relation to one another are the same whether the space is at rest or whether it is moving uniformly straight forward without circular motion. (1726, p. 423.)

This is the first clear statement of the Galilean relativity principle. It implied that the dispute between the heliocentric and geocentric views of the universe was mistakenly framed: the proper question about “the system of the world” was not “which body is at rest in the center?” but “where is the center of gravity of the system, and which body is closest to it?” For in a system of orbiting bodies, only their common center of gravity will be unaccelerated, and by Corollary V, the motions of the bodies in the system will be the same, whether its center of gravity is at rest or in uniform rectilinear motion. The system is indeed approximately Keplerian, since the sun has by far the greatest mass and is therefore little disturbed from the center of gravity, which is therefore very close to the common focus of the approximately Keplerian ellipses in which the planets orbit the sun. But by Corollary V, the nearly-Keplerian structure of the system is completely independent of the system's state of motion in absolute space.

The Galilean relativity principle thus expressed the insight that different states of uniform motion, or different uniformly-moving frames of reference, determine only different points of view on the same physically objective quantities, namely force, mass, and acceleration. We can see this insight expressed more explicitly in Newton's understanding of inertia. For Leibniz (among others) , as we saw, moving force, the power of a body to change the motion of another, was determined by velocity. It was therefore seen as an active power, fundamentally different from the passive power of a resting body to resist any change of position. Newton, in contrast, understood the “force of inertia” as a Galilei-invariant quantity:

[A] body exerts this force only during a change of its state, caused by another force impressed upon it, and the exercise of this force is, depending on viewpoint, both resistance and impetus: resistance in so far as the body, in order to maintain its state, strives against the impressed force, and impetus in so far as the same body, yielding only with difficulty to the force of a resisting obstacle, endeavors to change the state of that obstacle. Resistance is commonly attributed to resting bodies and impetus to moving bodies; but motion and rest, in the popular sense of the term, are distinguished from each other only by point of view, and bodies commonly regarded as being at rest are not always truly at rest. (1726, p. 404–05.)

Newton thus recognized the powers distinguished by Leibniz as the same thing seen from different points of view.

1.4 The Lingering Problem of Absolute Space

Newton understood the Galilean principle of relativity with a degree of depth and clarity that eluded most of his “relativist” contemporaries. It may seem bizarre, therefore, that the notion of inertial frame did not emerge until more than a century and a half after his death. He had identified a distinguished class of dynamically equivalent “relative spaces,” in any of which true forces and masses, accelerations and rotations, would have the same objectively measured values. Yet these spaces, though empirically indistinguishable, were not equivalent in principle; evidently Newton conceived them as moving with various velocities in absolute space, though those velocities could not be known. Why should not he, or someone, have recognized the equivalence of these spaces immediately?

This is not the place for an adequate answer to this question, if indeed one is possible. For much of the 20th century, the accepted answer was that of Ernst Mach: Newton lived in an age “deficient in epistemological critique,” and so was unable to draw the conclusion that these empirically indistinguishable spaces must be equivalent in every meaningful sense, so that no one of them deserves even in principle to be designated as “absolute space.” Yet even those whom the 20th century credited with more sophisticated epistemological views, such as Leibniz, evidently had difficulties understanding force and inertia in a Galilei-invariant way, despite a philosophical commitment to relativity. Perhaps it suffices to say that to abandon the intuitive association of force or motion with velocity in space, and to accept an equivalence-class structure as the fundamental spatiotemporal framework, requires a level of abstraction that became possible only with the extraordinary development of mathematics, especially of a more abstract view of geometry, that took place in the 19th century. (See geometry: in the 19th century.) In the 17th century only Christiaan Huygens came close to expressing such a view; he held that not velocity, but velocity-difference, was the fundamental dynamical quantity. He therefore understood, for example, that the “absoluteness” of rotation had nothing to do with velocity relative to absolute space, but arose from the difference of velocity among different parts of a rotating body—a difference which would, evidently, be the same irrespective of the velocity of the body as a whole in absolute space. But of this Huygens gave only the merest suggestion, in manuscripts that remained unpublished for two centuries. (See Stein 1977.) The concept of inertial frame therefore emerged only in the late 19th century, when, as we shall see, it did not seem to be of any great immediate importance.

Meanwhile, the relativity principle was understood as the equivalence of uniform states of motion, but any systems in such a state was implicitly understood to have a definite, though unknown and unknowable, velocity in absolute space. Euler (1748), for example, defended Newton's conceptions of space and time against the thesis that space and time are ideal, and motion merely relative; his broad argument was that metaphysics had no standing to criticize conceptions that are required by the established laws of physics. Yet he noted that the laws of motion permit us to determine, not the velocity of any motion in space, but only the absolute sameness of direction of an inertial trajectory over time, and the equality of time-intervals in which an inertially-moving particle moves equal distances. To Euler, these irreducibly spatial and temporal aspects of the laws of motion implied that space and time could not possibly be ideal. Like Newton, therefore, he upheld both the relativity of velocity and the reality of absolute space. The inconsistency of such a theory can be seen in two ways. On the one hand, we can see it as a fundamental incoherence, even if, again, we excuse those who held it on the grounds of the limited mathematical tools available to them. On the other hand, it does represent a deep appreciation of the indistinguishability of velocities in absolute space, and a consequent effort to make sure that the actual treatment of actual physical systems is not undermined by this uncertainty. Newton hoped to analyze the dynamical interactions that hold the solar system together; he wanted to show that his dynamical account, and the view of “the frame of the system of the world” that emerges from it, is a matter of “reasoning from phenomena” rather than of plausible conjecture. It was therefore a very circumspect, even prescient, move on his part to demonstrate, through his use of Corollaries IV and V, that the analysis is completely independent of any conceivable translation of the system in absolute space.

1.5 19th-Century Analyses of the Law of Inertia

The development of this concept began with a renewed critical analysis of the notion of absolute space, for reasons not anticipated by Newton's contemporary critics. Its starting point was a critical questions about the law of inertia: relative to what is the motion of a free particle uniform and rectilinear? If the answer is “absolute space,” then the law would appear to be something other than an empirical claim, for no one can observe the trajectory of a particle relative to absolute space. Two quite different answers to the question were offered in 1870, in the form of revised statements of the law of inertia. Carl Neumann proposed that when we state the law, we must suppose that there is a body somewhere in the universe—the “body Alpha”—with respect to which the motion of a free particle is rectilinear, and that there is a time-scale somewhere relative to which it is uniform (Neumann 1870). Ernst Mach (1883) claimed that the law of inertia, and Newton's laws generally, implicitly appeal to the fixed stars as a spatial reference-frame, and to the rotation of the earth as a time-scale; at least, he held, such is the basis for any genuine empirical content that the laws have. The notion of absolute space, it followed, was only an unwarranted abstraction from the practice of measuring motions relative to the fixed stars.

Mach's proposal had the advantage of a clear empirical motivation; Neumann's “body Alpha” seemed no less mysterious than absolute space, and almost sounds comical to the modern reader. But Neumann's discussion of a time-scale was somewhat more fruitful. He noted that the law of inertia defines a time-scale: equal intervals of time are those in which a free particle travels equal distances. Such a definition is another aspect of the Newtonian theory first made explicit by Euler (1748). Neumann also noted, however, that this definition is quite arbitrary. For, in the absence of a prior definition of equal times, any motion whatever can be stipulated to be uniform. It is no help to appeal to the requirement of freedom from external forces, since the free particles presumably are known to us only by their uniform motion. We have a genuine empirical claim only when we state of at least two free particles that their motions are mutually proportional; equal intervals of time can then be defined as those in which two free particles travel mutually proportional distances.

1.6. The Emergence of the Concept of Inertial Frame

Neumann's definition of a time-scale directly inspired Ludwig Lange's conception of “inertial system,” introduced in 1885 . An inertial coordinate system ought to be one in which free particles move in straight lines. But any trajectory may be stipulated to be rectilinear, and a coordinate system can always be constructed in which it is rectilinear. And so, as in the case of the time-scale, we cannot adequately define an inertial system by the motion of one particle. Indeed, for any two particles moving anyhow, a coordinate system may be found in which both their trajectories are rectilinear. So far the claim that either particle, or some third particle, is moving in a straight line may be said to be a matter of convention. We must define an inertial system as one in which at least three non-collinear free particles move in noncoplanar straight lines; then we can state the law of inertia as the claim that, relative to an inertial system so defined, the motion of any fourth particle, or arbitrarily many particles, will be rectilinear. The notions of inertial system and Neumann's time-scale, which Lange called an “inertial time-scale,” may be combined as follows: relative to a coordinate system in which three free particles move in straight lines and travel mutually-proportional distances, the motion of any fourth free particle will be rectilinear and uniform. The questionable Newtonian concepts of absolute rotation and acceleration, Lange proposed, could now be replaced by the concepts of “inertial rotation” and “inertial acceleration,” i.e. rotation and acceleration relative to an inertial system and inertial time-scale. See Figures 2 and 3.

Figure 2: Neumann's Time-Scale:
By Newton's first law, a particle not subject to forces travels equal distances in equal times. But which particles are free of forces? This might appear to be a matter of convention.
Figure 2a Figure 2b
Either P1 or P2 can be arbitrarily stipulated to be at the origin of a system of coordinates, and to serve as the measure of equal times But I can say of two particles with different velocities: in intervals of time in which one moves a given distance d1, the other moves a proportional distance d2 = kd1 (where k is a constant; i.e., d1/d2 = k). Or I can compare a particle to a freely rotating planet: in intervals of time through which the planet rotates through equal angles, the particle moves equal distances.
Figure 3: Lange's Definition of ‘inertial system’ (1885):
An inertial system is a coordinate system with respect to which three free particles, projected from a single point and moving in non-coplanar directions, move in straight lines and travel mutually-proportional distances. The law of inertia then states that relative to any inertial system, any fourth free particle will move uniformly.
        Figure 3

At about the same time, apparently unaware of the work of Mach, Neumann, and Lange, James Thomson expressed the content of the law of inertia, and the appropriate frame of reference and time-scale (“dial-traveller”), somewhat differently:

For any set of bodies acted on each by any force, a REFERENCE FRAME and a REFERENCE DIAL-TRAVELLER are kinematically possible, such that relatively to them conjointly, the motion of the mass-centre of each body, undergoes change simultaneously with any infinitely short element of the dial-traveller progress, or with any element during which the force on the body does not alter in direction nor in magnitude, which change is proportional to the intensity of the force acting on that body, and to the simultaneous progress of the dial-traveller, and is made in the direction of the force. (Thomson 1884, p. 387)

More simply, an inertial reference-frame is one in which Newton's second law is satisfied, so that every acceleration corresponds to an impressed force. Thomson did not reject the term “absolute rotation,” holding instead that it has to be understood as rotation relative to a reference frame that satisfies his definition. The definition does not express, as Lange's does, the degree of arbitrariness involved in the construction of an inertial system by means of free particles. Moreover, like Lange's, it leaves out a crucial condition for an inertial system as we understand it: all forces must belong to action-reaction pairs. Otherwise we could have, as on a rotating sphere, merely apparent (centrifugal) forces that are, by definition, proportional to mass and acceleration, and so the rotating sphere would satisfy Thomson's definition. Therefore the definition needs to be completed by the stipulation that to every action there is an equal and opposite reaction. (This completion was actually proposed by R.F. Muirhead in 1887.)

But, so completed, Thomson's definition has two advantages over Lange's. First, by appealing to Newton's second law instead of his first, it shows that we can apply the notion of inertial frame without having to consider the question whether there really are any free particles in nature. Second, it exhibits more clearly an essential point about the relation between the laws of motion and the inertial frames: that the laws assert the existence of at least one inertial frame. The original question, “relative to what frame of reference do the laws of motion hold?” is revealed to be wrongly posed. For the laws of motion essentially determine a class of reference frames, and (in principle) a procedure for constructing them. For the same reason, a skeptical question that is still commonly asked about the laws of motion—why is it that the laws are true only relative to a certain choice of reference frame?—is also wrongly posed. If Newton's laws are true, then we can construct an inertial frame; their truth doesn't depend on our ability to construct such a frame in advance.

2. Inertial Frames in the 20th Century: Special and General Relativity

2.1 Inertial Frames in Newtonian Spacetime

By the early years of the 20th century, this notion of inertial system seems to have been widely accepted, even if the specific works of Lange and Thomson were largely forgotten; in writing “On the electrodynamics of moving bodies” in 1905, Einstein took it to be obvious to his readers that classical mechanics does not require a single privileged frame of reference, but an equivalence-class of frames, all in uniform motion relative to each other, and any of which “the equations of mechanics hold good.” Two inertial frames with coordinates (x, y, z, t) and (x′, yzt′) are related by the Galilean transformations,

x′ = xvt
y′ = y
z′ = z
t′ = t

(assuming that the x axis is defined to be the direction of their relative motion). These transformations clearly preserve the invariant quantities of Newtonian mechanics, i.e. acceleration, force, and mass (and therefore time, length, and simultaneity). As far as Newtonian mechanics was concerned, then, the problem of absolute motion was completely solved; all that remained was to express the equivalence of inertial frames in a simpler geometrical structure.

The lack of a privileged spatial frame, combined with the obvious existence of privileged states of motion—paths defined as rectilinear in space and uniform with respect to time—suggests that the geometrical situation ought to be regarded from a four-dimensional spatiotemporal point of view. The structure defined by the class of inertial frames can be captured in the statement that spacetime is a four-dimensional affine space, whose straight lines (geodesics) are the trajectories of particles in uniform rectilinear motion. See Figure 4.

Figure 4: Inertial Trajectories as Straight Lines of Spacetime
Figure 4a Figure 4b
The uniformly moving particle will travel the same distance in the same intervals. A particle that accelerates after t1 will move a greater distance during t2 and therefore its path in spacetime changes direction.

That is, spacetime is a structure whose automorphisms—the Galilean transformations that relate one inertial frame to another—are equivalent to affine transformations: they take straight lines into straight lines (i.e. an inertial motion in one inertial frame will be an inertial motion in any other inertial frame, and likewise for an accelerating or rotational motion), and parallel lines into parallel lines (i.e. uniformly-moving particles or observers who are relatively at rest in one frame will also be relatively at rest in another). (See Stein 1967, Ehlers 1973, and Friedman 1983 for further explanation.) An inertial frame can be characterized as a family of parallel straight lines “filling” spacetime, representing the possible trajectories of a family of free particles that are relatively at rest. See Figure 5:

Figure 5:
Each of these families of straight lines, F1 and F2, represents the trajectories of a family of free particles that are relatively at rest, and therefore each defines an inertial frame. Relative to each other, the frames defined by F1 and F2 are in uniform motion.
Figure 5
Each of the surfaces S is a “hypersurface of absolute simultaneity” representing all of space at a given moment; evidently (given the Galilean transformations) two inertial frames will agree on which events in spacetime are simultaneous.

From this we can see that the assertion that an inertial frame exists imposes a global structure on spacetime; it is equivalent to the assertion that spacetime is flat. As we can see from the Galilean transformations, distinct inertial frames will agree on time and simultaneity. Therefore, in the four-dimensional picture, the decomposition of spacetime into hypersurfaces of absolute simultaneity is independent of the choice of inertial frame. Another way of putting this is that Newtonian spacetime is endowed with a projection of spacetime onto time, i.e. a function that identifies spacetime points that have the same time-coordinate. Similarly, absolute space arises from a projection of spacetime onto space, i.e. a function that identifies spacetime points that have the same spatial coordinates. See Figure 6.

Figure 6:

Figure 6a Figure 6b
The relation of simultaneity “decomposes” spacetime into 3-dimensional pieces, each representing “all of space at a given time,” by projecting spacetime onto time, i.e., by identifying spacetime points that have the same time coordinates. Similarly, one can think of the notion of “same place” as projecting spacetime onto space, i.e., by identifying spacetime points that have the same spatial coordinates; each of the trajectories thus singled out represents “a given place at all times.”

But this latter projection is arbitrary: while it assumes that we can identify the same time at different spatial locations, Newtonian mechanics provides no physical way of identifying the same spatial point at different times. Thus the equivalence of inertial frames can be thought of as the arbitrariness of the projection of spacetime onto space, any such projection being, essentially, the arbitrary choice of some particular inertial frame as a rest-frame.

Figure 7:

Here is a spacetime diagram of motions relative to the inertial frame in which O1, O2, and P are at rest. This can be seen as arising from the projection of each of their inertial trajectories onto a single point of space. Here is the same situation viewed from an inertial frame in which O3 and P′ are at rest. Now O1, O2, and P are in uniform motion.
Figure 7a Figure 7b
O1 and O2 are at rest O3 is at rest
O3 is in uniform motion O1 and O2 are in uniform motion
O4 is accelerating any old way O4 is accelerating any old way
O5 and O6 are revolving around their common centre of gravity P, which is at rest O5 and O6 are revolving around their common centre of gravity P, which is in uniform motion
O7 and O8 are revolving around their centre of gravity P′, which is in uniform motion. O7 and O8 are revolving around their centre of gravity P′, which is at rest

2.2 The Conflict Between Galilean Relativity and Modern Electrodynamics

By the time that this representation of the Newtonian spacetime structure was developed, however, the Newtonian conception of inertial frame had been essentially overthrown. First, 19th-century electrodynamics raised again the question of a privileged frame of reference: the conception of light as an electromagnetic wave in the ether implied that the rest-frame of the ether itself should play a distinguished role in electrodynamical phenomena. On the one hand, physicists such as Maxwell and Lorentz were careful to point out that velocity relative to the ether was not equivalent to absolute velocity, and that the state of motion of the ether itself was necessarily unknown—in other words, that this conception of light did not violate the classical principle of relativity. On the other hand, the existence of such a preferred frame made the equivalence of inertial frames correspondingly less interesting, even if it was true in principle. This is why the appearance of the idea of inertial frame in the 1880's, as I suggested earlier, was not of pressing physical interest to the majority of physicists, and seemed to be a mere philosophical sidelight. The attempts to measure the effects of motion relative to the ether commanded considerably more attention.

Second, the abandonment of the ether—following the failure of attempts to measure velocity relative to the ether and, more generally, the apparent independence of all electrodynamical phenomena of motion relative to the ether—did not vindicate the Newtonian inertial frame, but required a dramatically revised conception. Special relativity might be said to have applied the relativity principle of Newtonian mechanics to Maxwell's electrodynamics, by eliminating the privileged status of the rest-frame of the ether and admitting that the velocity of light is independent of the motion of the source. As Einstein expressed it, “the same laws of electrodynamics and optics will be valid for all frames of reference for which the equations of mechanics hold good.” (1905, p. 38.) But as Einstein also pointed out, the invariance of the velocity of light and the principle of relativity, at least in its Galilean form, are incompatible. It simply makes no sense, according to Galilean relativity, that any velocity should appear to be the same in inertial frames that are in relative motion.

2.3 Special Relativity and Lorentz Invariance

Einstein solved this difficulty through his analysis of simultaneity: frames in relative motion can agree on the velocity of light only if they disagree on simultaneity; only the relativity of simultaneity makes possible the invariance of the velocity of light. This means that the transformations between inertial frames that preserve the velocity of light will not preserve simultaneity. These are the Lorentz transformations:

Lorentz transformation equation

Evidently these transformations do not preserve length and time, and so the invariant quantities of Newtonian mechanics, which presuppose invariant measures of length and time, must now depend on the choice of inertial frame. By the same token, the notions of force, mass, and acceleration can no longer be appealed to in the definition of an inertial frame. The definition must instead appeal to the invariant quantities of electrodynamics: an inertial frame is one in which light travels equal distances in equal times in arbitrary directions. What seems impossible, from the point of view of Galilean relativity, is that a frame that moves uniformly relative to such a frame should also satisfy the definition. But that, again, rests on the assumption that two inertial frames will have a common measure of simultaneity. If, as Einstein asserts, the only reasonable definition of simultaneity is one provided by light signals, then there is no determination of simultaneity that will give the same results in different inertial frames. The spacetime structure that is implied by special relativity is thus an affine space, like Newtonian spacetime, but it is not objectively divided into hypersurfaces of absolute simultaneity; the sets of simultaneous events for any inertial frame are the hyperplanes orthogonal to the trajectories that determine that frame. In other words, the choice between two inertial frames determines a choice between two distinct divisions of spacetime into space and time. See Figure 8:

Figure 8:
The inertial frames F and F′ are in relative motion, and therefore, as the Lorentz transformations indicate, they disagree on simultaneity. F and F′ thus determine distinct decompositions of spacetime into instantaneous spaces, S and S′, respectively
Figure 8

2.4 Simultaneity and Reference-Frames

The details of Einstein's argument and the structure of Minkowski spacetime can be found elsewhere (see, e.g., Einstein 1951 and Geroch 1978). Here only one more point is worth making. It could be argued that Einstein's and Lorentz's view are completely equivalent. That is, we could assume that there is indeed a privileged frame of reference, and that the apparent invariance of the velocity of light is explained by the effects on bodies of their motion through the ether (the Lorentz contraction and time dilation). This purported distinction between empirically indistinguishable frames has often been criticized on straightforward methodological grounds, but it could be (and surely has been) argued that it is more intuitively plausible than the relativity of simultaneity. After all, knowing that (as Einstein showed) the Lorentz contraction can be derived from the invariance of the velocity of light does not, by itself, entitle us to say which of the two is the more convincing starting-point.

This is why it is so important that Einstein's 1905 paper begins with a critical analysis of the entire notion of a frame of reference. It is tacitly assumed by Lorentz's theory, and classical electrodynamics generally, that we have a reference-frame in which we can measure the velocity of light. But how is such a reference-frame determined? The distances between points in space can only be determined if it is possible to determine which events are simultaneous. In practice this is always done by light-signalling, if only in the informal sense that we identify simultaneous events when we see them at the same time. But if the spatial frame of reference is determined by light-signals, and is then to be used to measure the speed of light, we would appear to be going in a circle; the underlying assumption must be that, while light-signalling is useful and practical, it is not essential to the definition of simultaneity, and that there is a fact of the matter about which events are simultaneous that is independent of this method of signalling. This assumption was actually made explicit by James Thomson. He recognized—alone, apparently, before Einstein—that the measurement of distance involves

the difficulty as to imperfection of our means of ascertaining or specifying, or clearly idealizing, simultaneity at distant places. For this we do commonly use signals by sound, by light, by electricity, by connecting wires or bars, and by various other means. The time required in the transmission of the signal involves an imperfection in human powers of ascertaining simultaneity of occurrences at distant places. It seems, however, probably not to involve any difficulty of idealizing or imagining the existence of simultaneity. Probably it may not be felt to involve any difficulty comparable to that of attempting to form a distinct notion of identity of place at successive times in unmarked space. (1884, p. 380).

In other words, Thomson assumed that it was not a difficulty in principle, like the difficulty of determining rest in absolute space. But Einstein showed that it was precisely the same kind of difficulty, and that determinations of simultaneity involve reference to an arbitrary choice of reference-frame, just as much as determinations of velocity. Einstein's conclusion is, of course, entirely contingent on the empirical facts of electrodynamics; it could have been avoided if there were in nature a useful signal of some kind whose transmission would provide a criterion of absolute simultaneity, so that the same events would be determined to be simultaneous in all inertial frames. Or, experiments might have been able to reveal the dependence of the velocity of light on the state of motion of the source. Then synchronization by light-signals could still have been regarded as a mere practical substitute for a notion of absolute simultaneity that stood on independent grounds, empirically as well as conceptually. But as Einstein saw, because of the apparent independence of the velocity of light of the motion of the source, even “idealizing or imagining the existence of simultaneity” involves light-signaling more essentially than anyone could have realized. Unless some other criterion of simultaneity is provided, therefore, the establishment of a spatial frame of reference involves light-signaling in an essential way. In the absence of such a criterion the speed of light cannot be, as Lorentz supposed, empirically measured against the background of an inertial frame; in that case the only empirically sound definition of an inertial frame is the one that appeals to the speed of light.

2.5 From Special Relativity and Lorentz Invariance to General Relativity and General Covariance

It may seem surprising that, after this insightful analysis of the concept of inertial frame and its role in electrodynamics, Einstein should have turned almost immediately to call that concept into question. But he had a compelling combination of physical and philosophical motives to do so. On the physical side, he realized (along with many others) that special relativity would require some fundamental revision of the Newtonian theory of gravity. On the philosophical side, he became convinced, largely by his reading of Mach (1883), that the central role of inertial frames was an “epistemological defect” that special relativity shared with Newtonian mechanics. (Einstein 1916, pp. 112–113.) Only relative motions are observable, yet both of these theories purport to identify a privileged state of motion and use it to explain observable effects (such as centrifugal forces). Coordinate systems are not observable, yet both of these theories assign a fundamental physical role to certain kinds of coordinate system, namely, the inertial systems. In either theory, inertial coordinates are distinguished from all others, and the laws of physics are said to hold only relative to inertial coordinate systems. In an epistemologically sophisticated theory, both of these problems would be solved at once: the new theory would only refer to what is observable, which is relative motion; it would admit arbitrary coordinate systems, instead of confining itself to a special class of system. Why, after all, should any genuine physical phenomenon depend on the choice of coordinate system?

Another way of putting the same point is to say that, in Newtonian mechanics and special relativity, rotation is “absolute” because the transformations between inertial frames (Galilean or Lorentzian) preserve rotational states. Thus the “absoluteness” of rotation arises precisely from singling out one type of frame, by one type of transformation, instead of allowing arbitrary transformations and arbitrary frames. Einstein held that this epistemological insight had a natural mathematical representation in the principle of general covariance, or the principle that the laws of nature are to be invariant under arbitrary coordinate transformations. More precisely, what this means is that coordinate transformations are no longer required (as in the affine spaces of Newtonian mechanics and special relativity) to take straight lines to straight lines, but only to preserve the smoothness of curves (i.e. their differentiability). The general theory of relativity was intended to be a generally covariant account of spacetime, and its general covariance was intended to express the general relativity of motion. And the theory came into being because Einstein perceived a deep connection between this project and that of finding a relativistic theory of gravitation.

2.6 The Equivalence of Inertia and Gravity

The philosophical motivations and implications of Einstein's view are dealt with elsewhere. (See, for example, the entries on Einstein's philosophy of science; the hole argument; and early philosophical interpretations of general relativity.) We will consider here only the bearing of general relativity on the notion of an inertial frame. It is questionable whether Einstein succeeded in establishing the general relativity of motion, but it is clear that general relativity undermines the concept of inertial frame in important respects. This arises from the equivalence principle: that inertial mass—the quantity that enters into Newton's second law, and that is a measure of a body's resistance to acceleration—is equivalent to gravitational mass, the quantity that enters into Newton's law of universal gravitation. A more empirical way of expressing it is that all bodies fall with the same acceleration in the same gravitational field, or, the trajectory of a body in a given gravitational field will be independent of its mass and composition. This is the principle that Newton tested by constructing pendulums with wooden boxes as their bobs, which he would fill with different materials in order to see whether those differences made a difference to the speed of falling; they didn't. Eötvös made more precise tests in the late 19th century, and established the principle to much greater accuracy; these are the results on which Einstein would have relied. Newton also tested the principle for bodies whose masses differ greatly, by observing that Jupiter and its four moons all received precisely the same acceleration from the sun's gravitational field.

The equivalence principle suggests, however, that a freely-falling frame of reference is physically indistinguishable from an inertial frame. Newton had already noticed this, and indeed he stated it, more or less, in Corollary VI to the laws of motion:

If bodies are moving in any way whatsoever with respect to one another and are urged by equal accelerative forces along parallel lines, they will all continue to move with respect to one another in the same way as they would if they were not acted on by those forces. (1726, p. 423.)

For example, he was able to treat the system of Jupiter and its moons as if it were (nearly) at rest or moving uniformly in a straight line, because the attractive force of the sun acts (almost) equally on every part of the system. See Figure 9:

Figure 9: Newton's Corollary VI
What seem, within a given system, like equal and parallel accelerations may be, on a larger scale, unequal and converging on some distant massive object; e.g., the system of Jupiter and its moons is falling toward the sun, but “locally” the accelerations are very nearly equal and parallel, and may therefore be neglected.
Figure 9a Figure 9b

He even applied this reasoning to the entire solar system, in order to justify treating it as an isolated system: if there were any outside force acting on it, it must have been acting more or less equally and in parallel directions on all parts of the system.

It may be alleged that the sun and planets are impelled by some other force equally and in the direction of parallel lines; but by such a force (by Cor. VI of the Laws of Motion) no change would happen in the situation of the planets to one another, nor any sensible effect follow; but our business is with the causes of sensible effects. Let us, therefore, neglect every such force as imaginary and precarious, and of no use in the phenomena of the heavens….(1729, volume 2 p. 558)

Now, it is a familiar fact that in an orbiting spacecraft, bodies behave as if no forces were acting on any of them (as if they were “weightless”), because the attraction of the earth acts equally on all of them. But these phenomena are not, by themselves, evidence that no phenomena are capable of distinguishing an inertial frame from a falling frame. Einstein was willing to generalize the equivalence principle, and to conclude that the classical idea of a distinguished class of frames of reference has no physical basis. Any frame that we might regard as inertial might be, for all we can tell by experiment, in free fall. By the same token, any frame that is uniformly accelerating is indistinguishable from one that is at rest in a uniform gravitational field. Suppose that you are in a box at rest on the earth; you and everything in the box, by the equivalence principle, will be accelerated downward with the acceleration g (= 9.8 meters/second/second). Now suppose that the box itself is in empty, gravity-free space, but accelerating upward (i.e. in the direction of its roof) with the acceleration -g. Obviously, because of their inertia, bodies in the box, including your own, will exert the same force—have the same “weight”—on the floor as if the box were at rest and sitting on the earth.

2.7 The Equivalence Principle and General Covariance

To get a clearer idea of the physical significance of the equivalence principle, and its connection with general covariance, consider the Newtonian procedure for analyzing motion in the solar system, here sketched very roughly:

  1. Determine the accelerations of all the planets relative to the fixed stars.
  2. Using the laws of motion, their corollaries, and all the propositions proved from these in Book I of Principia, derive from the accelerations the forces needed to produce them; in particular, derive from the orbits the centers of those orbits, and the masses of the bodies needed to produce those forces. This crucially involves the law of action and reaction, for otherwise it would be impossible to break down the total acceleration of any planet into the components contributed by particular other planets; the earth's acceleration, for example, is the sum of its accelerations toward all the other planets, and each individual acceleration is part of an action-reaction pair involving some other planet.
  3. When we understand the mutual interactions among the planets, we are in a position to estimate their relative masses. In Newton's case, this was necessarily restricted to the planets with satellites, because only in those cases could he compare the accelerations they determine at given distances and so deduce the differences in mass. By this reasoning he estimated the ratios of the Sun's mass to those of Jupiter (1067 to 1), Saturn (3021 to 1), and the earth, and was able to calculate that the center of mass of the entire solar system would never be more than one solar diameter from the center of the Sun.
  4. Having found the center of mass, we have in principle determined an inertial frame: by Corollary IV to the laws of motion, the center of mass will be at rest or moving uniformly in a straight line. That is, the mutual actions of the bodies in the system will not change the state of motion of the center of mass. And having determined an inertial frame, we are in a position to say that the accelerations relative to the center of mass frame are the true accelerations.

One might think that the problem of relativity arises right from the start: the reliance on the fixed stars already seems to introduce an arbitrary assumption that threatens to vitiate Newton's procedure as an account of the true motions. But the framework of the fixed stars, initially just taken for granted, turns out to be justified in the course of the analysis. If it turns out that all the accelerations relative to the fixed stars can be analyzed into action-reaction pairs involving bodies within the system, leaving no “leftover” accelerations that need to be traced to some yet-unknown influence, then we can conclude that the stars are a suitable (sufficiently inertial) frame of reference after all. (By the later 19th century, observations became sufficiently precise to reveal that there is in fact a leftover acceleration, namely the famous extra precession of Mercury. But that could not affect Newton's analysis in 1687.) In contrast, had we chosen the earth as a frame of reference, we would find that there are accelerations relative to this frame—e.g. Coriolis and centrifugal accelerations—that don't satisfy the law of action and reaction.

2.8 The Extension of the Relativity Principle

The relativistic aspect of this situation arises from the equivalence principle. Newton's Corollary VI said that the inertial frame we construct by this procedure is effectively indistinguishable from one in which all the bodies are undergoing equal and parallel accelerations caused by some force that acts equally on all of them; the equivalence principle asserts that gravity is such a force. In following the Newtonian procedure for constructing an inertial frame, we have constructed a frame which might be, for all we can determine empirically, falling in the gravitational field of some other system. Here again, as in his use of Corollary V, we can see that Newton was being remarkably circumspect about his frame of reference: he needed to show that his analysis of the forces at work, and his conclusion about the nearly-heliocentric structure of the system, are not affected by any unknown forces acting on the system as a whole, and his appeal to Corollary VI precisely satisfies this need. By the same token, however, the accelerations relative to this frame cannot be known to be the “true accelerations”; they may be accelerations relative to a freely-falling trajectory just in case the center of mass is itself freely falling, in which case they have to be added to the gravitational acceleration of the center of mass before we can arrive at the true accelerations. But the acceleration of the center of mass may have to be added to some larger acceleration—and so on. This means that we can't know the true strength of the gravitational field by observing the motions in this frame. The only hope of doing so would be to include all the mass in the universe in one dynamical system; if we knew the center of mass of the entire universe, we could rule out the possibility that something else is exerting an accelerative force, since by hypothesis there would be nothing else. 

We can see the significance of this more clearly by looking at the equations of motion (in a very simplified form). Newton's equation of motion for a particle subject to no force asserts that it moves uniformly, with zero acceleration. Obviously, in a gravitational field, the particle's acceleration will depend on the field. In effect, we are accounting for the trajectory of the falling particle by “decomposing” it into two parts, the part determined by its natural tendency to move uniformly in a straight line, and the part contributed by the gravitational field. But by the analysis of the equivalence principle, determining the inertial part—and therefore determining the gravitational part—depends on our assumption that the center of mass frame is inertial rather than freely falling. And this assumption is arbitrary; that is, it amounts to an arbitrary choice of the coordinate system in which we define the equation of inertial motion. This implies that the gravitational field depends on the coordinate system in precisely the same way.

The principle of general covariance, then, acquires its physical significance in conjunction with the equivalence principle. By itself, it says that the geometrical structures of spacetime don't depend on the coordinates in which we express them, or on the set of points that we may think comprises spacetime. This is an important principle, but it doesn't recommend general relativity over other theories, since special relativity and Newtonian mechanics also involve spacetime structures that can be defined in a generally-covariant way, through the same kinds of coordinate-independent mathematical objects that we use in general relativity. Combined with the equivalence principle, however, it implies that a central Newtonian idea—that gravity is a force causing deviations from uniform rectilinear motion—is based on an arbitrary choice of coordinates. For a trajectory that satisfies all empirical criteria for being inertial in a particular frame of reference—e.g. the trajectory of the center of mass in our example—may be freely falling relative to some other trajectory that satisfies the same criteria. By contrast, a freely-falling trajectory is a freely falling trajectory in any coordinate system; it is only the decomposition of it into its inertial and gravitational parts that will be different in different coordinate systems.

2.9 From Inertial Frames to Curved Spacetime

General covariance is thus not an argument against privileged states of motion, as Einstein had hoped it would be. It is an argument that the privileged states of motion should not be mere artifacts of our choice of coordinates, i.e. that they should be coordinate-independent. Precisely what this means depends, then, on what physical means we have at our disposal to identify states of motion other than by simply setting down coordinates. Combined with the equivalence principle, it is an argument for regarding gravitational free-fall as the privileged state of motion, rather than as a forced deviation from the privileged state of motion. And in this way it provides an argument for spacetime curvature. As we saw, in Newtonian and Minkowski spacetime the inertial trajectories are, by definition, the straight lines or geodesics of spacetime. And the flatness of spacetime consists in the fact that these geodesics behave like straight lines in a flat space or surface: parallel geodesics remain parallel, and non-parallel geodesics do not accelerate relative to one another. (In any inertial frame, the motion of any other inertial frame appears uniform.) By the equivalence principle, however, free-fall trajectories satisfy all empirical criteria for being inertial trajectories, and so the distinction between the two types of trajectory depends on the mere choice of coordinates. General covariance suggests, then, that the free-fall trajectories ought to be identified as the inertial trajectories—and therefore, as the geodesics of spacetime. But if free-fall trajectories are the geodesics of spacetime, then spacetime is curved. For the free-fall trajectories exhibit relative accelerations, and the relative acceleration of geodesics is a defining characteristic of curved geometry. The curvature of the earth's surface, for example, is revealed in the fact that geodesics that begin in parallel directions can begin to approach one another—for example, two lines of longitude can both be perpendicular to the equator, but converge on one another as they approach the poles. And since the relative accelerations of falling bodies depend on the distribution of mass, as we already knew from Newton's theory, we now conclude not only that spacetime is curved, but that its curvature is determined by the distribution of mass. (For further explanation see Geroch 1978.)

The curvature of spacetime, finally, determines the status of inertial frames in general relativity. The statement that all reference-frames, rather than just inertial frames, are equivalent is a misleading way of describing the situation; rather, the variable curvature of spacetime makes the imposition of a global inertial frame impossible. So the status of the latter is like the status of a plane rectangular coordinate system on the surface of the earth. Over a sufficiently small area, the coordinate plane may be a good approximation to the surface, but over increasingly large areas it diverges increasingly from the contours of the earth. And if two such coordinate systems, with their origins at different points on the earth, are extended until they meet, they will be seen to be “disoriented” relative to one another. In contrast, a flat plane can be so coordinatized, and coordinate systems originating at different points can be smoothly combined into one system. Similarly, in the affine spaces of Newtonian and special-relativistic physics, any inertial coordinate system can be extended over the whole of spacetime. And in any system so extended, the trajectory of every other inertial observer will be a uniform rectilinear motion. But if spacetime is variably curved, according to the distribution of mass and energy, local inertial systems will be “disoriented” relative to one another; indeed, the degree of this “disorientation” is one of the measures of curvature. And an inertially-moving—i.e. freely falling—particle will in that case be accelerating in the local inertial system of another freely-falling particle. Thus there are inertial trajectories, but no extended inertial systems. See Figures 10–13:

Figure 10:
This Cartesian coordinate system can evidently be simply “set down” over the plane below. Any coordinate system defined at any point of the plane can be smoothly extended over the entire plane.
Figure 10
Figure 11: “Magnified” View of Flat “Local” Coordinate Systems on a Curved Surface
Figure 11
This arbitrary curved surface won't allow for the global laying down of a coordinate system, but must be coordinatized in small overlapping pieces, which generally won't be parallel to one another.
Figure 12:
In a flat spacetime, the rest-frame of any inertial observer an be “extended” over all of spacetime in such a way that, in this global inertial frame, the trajectory of every other inertial observer will be an inertial trajectory.
Figure 12
Figure 13:
In a curved spacetime, inertial trajectories will be relatively accelerated; indeed the relative acceleration of geodesics is a measure of curvature. Therefore the local inertial frame of any freely-falling observer cannot be extended into a global frame in which all other inertial observers are moving uniformly. The inertial frames of different freely-falling observers will be, like local coordinate systems on a curved surface, “disoriented” relative to one another.
Figure 13

One could try to express this idea with Einstein's remark about the need to “free oneself from the idea that coordinates must have an immediate metrical meaning.” (Einstein 1949, p. 67.)But even this might be misleading. Einstein evidently was thinking that, in general relativity, coordinates, and coordinate transformations, no longer represent the possible displacements of rigid bodies or the transport of ideal clocks. The insight underlying this is that the notion of rigid displacement—therefore of rigid coordinate system, and inertial frame—imposes a priori a degree of uniformity, or symmetry, on spacetime; the displacement of bodies without change of dimension, and the transport of an ideal clock without distortion of time-intervals, requires a homogeneous space. And so rigid displacement cannot be a basic principle in a theory in which spacetime curvature varies according to the distribution of mass and energy. The possibility of a rigid displacement, and therefore the existence of an inertial frame, can only arise a posteriori, as the result of a peculiar distribution of mass-energy (for example, in a universe empty of mass and energy, or with a highly symmetrical distribution). The serious defect in the notion of inertial frame is not that it makes an arbitrary distinction among coordinate systems—for the distinction is quite as genuine as the distinction between flat and curved spacetime—but that it extends indefinitely over spacetime a structure that, in our universe, only corresponds approximately to very small regions.


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Einstein, Albert: philosophy of science | general relativity: early philosophical interpretations of | geometry: in the 19th century | space and time: conventionality of simultaneity | space and time: the hole argument