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The Traditional Square of Opposition

First published Fri Aug 8, 1997; substantive revision Sun Oct 1, 2006

This entry traces the historical development of the Square of Opposition, a collection of logical relationships traditionally embodied in a square diagram. This body of doctrine provided a foundation for work in logic for over two millenia. For most of this history, logicians assumed that negative particular propositions ("Some S is not P") are vacuously true if their subjects are empty. This validates the logical laws embodied in the diagram, and preserves the doctrine against modern criticisms. Certain additional principles ("contraposition" and "obversion") were sometimes adopted along with the Square, and they genuinely yielded inconsistency. By the nineteenth century an inconsistent set of doctrines was widely adopted. Strawson's 1952 attempt to rehabilitate the Square does not apply to the traditional doctrine; it does salvage the nineteenth century version but at the cost of yielding inferences that lead from truth to falsity when strung together.

1. Introduction

The doctrine of the square of opposition originated with Aristotle in the fourth century BC and has occurred in logic texts ever since. Although severely criticized in recent decades, it is still regularly referred to. The point of this entry is to trace its history from the vantage point of the end of the twentieth century, along with closely related doctrines bearing on empty terms.

The square of opposition is a group of theses embodied in a diagram. The diagram is not essential to the theses; it is just a useful way to keep them straight. The theses concern logical relations among four logical forms:

A Every S is P Universal Affirmative
E No S is P Universal Negative
I Some S is P Particular Affirmative
O Some S is not P Particular Negative

The diagram for the traditional square of opposition is:

traditional square

The theses embodied in this diagram I call ‘SQUARE’. They are:


These theses were supplemented with the following explanations:

Probably nobody before the twentieth century ever held exactly these views without holding certain closely linked ones as well. The most common closely linked view that is associated with the traditional diagram is that the E and I propositions convert simply; that is, ‘No S is P’ is equivalent in truth value to ‘No P is S’, and ‘Some S is P’ is equivalent in truth value to ‘Some P is S’. The traditional doctrine supplemented with simple conversion is a very natural view to discuss. It is Aristotle's view, and it was apparently endorsed (or at least not challenged) by everyone who wrote on this topic before the 19th century. I call this total body of doctrine ‘[SQUARE]’:

[SQUARE] =df SQUARE + "the E and I forms convert simply"


A proposition converts simply iff it is necessarily equivalent in truth value to the proposition you get by interchanging its terms.

So [SQUARE] includes the relations illustrated in the diagram plus the view that ‘No S is P’ is equivalent to ‘No P is S’, and the view that ‘Some S is P’ is equivalent to ‘Some P is S’.

1.1 The Modern Revision of the Square

Most contemporary logic texts symbolize the traditional forms as follows:

Every S is P x(SxPx)
No S is P x(Sx → ¬Px)
Some S is P x(Sx & Px)
Some S is not P x(Sx & ¬Px)

If this symbolization is adopted along with standard views about the logic of connectives and quantifiers, the relations embodied in the traditional square mostly disappear. The modern diagram looks like this:


modern revised square

This has too little structure to be particularly useful, and so it is not commonly used. According to Alonzo Church, this modern view probably originated sometime in the late nineteenth century.[1] This representation of the four forms is now generally accepted, except for qualms about the loss of subalternation in the left-hand column. Most English speakers tend to understand ‘Every S is P’ as requiring for its truth that there be some Ss, and if that requirement is imposed, then subalternation holds for affirmative propositions. Every modern logic text must address the apparent implausibility of letting ‘Every S is P’ be true when there are no Ss. The common defense of this is usually that this is a logical notation devised for purposes of logic, and it does not claim to capture every nuance of the natural language forms that the symbols resemble. So perhaps ‘∀x(SxPx)’ does fail to do complete justice to ordinary usage of ‘Every S is P’, but this is not a problem with the logic. If you think that ‘Every S is P’ requires for its truth that there be Ss, then you can have that result simply and easily: just represent the recalcitrant uses of ‘Every S is P’ in symbolic notation by adding an extra conjunct to the symbolization, like this: ∀x(SxPx) & ∃xSx.

This defense leaves logic intact and also meets the objection, which is not a logical objection, but merely a reservation about the representation of natural language.

Authors typically go on to explain that we often wish to make generalizations in science when we are unsure of whether or not they have instances, and sometimes even when we know they do not, and they sometimes use this as a defense of symbolizing the A form so as to allow it to be vacuously true. This is, however, an argument from convenience of notation, and does not bear on logical coherence.

1.2 The Argument Against the Traditional Square

Why does the traditional square need revising at all? The argument is a simple one:[2]

Suppose that ‘S’ is an empty term; it is true of nothing. Then the I form: ‘Some S is P’ is false. But then its contradictory E form: ‘No S is P’ must be true. But then the subaltern O form: ‘Some S is not P’ must be true. But that is wrong, since there aren't any Ss.

The puzzle about this argument is why the doctrine of the traditional square was maintained for well over 20 centuries in the face of this consideration. Were 20 centuries of logicians so obtuse as not to have noticed this apparently fatal flaw? Or is there some other explanation?

One possibility is that logicians previous to the 20th century must have thought that no terms are empty. You see this view referred to frequently as one that others held.[3] But with a few very special exceptions (discussed below) I have been unable to find anyone who held such a view before the nineteenth century. Many authors do not discuss empty terms, but those who do typically take their presence for granted. Explicitly rejecting empty terms was never a mainstream option, even in the nineteenth century.

In fact, the traditional doctrine of [SQUARE] is completely coherent in the presence of empty terms. This is because on the traditional interpretation, the O form lacks existential import. The O form is (vacuously) true if its subject term is empty, not false, and thus the logical interrelations of [SQUARE] are unobjectionable. In what follows, I trace the development of this view.

2. Origin of the Square of Opposition

The doctrine that I call [SQUARE], occurs in Aristotle. It begins in De Interpretatione 6–7, which contains three claims: that A and O are contradictories, that E and I are contradictories, and that A and E are contraries (17b.17–26):

I call an affirmation and a negation contradictory opposites when what one signifies universally the other signifies not universally, e.g. every man is white—not every man is white, no man is white—some man is white. But I call the universal affirmation and the universal negation contrary opposites, e.g. every man is just—no man is just. So these cannot be true together, but their opposites may both be true with respect to the same thing, e.g. not every man is white—some man is white.

This gives us the following fragment of the square:

square fragment

But the rest is there by implication. For example, there is enough to show that I and O are subcontraries: they cannot both be false. For suppose that I is false. Then its contradictory, E, is true. So E's contrary, A, is false. So A's contradictory, O, is true. This refutes the possibility that I and O are both false, and thus fills in the bottom relation of subcontraries. Subalternation also follows. Suppose that the A form is true. Then its contrary E form must be false. But then the E form's contradictory, I, must be true. Thus if the A form is true, so must be the I form. A parallel argument establishes subalternation from E to O as well. The result is SQUARE.

In Prior Analytics I.2, 25a.1–25 we get the additional claims that the E and I propositions convert simply. Putting this together with the doctrine of De Interpretatione we have the full [SQUARE].[4]

2.1 The Diagram

The diagram accompanying and illustrating the doctrine shows up already in the second century CE Boethius incorporated it into his writing, and it passed down through the dark ages to the high medieval period, and from thence to today. Diagrams of this sort were popular among late classical and medieval authors, who used them for a variety of purposes. (Similar diagrams for modal propositions were especially popular.)

2.2 Aristotle's Formulation of the O Form

Ackrill's translation contains something a bit remarkable: Aristotle's articulation of the O form is not the familiar ‘Some S is not P’ or one of its variants; it is rather ‘Not every S is P’. With this wording, Aristotle's doctrine automatically escapes the modern criticism. (This holds for his views throughout De Interpretatione.[5]) For assume again that ‘S’ is an empty term, and suppose that this makes the I form ‘Some S is P’ false. Its contradictory, the E form: ‘No S is P’, is thus true, and this entails the O form in Aristotle's formulation: ‘Not every S is P’, which must therefore be true. When the O form was worded ‘Some S is not P’ this bothered us, but with it worded ‘Not every S is P’ it seems plainly right. Recall that we are granting that ‘Every S is P’ has existential import, and so if ‘S’ is empty the A form must be false. But then ‘Not every S is Pshould be true, as Aristotle's square requires.

On this view affirmatives have existential import, and negatives do not—a point that became elevated to a general principle in late medieval times.[6] The ancients thus did not see the incoherence of the square as formulated by Aristotle because there was no incoherence to see.

2.3 The Rewording of the O Form

Aristotle's work was made available to the Latin west principally via Boethius's translations and commentaries, written a bit after 500 CE. In his translation of De interpretatione, Boethius preserves Aristotle's wording of the O form as "Not every man is white." But when Boethius comments on this text he illustrates Aristotle's doctrine with the now-famous diagram, and he uses the wording ‘Some man is not just’.[7] So this must have seemed to him to be a natural equivalent in Latin. It looks odd to us in English, but he wasn't bothered by it.

Early in the twelfth century Abelard objected to Boethius's rewording of the O form,[8] but Abelard's writing was not widely influential, and except for him and some of his followers people regularly used ‘Some S is not P’ for the O form in the diagram that represents the square. Did they allow the O form to be vacuously true? Perhaps we can get some clues to how medieval writers interpreted these forms by looking at other doctrines they endorsed. These are the theory of the syllogism and the doctrines of contraposition and obversion.

3. The (Ir)relevance of Syllogistic

One central concern of the Aristotelian tradition in logic is the theory of the categorical syllogism. This is the theory of two-premised arguments in which the premises and conclusion share three terms among them, with each proposition containing two of them. It is distinctive of this enterprise that everybody agrees on which syllogisms are valid. The theory of the syllogism partly constrains the interpretation of the forms. For example, it determines that the A form has existential import, at least if the I form does. For one of the valid patterns (Barbari[9]) is:

Every B is C
Every A is B
So, some A is C

This is invalid if the A form lacks existential import, and valid if it has existential import. It is held to be valid, and so we know how the A form is to be interpreted. One then naturally asks about the O form; what do the syllogisms tell us about it? The answer is that they tell us nothing beyond the fact that the O form is entailed by the E form. This lack of an answer is a fluke, resulting from the restrictions on what counts as a categorical syllogism; cases that would clearly decide the issue are not well-formed categorical syllogisms. At most, the theory confirms what we already know from SQUARE: that truth of the E form entails truth of the O form. And so if you are sure that the E form lacks such import, the O form must also lack it. Syllogistic gets us no further than this, though it does confirm that this body of theory nicely coheres with the lack of existential import of the O form.

4. The Principles of Contraposition and Obversion

One other piece of subject-matter bears on the interpretation of the O form. People were interested in Aristotle's discussion of "infinite" negation,[10] which is the use of negation to form a term from a term instead of a proposition from a proposition. In modern English we use "non" for this; we make "non-horse," which is true of exactly those things that are not horses. In medieval Latin "non" and "not" are the same word, and so the distinction required special discussion. It became common to use infinite negation, and logicians pondered its logic. Some writers in the twelfth and thirteenth centuries adopted a principle called "conversion by contraposition." It states that

Unfortunately, this principle (which is not endorsed by Aristotle[11]) conflicts with the idea that there may be empty or universal terms. For in the universal case it leads directly from the truth:

Every man is a being

to the falsehood:

Every non-being is a non-man

(which is false because the universal affirmative has existential import, and there are no non-beings). And in the particular case it leads from the truth (remember that the O form has no existential import):

A chimera is not a man

to the falsehood:

A non-man is not a non-chimera

These are Buridan's examples, used in the fourteenth century to show the invalidity of contraposition. Unfortunately, by Buridan's time the principle of contraposition had been advocated by a number of authors. The doctrine is already present in several twelfth century tracts,[12] and it is endorsed in the thirteenth century by Peter of Spain,[13] whose work was republished for centuries, and by William Sherwood.[14] By the fourteenth century, problems associated with contraposition seem to be well-known, and authors generally cite the principle and note that it is not valid, but that it becomes valid with an additional assumption of existence of things falling under the subject term. For example, Paul of Venice in his eclectic and widely published Logica Parva from the end of the fourteenth century gives the traditional square with simple conversion[15] but rejects conversion by contraposition, essentially for Buridan's reason.

A similar thing happened with the principle of obversion. This is the principle that states that you can change a proposition from affirmative to negative, or vice versa, if you change the predicate term from finite to infinite (or infinite to finite). Some examples are:

Every S is P = No S is non-P
No S is P = Every S is non-P
Some S is P = Some S is not non-P
Some S is not P = Some S is non-P

Aristotle discussed some instances of obversion in De Interpretatione. It is apparent, given the truth conditions for the forms, that these inferences are valid when moving from affirmative to negative, but not in the reverse direction when the terms may be empty, as Buridan makes clear.[16] Some medieval writers before Buridan accepted the fallacious versions, and some did not.[17]

5. Later Developments

In Paul of Venice's other major work, the Logica Magna (circa 1400), he gives some pertinent examples of particular negative propositions that follow from true universal negatives. His examples of true particular negatives with patently empty subject terms are these:[18]

Some man who is a donkey is not a donkey.

What is different from being is not.

Some thing willed against by a chimera is not willed against by a chimera.

A chimera does not exist.

Some man whom a donkey has begotten is not his son.

So by the end of the 14th century the problem of empty terms was clearly recognized. They were permitted in the theory, the O form definitely did not have existential import, and the logical theory, stripped of the incorrect special cases of contraposition and obversion, was coherent and immune to 20th century criticism.

Work on logic continued for the next couple of centuries, though most of it was lost and had little influence. But the topic of empty terms was squarely faced, and all solutions that were given within the Medieval tradition were consistent with [SQUARE]. I rely here on Ashworth 1974, 201–02, who reports the most common themes in the context of post-medieval discussions of contraposition. One theme is that contraposition is invalid when applied to universal or empty terms, for the sorts of reasons given by Buridan. The O form is explicitly held to lack existential import. A second theme, which Ashworth says was the most usual thing to say, is also found in Buridan: additional inferences, such as contraposition, become valid when supplemented by an additional premise asserting that the terms in question are non-empty.

5.1 An Oddity

There is one odd view that occurs at least twice, which may have as a consequence that there are no empty terms. In the thirteenth century, Lambert of Auxerre proposed that a term such as ‘chimera’ which stands for no existing thing must "revert to nonexistent things." So if we suppose that no roses exist, then the term ‘rose’ stands for nonexistent things.[19] A related view also occurs much later; Ashworth reports that Menghus Blanchellus Faventinus held that term negations such as ‘nonman’ are true of non-beings, and he concluded from this that ‘A nonman is a chimera’ is true (apparently assuming that ‘chimera’ is also true of nonbeings).[20] However, neither of these views seems to have been clearly developed, and neither was widely adopted (or even widely discussed).[21] Nor is it even clear that either of them is supposed to have the consequence that there are no empty terms.

5.2 Modern, Renaissance, and Nineteenth Centuries

According to Ashworth,[22] serious and sophisticated investigation of logic ended at about the third decade of the sixteenth century. The Port Royal Logic of the following (seventeenth) century seems typical in its approach: its authors frequently suggest that logic is trivial and unimportant. Its doctrine includes that of the square of opposition, but the discussion of the O form is so vague that nobody could pin down its exact truth conditions, and there is certainly no awareness indicated of problems of existential import. This seems to typify popular texts for the next while. In the nineteenth century, the apparently most widely used textbook in Britain and America was Whately's Elements of Logic. Whately gives the traditional doctrine of the square, without any discussion of issues of existential import or of empty terms. He includes the problematic principles of contraposition (which he calls "conversion by negation"):

Every S is P = Every not-P is not-S
No S is P = No not-P is not-S

He also endorses obversion:[23]

He says that this principle is "not found in Aldrich," but that it is "in frequent use."[24] This "frequent use" continued; later nineteenth and early twentieth century text books in England and America continued to endorse obversion (also called "infinitation" or "permutation"), and contraposition (also called "illative conversion").[25] This full nineteenth century tradition is consistent only on the assumption that empty (and universal) terms are prohibited, but authors seem unaware of this; Keynes 1928, 126, says generously "This assumption appears to have been made implicitly in the traditional treatment of logic." De Morgan is atypical in making the assumption explicit: in his 1847 text (64) he forbids universal terms (empty terms disappear by implication because if A is empty, non-A will be universal), and in his technical 1860 work he justifies this limitation on the grounds that universal terms are "needless" (16).[26]

In the twentieth century Łukasiewicz also developed a version of syllogistic that depends explicitly on the absence of empty terms; he attributed the system to Aristotle, thus helping to foster the tradition according to which the ancients were unaware of empty terms.

Today, logic texts divide between those based on contemporary logic and those from the Aristotelian tradition or the nineteenth century tradition, but even many texts that teach syllogistic teach it with the forms interpreted in the modern way, so that e.g. subalternation is lost. So the traditional square, as traditionally interpreted, is now mostly abandoned.

6. Strawson's Defense

In the twentieth century there were many creative uses of logical tools and techniques in reassessing past doctrines. One might naturally wonder if there is some ingenious interpretation of the square that attributes existential import to the O form and makes sense of it all without forbidding empty or universal terms, thus reconciling traditional doctrine with modern views. Peter Geach, 1970, 62–64, shows that this can be done using an unnatural interpretation. Peter Strawson, 1952, 176–78, had a more ambitious goal. Strawson's idea was to justify the square by adopting a nonclassical view of truth of statements, and by redefining the logical relation of validity. First, he suggested, we need to suppose that a proposition whose subject term is empty is neither true nor false, but lacks truth value altogether. Then we say that Q entails R just in case there are no instances of Q and R such that the instance of Q is true and the instance of R is false. For example, the A form ‘Every S is P’ entails the I form ‘Some S is P’ because there is no instance of the A form that is true when the corresponding instance of the I form is false. The troublesome cases involving empty terms turn out to be instances in which one or both forms lack truth value, and these are irrelevant so far as entailment is concerned. With this revised account of entailment, all of the "traditional" logical relations result, if they are worded as follows:

Contradictories: The A and O forms entail each other's negations, as do the E and I forms. The negation of the A form entails the (unnegated) O form, and vice versa; likewise for the E and I forms.
Contraries: The A and E forms entail each other's negations
Subcontraries: The negation of the I form entails the (unnegated) E form, and vice versa.
Subalternation: The A form entails the I form, and the E form entails the O form.
Converses: The E and I forms each entail their own converses.
Contraposition: The A and O forms each entail their own contrapositives.
Obverses: Each form entails its own obverse.

These doctrines are not, however, the doctrines of [SQUARE]. The doctrines of [SQUARE] are worded entirely in terms of the possibilities of truth values, not in terms of entailment. So "entailment" is irrelevant to [SQUARE]. It turns out that Strawson's revision of truth conditions does preserve the principles of SQUARE (these can easily be checked by cases),[27] but not the additional conversion principles of [SQUARE], and also not the traditional principles of contraposition or obversion. For example, Strawson's reinterpreted version of conversion holds for the I form because any I form proposition entails its own converse: if ‘Some A is B’ and ‘Some B is A’ both have truth value, then neither has an empty subject term, and so if neither lack truth value and if either is true the other will be true as well. But the original doctrine of conversion says that an I form and its converse always have the same truth value, and that is false on Strawson's account; if there are As but no Bs, then ‘Some A is B’ is false and ‘Some B is A’ has no truth value at all. Similar results follow for contraposition and obversion.

The "traditional logic" that Strawson discusses is much closer to that of nineteenth century logic texts than it is to the version that held sway for two millennia before that.[28] But even though he literally salvages a version of nineteenth century logic, the view he saves is unable to serve the purposes for which logical principles are formulated, as was pointed out by Timothy Smiley in a short note in Mind in 1967.[29] People have always taken the square to embody principles by which one can reason, and by which one can construct extended chains of reasoning. But if you string together Strawson's entailments you can infer falsehoods from truths, something that nobody in any tradition would consider legitimate. For example, begin with this truth (the subject term is non-empty):

No man is a chimera.

By conversion, we get:

No chimera is a man.

By obversion:

Every chimera is a non-man.

By subalternation:

Some chimera is a non-man.

By conversion:

Some non-man is a chimera.

Since there are non-men, the conclusion is not truth-valueless, and since there are no chimeras it is false. Thus we have passed from a true claim to a false one. (The example does not even involve the problematic O form.) All steps are validated by Strawson's doctrine. So Strawson reaches his goal of preserving certain patterns commonly identified as constituting traditional logic, but at the cost of sacrificing the application of logic to extended reasoning.


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Aristotle, General Topics: logic | Brentano, Franz: theory of judgement | contradiction | syllogism: medieval theories of | terms, properties of: medieval theories of