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Teleological Arguments for God's Existence

First published Fri Jun 10, 2005

Some phenomena within nature exhibit such exquisiteness of structure, function or interconnectedness that many people have found it natural—if not inescapable—to see a deliberative and directive mind behind those phenomena. The mind in question, being prior to nature itself, is typically taken to be supernatural. Philosophically inclined thinkers have both historically and at present labored to shape the relevant intuition into a more formal, logically rigorous inference. The resultant theistic arguments, in their various logical forms, share a focus on plan, purpose, intention and design, and are thus classified as teleological arguments (or, frequently, as arguments from or to design).

Although enjoying some prominent defenders over the centuries, such arguments have also attracted serious criticisms from a number of major historical and contemporary thinkers. Both critics and advocates are found not only among philosophers, but come from scientific and other disciplines as well. In the following discussion, major variant forms of teleological arguments will be distinguished and explored, traditional philosophical and other criticisms will be discussed, and the most prominent contemporary turns (cosmic fine tuning arguments, many-worlds theories, and the present Intelligent Design debate) will be tracked. Discussion will conclude with a brief look at one historically important non-inferential approach to the issue.

1. Introduction

It is not uncommon for humans to find themselves with the intuition that random, unplanned, unexplained accident just couldn't produce the order, beauty, elegance, and seeming purpose that we experience in the natural world around us. As Hume's interlocutor Cleanthes put it, we seem to see “the image of mind reflected on us from innumerable objects” in nature. (Hume 1779 [1998], 35). And many people find themselves convinced that no explanation for that mind-resonance which fails to acknowledge a causal role for intelligence, intent and purpose in nature can be seriously plausible.

Cosmological arguments begin with the bare fact that there are contingently existing things and end with conclusions concerning the existence of a maker with the power to account for the existence of those contingent things. Teleological arguments (or arguments from design) by contrast begin with a much more specialized catalogue of properties and end with a conclusion concerning the existence of a designer with the intellectual properties (knowledge, purpose, understanding, foresight, wisdom, intention) necessary to design the things exhibiting the special properties in question. In broad outline, then, teleological arguments focus upon finding and identifying various traces of the operation of a mind in nature's temporal and physical structures, behaviors and paths. Order of some significant type is usually the starting point of design arguments. Various advocates have focused on different types, levels and instances of order, have suggested different logical connections between order, design and designer and have pursued different levels of rigor—from Bayesian formalisms to the deadly serious whimsy of G.K. Chesterton:

So one elephant having a trunk was odd; but all elephants having trunks looked like a plot. (Chesterton 1908, 106–7)

Design-type arguments are largely unproblematic when based upon things nature clearly could not or would not produce (e.g., most human artifacts), or when the intelligent agency is itself ‘natural’ (human, alien, etc.). Identifying designed traces of ‘lost’ human civilizations or even non-human civilizations (Alpha Centaurian, say, via SETI) could in principle be uncontroversial or even nearly trivial. If we are confronted with something which nature unaided by an intelligence truly could not or would not produce (e.g., a DVD player), a design conclusion of some sort is very nearly inescapable. The unproblematic nature of such arguments has often been appropriated as a foundation for analogous inferences concerning (things in) nature. But in cases involving design in (or of) nature itself inferences are more problematic. Things actually in nature presumably are among those things which nature could or would produce, the intelligence in question would typically presumably not be within nature, and our everyday types of design inferences would appear to be wide of the mark.

But despite the variety of spirited critical attacks they have elicited, design arguments have historically had and continue to have widespread intuitive appeal—indeed, it is sometimes claimed that design arguments are the most persuasive of all purely philosophical theistic arguments.

2. Design Inference Patterns

The historical arguments of interest are precisely the potentially problematic ones—inferences beginning with some empirical features of nature taken as (or argued to be) design-indicative, and concluding with the designedness of, and a designer of, the phenomena in question. A standard but separable second step—the natural theology step—involves identifying the designer as God, often via particular properties and powers required by the designing in question. Although the argument wielded its greatest intellectual influence during the 18th and early 19th centuries, it goes back at least to the Greeks and in extremely clipped form comprises one of Aquinas's Five Ways. It was given a fuller and quite nice early statement by Hume's interlocutor Cleanthes:

Look round the world; contemplate the whole and every part of it: You will find it to be nothing but one great machine, subdivided into an infinite number of lesser machines, which again admit of subdivisions to a degree beyond what human senses and faculties can trace and explain. All these various machines, and even their most minute parts, are adjusted to each other with an accuracy which ravishes into admiration all men who have ever contemplated them. The curious adapting of means to ends, throughout all nature, resembles exactly, though it much exceeds, the productions of human contrivance; of human design, thought, wisdom, and intelligence. Since, therefore, the effects resemble each other, we are led to infer, by all the rules of analogy, that the causes also resemble; and that the Author of Nature is somewhat similar to the mind of man, though possessed of much larger faculties, proportioned to the grandeur of the work which he has executed. By this argument a posteriori, and by this argument alone, do we prove at once the existence of a Deity, and his similarity to human mind and intelligence. (Hume 1779 [1998], 15).

That statement captures much of popular, informal design intuitions, but exactly how ought we to construe the formal structure of such arguments? What sort of logic is being employed? As it turns out, that question does not have just a single answer. Several distinct answers are canvassed in the following sections.

2.1 Analogical Design Arguments: Schema 1

Design arguments are routinely classed as analogical arguments—various parallels between human artifacts and certain natural entities being taken as supporting parallel conclusions concerning operative causation in each case. (Note that Cleanthes, above, specifically appeals to “the rules of analogy.”) The standardly ascribed schema is roughly thus:

Schema 1:

(1) Entity e within nature (or the cosmos, or nature itself) is like specified human artifact a (e.g., a machine) in relevant respects R.
(2) a has R precisely because it is a product of deliberate design by intelligent human agency.
(3) Like effects typically have like causes (or like explanations, like existence requirements, etc.)


(4) It is (highly) probable that e has R precisely because it too is a product of deliberate design by intelligent, relevantly human-like agency.

(The relevant respects and properties R are referred to variously as teleological properties or as marks or signs of design, and objects having such properties are sometimes referred to as teleological objects. For simplicity and uniformity of discussion, I shall simply talk in terms of “Rs”.)

2.1.1 Humean objections

This general argument form was criticized quite vigorously (and familiarly) by Hume, at several key steps. (Hume's primary critical discussion is contained in (Hume 1779 [1998]). Hume's responses are widely taken as the paradigm philosophical refutation of traditional design arguments.) Against (1), Hume argued that the analogy is not very good—that nature and the various things in it are not very like human artifacts and exhibit substantial differences from them—e.g., living vs. not, self-sustaining vs. not. Indeed, whereas advocates of design arguments frequently cited similarities between the cosmos on the one hand and human machines on the other, Hume suggested (tongue perhaps only partly in cheek) that the cosmos much more closely resembled a living organism than a machine. But if the alleged resemblance is in relevant respects distant, then the inference in question will be logically fragile. And while (2) may be true in specific cases of human artifacts a, that fact is only made relevant to natural phenomena e via (3), which underpins the transfer of the key attribution. Against (3), Hume argued that any number of alternative possible explanations could be given of allegedly designed entities in nature—chance, for instance, or saturation of the relevant state space of possibilities. Thus, even were (1) true and even were there important resemblances, the argument would confer little probabilistic force onto the conclusion.

More generally, Hume also argued that even if something like the stated conclusion (4) were established, that left the arguer far from anything like a traditional conception of God. For instance, natural evils or apparently suboptimal designs might suggest e.g., an amateur designer or a committee of designers. And if phenomena instrumental to the production of natural evils (e.g., disease microorganisms) exhibited various of the Rs, then they would presumably have to be laid at the designer's door, further eroding the designer's resemblance to the wholly good deity of tradition. And even the most impressive empirical data could properly establish only finite (although perhaps enormous) power and wisdom, rather than the infinite power and wisdom usually associated with divinity. But even were one to concede some substance to the design arguments's conclusion, that would, Hume suggested, merely set up a regress. The designing agent would itself demand explanation, requiring ultimately a sequence of prior analogous intelligences producing intelligences. And even were the existence of a designer of material things established, that did not yet automatically establish the existence of a creator of the matter so shaped. And of course the argument being inductive, the conclusion even if established would be established only to some, perhaps insignificant, degree of probability. Furthermore, we could not ground any induction concerning the cosmos itself upon a requisite fund of experiences of other cosmoi found to be both deliberately designed and very like ours in relevant respects—for the simple reason that this was the only one we had (or could) experience. And the fraction of this one cosmos (both spatially and temporally) available to our inspection was more or less indistinguishable from zero—not a promising basis for a cosmically general conclusion. Hume concluded that while the argument might constitute some limited grounds for thinking that “the cause or causes of order in the universe probably bear some remote analogy to human intelligence” (Hume 1779 [1998], 88) Hume's emphasis)—and that is not a trivial implication—it established nothing else whatever.

Historically, not everyone agreed that Hume had fatally damaged the argument. For one thing, some of Hume's criticisms rested upon his own peculiar conception of causation—a conception nearly universally recognized as seriously inadequate. Further it is simply not true that explanatory inferences cannot properly extend beyond merely what is required for known effects. As a very general example, on the basis of the few observations which humans had made during a cosmically brief period in a spatially tiny part of the cosmos, Newton theorized that all bits of matter at all times and in all places attracted all other bits of matter. There was nothing whatever logically suspect here. Indeed, simplicity and uniformity considerations—which have considerable well-earned scientific clout—push in the direction of such generalizations.

But Hume certainly identified important places within the argument to probe. First, any two (groups of) things have infinitely many properties in common and also differ in infinitely many respects. Whether or not artifacts and natural objects are alike in ways that would support transfer of design attributions from the former to the latter depends upon exactly what the relevant Rs are. And since artifact cases will have multiple properties which they would not have were the object not an artifact—e.g., being on my table—but which are not themselves conceptually indicative of design, whether or not the Rs in question will serve design argument purposes will depend on whether they are somehow especially linked to design even in the artifact case. Second, whether or not there really are alternative means of producing Rs independent of any mind input is often an empirical matter, which cannot be settled either way by simple stipulation. On the other hand, whether or not some of Hume's own remarks are to the point depends upon whether or not design arguments really are ultimately analogical. And whether or not Hume's suggestions are correct concerning the uncertain character of any designer inferred will depend upon the specific Rs and upon what can or cannot be definitively said concerning requirements for their production.

2.1.2 R Concerns: Round 1

Key questions, then, include: what are the relevant Rs typically cited? do those Rs genuinely signal purpose and design? how does one show that either way? are there viable alternative accounts of the Rs requiring no reference to minds? how does one show that either way? The specific Rs in question are obviously central to design argument efforts. Although the underlying general category is, again, some special type of orderliness, the specifics have ranged rather widely historically. Among the more straightforwardly empirical are inter alia uniformity, contrivance, adjustment of means to ends, particularly exquisite complexity, particular types of functionality, delicacy, integration of natural laws, improbability, the fitness (fine-tuning) of the inorganic realm for supporting life, significant temporal or spatial co-incidings, and significant isomorphisms. Some advocates cited what might be termed second-order properties as well. For instance, in the 1820s William Sharp MacLeay argued that taxonomic structures (cascades of quintets of taxonomic categories, as he saw it) constituted evidence of design.[1] A number of empirically further removed and problematic proposals all having axiological overtones have also been advanced, including the intelligibility of nature, the directionality of evolutionary processes, aesthetic characteristics (beauty, elegance, and the like), apparent purpose and value (including the aptness of our world for the existence and practice of moral value) and just the sheer niftiness of many of the things we find in nature. (“Cumulative” arguments involving intermeshings of multiple of the above factors have also been advanced.[2])

Many of the specific Rs advanced historically were vulnerable to substantive critiques, often increasingly so as time went on. Specifically, while it was clearly evident that various a's had the R character they did in virtue of their (human) intentional production, it was much more difficult establishing that any or all other occurrences of R likely owed their existence to intention as well. As the standard story has it, science increasingly acquired understandings of how nature unaided by deliberate intent and planning could produce virtually any R proposed, and thus while (2) might continue to hold for virtually any human artifact a having any intended R one might please, (3)—and consequently the inference to (4)—became progressively less defensible.

2.2 Deductive Design Arguments: Schema 2

But some advocates of design arguments had been reaching for a deeper intuition. The intuition they were attempting to capture involved properties that in and of themselves constituted some degree of evidence for design—properties that were not merely constantly conjoined, for whatever reason, with instances of design. The specific Rs were singled out not just because such properties happened to be often or even only produced by designing agents. (Garbage heaps fit that description.) Advocates were convinced that the appropriate Rs in question were in their own right directly reflective of and redolent of cognition, that this directly suggested mind, that we could see nearly directly that they were the general sort of thing that a mind might or even would generate, and that consequently they did not depend for their evidential force upon previously established constant conjunctions or other associations with known instances of design. When we see a text version of the Gettysburg Address, that text says mind to us in a way totally unrelated to any induction or analogy from past encounters with written texts. It was that type of testimony to mind, to design, that some historical advocates of design arguments believed that they found in some Rs observed in nature—a testimony having no dependency on induction or analogy. Beauty, purpose and in general value especially when conjoined with delicate complexity were popular underlying intuitive marks. Intricate, dynamic, stable, functioning order of the sort we encounter in nature was frequently placed in this category. Such order was taken to be suggestive of minds in that it seemed nearly self-evidently the sort of thing minds, and so far as was definitively known, only minds were prone to produce. It was a property whose mind-resonating character we could unhesitatingly attribute to intent.

Despite Hume's earlier demurs that things in nature are not really very like artifacts such as machines, most people (including opponents of design arguments) who are most familiar with nature's dazzling intricacies freely admit that nature abounds with things that look designed—that are intention-shaped. For instance, Francis Crick (no fan of design) issued a warning to his fellow biologists:

Biologists must constantly keep in mind that what they see was not designed, but rather evolved. (Crick 1988, 138).

Along with this perception of mind-suggestiveness went a further principle—that the mind-suggestive or intention-shaped (the design-like) characteristics in question were too palpable to have been generated by non-intentional means.

That allows specification of a second design inference pattern:

Schema 2:

(5) Some things in nature (or nature itself, the cosmos) are design-like (exhibit a cognition-resonating, intention-shaped character R)
(6) Design-like properties (R) are not producible by (unguided) natural means—i.e., any phenomenon exhibiting such Rs must be a product of intentional design.


(7) Some things in nature (or nature itself, the cosmos) are products of intentional design. And of course, the capacity for intentional design requires agency of some type.

Notice that explicit reference to human artifacts has dropped out of the argument, and that the argument is no longer comparative but has become essentially deductive. Some arguments were historically intended as arguments of that type. Consider the widely reproduced opening passages of William Paley's 1802 Natural Theology:[3]

In crossing a heath, suppose I pitched my foot against a stone and were asked how the stone came to be there, I might possibly answer that for anything I knew to the contrary it had lain there forever; nor would it, perhaps, be very easy to show the absurdity of this answer. But suppose I had found a watch upon the ground, and it should be inquired how the watch happened to be in that place. I should hardly think of the answer which I had before given, that for anything I knew the watch might have always been there. Yet why should not this answer serve for the watch as well as for the stone? Why is it not as admissible in the second case as in the first? For this reason, and for no other, namely, that when we come to inspect the watch, we perceive—what we could not discover in the stone—that its several parts are framed and put together for a purpose … [The requisite] mechanism being observed … the inference we think is inevitable, that the watch must have had a maker. Every observation which was made in our first chapter concerning the watch may be repeated with strict propriety concerning the eye, concerning animals, concerning plants, concerning, indeed, all the organized parts of the works of nature. … [T]he eye … would be alone sufficient to support the conclusion which we draw from it, as to the necessity of an intelligent Creator. …

Although Paley's argument is routinely construed as analogical, it in fact contains an informal statement of the above variant argument type. Paley goes on for two chapters discussing the watch, discussing the properties in it which evince design, destroying potential objections to concluding design in the watch, and discussing what can and cannot be concluded about the watch's designer. It is only then that entities in nature—e.g., the eye—come onto the horizon at all. Obviously, Paley isn't making such heavy weather to persuade his readers to concede that the watch really is designed and has a designer. He is, in fact, teasing out the bases and procedures from and by which we should and should not reason about design and designers. Thus Paley's use of the term ‘inference’ in connection with the watch's designer.[4]

Once having acquired the relevant principles, then in Chapter 3 of Natural Theology—“Application of the Argument”—Paley applies the same argument (vs. presenting us with the other half of the analogical argument) to things in nature. The cases of human artifacts and nature represent two separate inference instances:

up to the limit, the reasoning is as clear and certain in the one case as in the other. (Paley 1802 [1963], 14)[5]

But the instances are instances of the same inferential move:

there is precisely the same proof that the eye was made for vision as there is that the telescope was made for assisting it. (Paley 1802 [1963] 13)[6]

The watch does play an obvious and crucial role—but as a paradigmatic instance of design inferences rather than as the analogical foundation for an inferential comparison.

Schema 2, not being analogically structured, would not be vulnerable to the ills of analogy,[7] and not being inductive would claim more than mere probability for its conclusion. That is not accidental. Indeed, it has been argued that Paley was aware of Hume's earlier attacks on analogical design arguments, and deliberately structured his argument to avoid the relevant pitfalls.[8] Paley's own characterization of his argument would support this deductive classification. For instance, after presenting the argument, Paley refers to

… the marks of contrivance discoverable in animal bodies, and to the argument deduced from them in proof of design and of a designing Creator [my emphasis]

Of course, “deduced” is often used quite loosely—Sherlock Holmes, for instance, was notoriously less than rigorous on that point. But Paley, shortly after the above, says:

The eye proves it … The proof … is complete; for when the design of the part and the conduciveness of its structure to that design is shown, the mind may set itself at rest; no future consideration can detract anything from the force of the example.

That characteristic—impossibility of additional information weakening the logic of an inference—is definitive of deductive arguments, but does not apply to inductive arguments at all.

2.2.1 Assessing the Schema 2 argument

First, how are we to assess the premises required by this schema? Premise (5), at least, is not particularly controversial even now.[9] Crick's earlier warning to biologists would have been pointless were there no temptation toward design attributions, and even as implacable a contemporary opponent of design arguments (and all things remotely related to them) as Richard Dawkins characterized biology as:

the study of complicated things that give the appearance of having been designed for a purpose. (Dawkins 1987, 1)

Day-to-day contemporary biology is rife with terms like ‘design’, ‘machine’, ‘purpose’ and allied terms. And that is not just arbitrary convention, but may be virtually inescapable. Indeed, Kant, although a critic of design arguments, saw design as a regulative principle of science—that is, a principle which, whether true or not, science could not operate without. As historian of science Timothy Lenoir has remarked:

Teleological thinking has been steadfastly resisted by modern biology. And yet, in nearly every area of research biologists are hard pressed to find language that does not impute purposiveness to living forms. (Lenoir 1982, ix)

Whether or not particular biological phenomena are designed, they are frequently enough design-like to make design language (resisted or not) not only fit living systems extraordinarily well, but to undergird generation of fruitful theoretical conceptions as well.[10] (Advocates of design arguments claim that the reason why theorizing as if organisms are designed meets with such success is that organisms are in fact designed.)

However principle (6) (that the relevant design-like properties are not producible by unguided natural means) will be more problematic. (It should be noted that the conceptual relevance of having R to being designed is of implicit importance even to specifically analogical arguments, since such relevance considerations constitute one important evaluative criterion for analogical arguments.) What might be the rational justification for (6)? There are two broad possibilities.

1. Empirical: induction. Induction essentially involves establishing that some principle holds within the realm of our knowledge/experience (the sample cases), and then, subject to certain constraints, generalizing the principle to encompass relevant areas beyond that realm (the test cases).[11] The attempt to establish the universality of a connection between having relevant Rs and being a product of mind on the basis of an observed consistent connection between having relevant Rs and being a product of mind within all (most) of the cases where both R was exhibited and we knew whether or not the phenomenon in question was a product of mind, would constitute an inductive generalization.

This approach would suffer from a variety of weaknesses (some of them related to Hume's criticisms of Schema 1 arguments). First, there would be at least some awkwardness in that the overwhelming bulk of the R-exhibiting cases of which we were aware would be exactly the problematic cases—those in nature. More truly problematic would be the fact that the R-exhibiting things concerning which we knew whether or not they were designed would be almost without exception human artifacts, whereas the phenomena to which the generalization was being extended would be almost without exception things in a very different category—things in nature. And, of course, the generalization in question could establish at best a probability, and the factors just noted would keep the specific probability fairly modest.

2. Conceptual. It might be held that (6) is known in the same conceptual, nearly a priori way in which we know that textbooks are not producible by natural processes unaided by mind. And our conviction here is not based on any mere induction from prior experiences of texts. Texts carry with them essential marks of mind, and indeed in understanding a text we see at least partway into the mind(s) involved. Various alien artifacts (if any)—of which we have had no prior experience whatever—could fall into this category as well. Similarly, it has been held that we sometimes immediately recognize that order of the requisite sort just is a sign of mind and intent.

Alternatively, it could be argued that although there was a genuine conceptual link between appropriate Rs and mind, design, intent etc., that typically our recognition of that link is triggered by specific experiences with artifacts, or that our seeing the connections in depth is best elicited by considerations involving artifacts. (Both Aristotle and Galileo held a correlate of this view concerning our acquiring knowledge of the general principles governing nature.) On this view, once the truth of (6) became manifest to us through experiences of artifacts, the appropriateness of its more general application would be clear. That might explain why so many advocates of design arguments—both historical and current—seem to believe that they must only display a few cases and raise their eyebrows to gain assent to design.

Either way, principle (6), or something like it, would be something with which any design inference would begin. Further investigation of (6) requires taking a closer look at the Rs which (6) involves.

2.2.2 R Concerns: Round 2

One thing complicating general assessments of design arguments is that the evidential force of specific Rs is affected by the context of their occurrence. Specifically, properties which seem clearly to constitute marks of design in known artifacts often seem to have significantly less evidential import outside that context. For instance, we typically construe enormous complexity in something known to be a manufactured artifact as a deliberately intended and produced characteristic. But mere complexity in contexts not taken to involve artifacts (the precise arrangement of pine needles on a forest floor, for instance) does not seem to have that same force. In the case of natural objects with evident artifactuality absent, it is less clear that such complexity—as well as the other traditional empirical Rs—bespeaks intention, plan and purpose. Similarly, absolutely straight lines in an artifact are typically results of deliberate intention. That straight lines traveled by light rays is so would seem to many to be less obvious.

Furthermore, even within those two contexts—artifact and nature—the various Rs exhibit varying degrees of evidential force. For instance, even in an artifact, mere complexity of whatever degree speaks less clearly of intent than does an engraved sentence. And most critics of design arguments (even among theists) would claim that the categories of evidences we find in nature are far removed from the ‘engraved sentence’ end of the evidential spectrum. Most of the characteristics which uncontroversially shout “intent” are connected most readily to evident artifacts, and are not among the marks we find in nature.[12]

There are two crucial upshots. First, notice that in general, the more empirically tractable the specific Rs, the less promising as marks of purpose and design they seem. For instance, if just bare complexity is cited, then although complexity is in many respects easily demonstrable, that complexity does not just uncontroversially speak of intent. On the other hand, although the exhibiting of genuine purpose and value might constitute persuasive and even compelling evidence of a designer, establishing that the empirical characteristics in question really do betoken genuine purpose and value—and not just, say, functionality—seems to many to be difficult if not impossible.

2.3 Abductive Design Arguments: Schema 3

Some philosophers of science claim that in a wide variety of scientific cases we employ an “inference to the best explanation” (IBE).[13] The basic idea (typically traced to Peirce's notion of abduction) is this. Suppose that some otherwise surprising fact e would be a reasonably expectable occurrence were hypothesis h true. That, Peirce argued, would constitute at least some provisional reason for thinking that h might actually be true. Peirce's own characterization was as follows (Peirce 1955, 151):

Schema 3:

The surprising fact, C, is observed:
But if A were true, C would be a matter of course,


There is reason to suspect that A is true.

The more generalized intuition is that given competing possible explanations for some observed phenomenon we should accept that explanation upon which, all things considered, the observed phenomenon would be the most reasonably expected, or on which it would be the least surprising. By extension, if one candidate explanation is superior to the others in significant respects—enhanced likelihood, explanatory adequacy, plausibility, evidential support, fit with already-accepted theories, predictiveness, precision, and the like—then we are warranted in (provisionally) accepting that candidate as the right explanation given the evidence in question.[14] Some advocates see design arguments as inferences to the best explanation, taking design explanations—whatever their weaknesses—as prima facie superior to chance, necessity, chance-driven evolution, or whatever.[15]

In the IBE context, an explanation's ‘superiority’ is always relative to the available competitors it faces—meaning that the collection of available alternatives (which may or may not contain the correct explanation) once again assumes crucial importance. But the fact that IBEs are always comparative evaluations has led some to suggest that Bayesianism (after the 18th century clergyman Thomas Bayes), which seems to offer prospects of injecting rigor into comparative assessment of competing theories, might be profitably appropriated into design discussions.[16]

Bayes's basic Theorem is:

B1: Pr (h/e&k) = {Pr (e/h&k) x Pr (h/k)}/Pr (e/k)

where e is some piece of evidence, h is some proposed explanatory hypothesis, and k constitutes our background knowledge (suitably restricted in ways we need not worry about here). Bayes Theorem is essentially supposed to tell us how to adjust our previous degree of acceptance of some proposition in the light of additional evidence. In particular, if we acquire new evidence e, the probability we assign to h now taking account of that new evidence e (the ‘adjusted’ or ‘posterior’ probability) should be the probability we assigned to h before learning of e—i.e., Pr(h/k), the ‘prior’ probability—now appropriately adjusted to take account of how reasonably expectable e would be were h true—Pr(e/h&k)—and how strongly we should have expected e whether h were true or not. The theorem itself is perfectly legitimate, and can be derived from the standard axioms of the probability calculus.

From the Theorem, one can trivially derive an expression for comparative assessments of competing hypotheses—h1 and h2 say—relative to specified evidence e:

B2: Pr (h1/e&k) > Pr (h2/e&k) if and only if

[Pr (e/h1&k) x Pr (h1/k)] > [Pr (e/h2&k) x Pr (h2/k)]

The difficulty here is that the Theorem can only go from probabilities to probabilities, meaning that one is required to begin with some probability assignments before one can use the Theorem or its derivatives. And where does one get those “prior probabilities” as they are called?

In order to obtain the prior probabilities which application of Bayes's Theorem requires, Bayesians have generally been forced to adopt a subjectivist (or “personalist”) conception of probability. Although very loosely constrained by e.g., consistency considerations, specifying the prior probabilities is thus a matter not of any rigid logic, but of personal choice, preference, or intuition. Indeed, this subjectivist approach is often just called “Bayesianism.” It appears to some that that subjectivism would undermine the idea that casting design arguments probabilistically would offer a gain in rigor, and some critics of Bayesianism even deny that the whole notion of ‘prior probabilities’ is intelligible at all (or that if there are objective prior probabilities that we would have any reliable clue as to what they might be).

One popular strategy is to just distribute the probability assignments evenly among the competing hypotheses. That procedure has come under criticism, but Bayesians sometimes hold that initial selection of prior probabilities may ultimately be of only limited importance anyway, claiming that given enough time and evidence, adjusted posterior probabilities will tend to converge to much closer values.

Bayesianism is sometimes criticized on other grounds as well. Given that most scientific revolutions come as surprises (who anticipated quantum mechanics?) we are never in a position to list all the possible hypotheses. Indeed, the overwhelming majority of such have never been thought of by humans, and perhaps even cannot be thought of by humans. In practice this means that application of Bayes's Theorem often involves inclusion of a “catch-all” hypothesis to cover whatever ground is left out by the hypotheses we know about. Since that includes multiple possible hypotheses which are still unknown to us, assigning a specific probability to the whole batch as a batch strikes some as not sufficiently rigorous to be of significant use.[17]

Whatever one's view of the Bayesian extension, IBEs have their own shortcomings. The assessment of ‘best’ is not only a value-tinged judgment, but is notoriously tricky (especially given the ambiguous and hard to pinpoint import of the Rs in the present case). Related to that, taking design to be the best explanation for something requires prior identification of the appropriate properties as design-relevant, and that recognition must have a different basis.[18] And again, substantive comparison can only involve known alternatives, which at any point represent a vanishingly small fraction of the possible alternatives. Choosing the best of the known may be the best we can do, but many (e.g., van Fraassen) would insist that without some further suppressed and significant assumptions, being the best (as humans see it) of the (humanly known) restricted group does not warrant ascription of truth, or anything like it.

3. Broader Issues

A perhaps deeper concern is that in general the Rs that provide the most plausible cases for purpose and design are properties having to do directly with artifactuality and are thus basically absent from nature, whereas the ones that do apply to nature are substantially more ambiguous as to their teleological import. That again would also constitute a serious problem for many analogical design arguments, since all the sample cases upon which the analogy rested would come from one category (artifact), all the cases encompassed in the conclusion would come from a different category (natural phenomena) and the crucial evidences would perform differently in the two cases.

3.1 Gaps and Their Discontents

Evidential ambiguity would virtually disappear if it became clear that there is no plausible means of producing some R independent of deliberate intent. Part of the persuasiveness of (6) historically came from absence of any known plausible non-intentional alternative explanation of the traditional Rs. Such cases are often linked to alleged gaps in nature—phenomena for which, it is claimed, there can be no purely natural explanation, there being a gap between nature's production capabilities and the phenomenon in question. (For example, nature's unaided capabilities fall short of those capabilities required for producing a DVD player. Thus, when we see a DVD player we know that something else—human agency—was involved in its production.) Design cases resting upon nature's alleged inability to produce some relevant ‘natural’ phenomenon are generally assumed to explicitly or implicitly appeal to supernatural agency, and are typically described as “God-of-the-gaps” arguments—a description usually intended to be pejorative.

But evidence of design in nature does not automatically imply gaps. Design built into nature from the very beginning would require no further interventions within the historical flow of nature, no gaps in nature. But since the artifact/nature divide parallels the gap/non-gap divide, one way the implausibility of alternative means of production could become exceptionally clear was if R were associated with a gap in nature's capabilities—if the unaided course of nature genuinely could not or would not produce R, yet we see R in ‘nature’. That situation would not only move R into the realm of artifacts (changing its evidential import), but would make appeal to agency virtually inevitable. Thus establishing genuine gaps in nature would substantially strengthen the relevant design arguments.

The position that there are gaps in nature is not inherently irrational—and would seem to be a legitimate empirical question. But although gaps would profoundly strengthen design arguments, they do import their own suite of difficulties. Gaps are usually easy to spot in cases of artifactuality, but although they may be present in nature, establishing their existence there can usually be done (by science, at least) only indirectly—via probability considerations, purported limitations on nature's abilities, etc.[19]

Several possible snags lurk. For conceptual reasons, science is sometimes taken to operate under an obligatory rejection of substantive departures from uniformity—whether gaps, singularities or whatever. Gaps in nature would, again, suggest supernatural agency, and some (for various reasons) take science to operate under an obligatory exclusion of such.[20] This prohibition—commonly known as methodological naturalism—is often claimed (mistakenly, some argue) to be definitive of genuine science.[21] In any case, probability considerations are not infrequently a bit iffy, and would affect the status of (6) were its justification via induction. ‘Established’ limitations both on science and on nature can and have been overturned in the past. Repeatedly. The possibility of discovery (or postulation) of alternative ‘natural’ means of production would constitute a standing threat to any argument resting in part on a perceived absence of such means. And the spotty track record of alleged gaps—they are prone to disappearing—provides at least a cautionary note. Such considerations will complicate attempts to very firmly establish design empirically on the basis of the types of properties we usually find in nature.

The way that alleged gaps typically disappear is, of course, through new proposed scientific theories postulating means of natural production of phenomena previously thought to be beyond nature's capabilities. The most obvious example of that is, of course, Darwin's evolutionary theory and its descendants.

3.2 Alternative Means of Biological Production

Without going into the very familiar details, Darwinian processes fueled by undesigned, unplanned, chance variations would, it is argued, over time produce organisms exquisitely adapted to their environmental niches. And since many of the characteristics traditionally cited as evidences of design just were various adaptations, evolution would thus produce entities exactly fitting traditional criteria of design. Darwinian evolution, then, unaided by intention or intervention could account for the existence of many (perhaps all) of the Rs which we in fact find in nature. Premise (6) would thus look to simply be false. What had earlier appeared to be purpose (requiring intent) was not apparently revealed as mere unintended but successful and preserved function.

That was—and is—widely taken as meaning that design arguments depending upon specific biological gaps would be weakened—perhaps fatally. Thus Darwin in a very famous passage from his autobiography:

The old argument of design in nature, as given by Paley, which formerly seemed to me so conclusive, fails, now that the law of natural selection had been discovered. We can no longer argue that, for instance, the beautiful hinge of a bivalve shell must have been made by an intelligent being, like the hinge of a door by man. There seems to be no more design in the variability of organic beings and in the action of natural selection, than in the course which the wind blows. Everything in nature is the result of fixed laws. (Darwin 1887, 279)

But the damage which gap closings inflict upon the overall teleological project was less extensive than sometimes suggested. Gap-based arguments did not represent the only—or even the most important—such arguments.

3.3 Indirect Causation, Design and Evidences

Historically, design cases were widely understood to allow for indirect intelligent agent design and causation, the very causal structures producing the relevant phenomena being themselves deliberately designed for the purpose of producing those phenomena.[22] For instance, it was typically believed that God could have initiated special conditions and processes at the instant of creation which operating entirely on their own could produce organisms and other intended (and designed) results with no subsequent agent intervention required. Paley himself, the authors of the Bridgewater Treatises and others (including even Augustine, earlier) were explicitly clear that whether or not something was designed was an issue largely separable from the means of production in question. Historically it was insisted that design in nature did track back eventually to intelligent agency somewhere and that any design we find in nature would not—and could not—have been there had there ultimately been no mind involved. But commentators at least from the early 17th century on (e.g., Francis Bacon, Robert Boyle) very clearly distinguished the creative initiating of nature itself from interventions within the path of nature once initiated. For instance, over two centuries before Darwin, Bacon wrote:

God … doth accomplish and fulfill his divine will [by ways] not immediate and direct, but by compass; not violating Nature, which is his own law upon the creation. (quoted in (Whewell 1834, 358)

Indeed, if the Rs in question did directly say mind, then means of production—whether unbroken causation or gappy—would be of minimal evidential importance. Thus, the frequent contemporary claim that design arguments all involve appeal to special divine intervention during the course of nature's history—that in short design arguments are “God-of-the-gaps” arguments—represents serious historical inaccuracy.

In fact, a decided preference for design cases not involving gaps and supernatural intervention was common long before Darwin. A quarter century prior to the Origin, Charles Babbage expressed a typical position:

We cannot for a moment hesitate in pronouncing that that which, after its original adjustment, no superintendence was required, displayed far greater ingenuity than that which demanded, at every change in its law, the intervention of its contriver. (Babbage 1838, 40)

Boyle had expressed the same idea as far back as the 1680s, and Whewell and others expressed related sentiments in the 1830s.[23] This popular conception was neatly summarized by Mother Cary in Charles Kingsley's Water Babies:

[A]nyone can make things, if they will take time and trouble enough, but it is not everyone who, like me, can make things make themselves (Kingsley 1890, 273)

Indeed, even Darwin himself endorsed this view—a relevant quote from Whewell appears in the frontispiece of the Origin itself (Darwin 1859 [1966], ii)[24] —and he expressed related sentiments in his own words both in his pre-Origin notebooks and in his personal correspondence even after publication of the Origin.[25] This sort of pre-Darwin move (relocating design from intervention back one level to created laws and deliberately chosen initial conditions) was thus obviously not just a forced retreat from Darwin, as frequently claimed.[26]

However, if Rs result from gapless chains of natural causal processes, the evidential impact of those Rs again threatens to become problematic and ambiguous, since there will a fortiori be at the immediate level a full natural causal account for them.[27] Design will, in such cases, play no immediate mechanistic explanatory role, suggesting its superfluousness. But even if such conceptions were explanatorily and scientifically superfluous at that level, that does not entail that they are conceptually, alethically, inferential, or otherwise superfluous in general. The role of mind might be indirect, deeply buried, or at several levels of remove from the immediate production mechanism but would still have to be present at some level.

But it does mean that any such argument will depend crucially upon the Rs in question being ultimately dependent for their eventual occurrence upon agent activity, i.e.,

(6a) Design-like properties (R) are (most probably) not producible by means ultimately devoid of mind/intention—i.e., any phenomena exhibiting such Rs must be a product (at least indirectly) of intentional design.

The focus must now become whether or not the laws and conditions required for the indirect production of life, intelligent life, etc., could themselves be independent of intention, design and mind at some deep (perhaps primordial, pre-cosmic) point. In recent decades, exactly that question has arisen increasingly insistently from within the scientific community.

4. Contemporary Design Discussions

4.1 Cosmic Fine-Tuning

It was recognized centuries back that conditions necessary for the flourishing of life were fairly tightly constrained (making the move to design in natural conditions and laws inherently attractive), but not until quite recent times has it been revealed through science itself just how wildly tight the constraints actually are, and just how many separate things have to converge, each within a miniscule value interval. For instance, here are two examples taken from Robin Collins:

1. If the initial explosion of the big bang had differed in strength by as little as one part in 1060, the universe would have either quickly collapsed back on itself, or expanded too rapidly for stars to form. In either case, life would be impossible. (As John Jefferson Davis points out, an accuracy of one part in 1060 can be compared to firing a bullet at a one-inch target on the other side of the observable universe, twenty billion light years away, and hitting the target.)

3. Calculations by Brandon Carter show that if gravity had been stronger or weaker by one part in 1040, then life-sustaining stars like the sun could not exist. This would most likely make life impossible. (Collins 1999, 49.)[28]

In light of these and other examples, Collins remarks that “Almost everything about the basic structure of the universe … is balanced on a razor's edge for life to occur.” (Collins 1999, 48).

There is some disagreement over just how many such independent factors there are, but by some counts there are over 100, although not all requiring the above degree of precision.[29] But the apparent probability of all the necessary conditions sufficient to allow just the formation of planets (let alone life) coming together just by chance is utterly outrageously tiny—by Roger Penrose's calculation, the probability of chance alone producing cosmoi capable of producing planets is 1 in 10 raised in turn to the 10123 (Penrose 1990, 343–4). With respect to key enzymes occurring by chance, astrophysicist Fred Hoyle throws around numbers like 10-40000 (Hoyle 1982, 4–5). (Although there is no consensus, some, following e.g., Emile Borel, suggest that a probability of occurrence of less than 10-50 can be taken as equivalent to practical impossibility.) Apparently crushing improbabilities of that order tied to the apparent value of a life-permitting (or intelligence-permitting) universe has given rise to cosmic fine-tuning arguments for design, according to which improbable fine-tuning of the cosmos for life and intelligence is taken as empirical evidence of design, purpose, and deliberate intent. In fact, the tighter the constraints, the more reasonable it becomes to see design in the conditions meeting those constraints. Other things being equal, deliberate, intentional design would constitute a plausible explanation for a universe like ours existing against the odds and out of all the myriad possible life-precluding or life-hampering universes.

But as before, the issue turns in part upon the availability of alternative explanations. In this case, there are two discussed historically—necessity and chance. It could be claimed (a) that a cosmos having the appearance of being designed had to exist, that a universe like ours was virtually inevitable, or, more circumspectly, (b) that any cosmos in which intelligent beings found themselves would have to have some threshhold level of order and complexity, that being a necessary condition for the existence of any such observing intelligent beings to begin with. The former never gained substantial influence. The latter would be a version of a (Weak) Cosmological Anthropic Principle. While trivially true, such a principle has no explanatory power, and does not constitute a substantive alternative explanation. And although historically the idea of sheer chance production of a life-hospitable cosmos was occasionally injected into the discussion and although that was no doubt logically possible in some technical sense, few saw that suggestion as attractive. Barring any viable alternative, cosmic fine-tuning seems to many to constitute a live candidate for a design argument.

4.2 Many-universe Theories

There have, however, been recent attempts to construct viable alternatives. The traditional method of overcoming prohibitive single-throw odds has been to multiply the number of tries—much as one can overcome the odds against throwing a double six given enough throws of the dice. In general, a state space of possibilities, no matter how extensive, can be saturated via enough separate random tries, so that any value-points in the space will eventually be discovered. Hume discussed this type of strategy for countering cosmic design arguments, and current many-universe theories are sometimes intended to function in similar manner, thus undercutting cosmic fine-tuning arguments. The specific idea is that if there are enough universes of randomly varying types, at least some of them will just by chance meet the tight requirements for life and consciousness, such a location being where any intelligences would inescapably find themselves (for reasons sketched above), were there any selves to do any finding[30] and thus no appeal to design will be necessary to explain that fine-tuning. There are currently a number of proposed theoretical bases for the existence of multiple universes.

However, there are a number of serious difficulties confronting many-universe theories, three of which are, very briefly, as follows. First, such theories typically involve vast assemblages of other universes which are utterly inaccessible from this one, and whose very existences are thus massively speculative—perhaps incurably so. Second, Ockham would have had some things to say here about many-universe theories vs. design—as do physicists Paul Davies:

Invoking an infinite number of other universes just to explain the apparent contrivances of the one we see is pretty drastic, and in stark conflict with Occam's razor. (Davies 1995, 121)

and Edward Harrison:

Take your choice: blind chance that requires multitudes of universes, or design that requires only one. (Harrison 1985, 252)

Third, it is not even clear that collections of such universes…even granting their existence and relevance—perform their claimed design-eroding task. Much depends upon the type of collection, its structure, etc.—none of which we have the slightest clue about.[31]

There are serious questions surrounding cosmic fine-tuning arguments as well. As noted earlier, with gapless cases of indirect design the full evidential weight would rest upon the mind-suggestiveness of the Rs themselves and upon the unlikelihood of the tightly-constrained requisite conditions themselves being products of either chance or necessity. (Basing them on even deeper laws and conditions will generate a regress which only chance, necessity or agency can halt.) But given the numbers, the exquisiteness of the fitness for life and the generally conceded value of life, consciousness, etc., some even of those staunchly resistant to supernatural explanations find themselves impelled to seek for plausible alternative explanations. Thus, Francis Crick toys with terms like ‘miracle’, Frederick Hoyle refers to a superintellect ‘monkeying’ with physics, and Andrei Linde raises the possibility of our cosmos itself being a product of design—by some supertechnological alien culture. The character of such proposals is itself testimony to the prima facie plausibility of fine-tuning cases. This whole area is enveloped in spirited contemporary debate—but that fine-tuning arguments do represent a currently live possibility for empirically updated cosmic design arguments is not an uncommon view.[32]

4.3 The “Intelligent Design” (ID) Movement

A high-profile development in design arguments over the past decade or so involves what has come to be known as the “Intelligent Design” (ID) movement. Although there are variants and unclarities, the movement involves efforts to construct design arguments taking cognizance of various contemporary scientific developments (primarily in biology, biochemistry, mathematics and cosmology)—developments which, as most ID advocates see it, both reveal the inadequacy of mainstream (naturalistic Darwinian) explanatory accounts and offer compelling evidence for design in nature at some level. ID advocates have tried to establish not only the rational cogency of design cases but have pushed ID as legitimately scientific by trying both to define relevant Rs with adequate empirical precision and to construct design arguments with suitable scientific/mathematical rigor.

ID advocates propose three specialized Rs—irreducible complexity, specified complexity and information. Although distinctions are sometimes blurred here, while ID arguments involving each of those Rs tend to be gap arguments, an additional focus on mind-reflective aspects of nature is typically more visible in ID arguments citing specified complexity and information than in arguments citing irreducible complexity. Gaps are also a defining feature of the “explanatory filter” frequently endorsed by ID advocates.[33]

The movement has elicited vociferous criticism and opposition. Opponents have pressed a number of objections against ID including, inter alia contentions that ID advocates have simply gotten the relevant science wrong, that even where the science is right the empirical evidences cited by design advocates do not, in fact, constitute substantive grounds for design conclusions, that the existence of demonstrably superior alternative explanations for the phenomena cited (Darwinian, many-universes, etc.) undercuts the cogency of ID cases, and that design theories are not legitimate science, but are just disguised creationism, God-of-the-gaps arguments, religiously motivated, etc.

I will not pursue that dispute here except to note that even if the case is made that ID arguments could not count as proper science (and arguments for that more general claim are controversial[34]), that would not in itself demonstrate some deeper rational or inferential defect in design arguments as such. Science need not be seen as exhausting the space of legitimate conclusions from empirical data.

But the floods of vitriol in the current ID discussion suggest that much more than the propriety of selected inferences from particular empirical evidences is at issue. Although there is indeed much more that energizes the squabble on both sides (political, cultural, philosophical and, in some instances, religious) there is one further aspect of the ID attempt which ties in here, but which is also relevant to one final larger question.

5. The Persistence of Design Thinking

That question is: why do design arguments remain so durable if empirical evidence is inferentially ambiguous, the arguments logically controversial, and the conclusions vociferously disputed? One possibility is that they really are better arguments than most philosophical critics concede. Another possibility is that design intuitions do not rest upon inferences at all. The situation may parallel that of the existence of an external world, the existence of other minds, and a number of other familiar matters. The 18th century Scottish Common Sense philosopher Thomas Reid (and his contemporary followers) argued that we are simply so constructed that in certain normally-realized experiential circumstances we simply find that we in fact have involuntary convictions about such a world, about other minds, and so forth. That would explain why historical philosophical attempts to reconstruct the arguments by which such beliefs either arose or were justified were such notorious failures—failures in the face of which ordinary belief nonetheless proceeded happily and helplessly onward. If a similar involuntary belief-producing mechanism operated with respect to intuitions of design, that would similarly explain why argumentative attempts have been less than universally compelling but yet why design ideas fail to disappear despite the purported failure of such arguments—persisting even in the case of Darwin (at intervals up to his death), and of the contemporary biologists Crick thought had to be on their guard against design interpretations.[35]

A number of prominent figures historically in fact held that we could determine more or less perceptually that various things in nature were candidates for design attributions—that they were in the requisite respects design-like. Some held that we could perceptually identify some things as more than mere candidates for design. For instance, according to William Whewell:

When we collect design and purpose from the arrangements of the universe, we do not arrive at our conclusion by a train of deductive reasoning, but by the conviction which such combinations as we perceive, immediately and directly impress upon the mind. ‘Design must have a designer.’ But such a principle can be of no avail to one whom the contemplation or the description of the world does not impress with the perception of design. It is not therefore at the end but at the beginning of our syllogism, not among remote conclusions, but among original principles, that we must place the truth, that such arrangements, manifestations, and proceedings as we behold about us imply a Being endowed with consciousness, design, and will, from whom they proceed. (Whewell 1834, 344)

The world, says Whewell, impresses us with a perception of design. Thomas Reid also held a view in this region,[36] and Hume's Cleanthes made suggestions in this direction.[37]

If something like that were the operative process, then the ID movement, in trying to forge a scientific link to design in the sense of inferences from empirically determined evidences would be misconstructing the actual basis for design belief, as would be design arguments more generally. It is perhaps telling, in this regard, that scientific theorizing typically involves substantial creativity and that the resultant theories are typically novel and unexpected. Design intuitions, however, do not seem to emerge as novel construals from creative grappling with data, but are embedded in our thinking nearly naturally—so much so that, again, Crick thinks that biologists have to be immunized against it. Indeed, design structures seem to be part of the very fabric of science itself. According to physicist Paul Davies

Science began as an outgrowth of theology, and all scientists, whether atheists or theists … accept an essentially theological worldview. (Davies 1995, 138)

All of that suggests to some that we are dealing with a different category of belief formation and acquisition. And it also suggests that design thinking may be natural to our sorts of intellects.

6. Conclusion

Perception and appreciation of the incredible intricacy and the beauty of things in nature—whether biological or cosmic—has certainly inclined many toward thoughts of purpose and design in nature, and has constituted important moments of affirmation for those who already accept design positions. The status of the corresponding arguments of course, is not only a matter of current dispute, but the temperature of the dispute seems to be on the rise. And regardless of what one thinks of the arguments at this point, so long as nature has the power to move us (as even Kant admitted that the ‘starry heavens above’ did), design convictions and arguments are unlikely to disappear quietly.


Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

abduction | Bayes' Theorem | creationism | Darwin, Charles | Hume, David | Kant, Immanuel | theology: natural


Thanks to my colleagues in the Calvin College Philosophy Department, especially Ruth Groenhout, Kelly Clark and Terrence Cuneo.