# Time Machines

*First published Thu Nov 25, 2004*

Recent years have seen a growing consensus in the philosophical community that the grandfather paradox and similar logical puzzles do not preclude the possibility of time travel scenarios that utilize spacetimes containing closed timelike curves. At the same time, physicists, who for half a century acknowledged that the general theory of relativity is compatible with such spacetimes, have intensely studied the question whether the operation of a time machine would be admissible in the context of general relativity theory or theories that attempt to combine general relativity and quantum mechanics. A time machine is a device which brings about closed timelike curves—and thus enables time travel—where none would have existed otherwise. The physics literature contains various no-go theorems for time machines, i.e., theorems which purport to establish that, under physically plausible assumptions, the operation of a time machine is impossible. We conclude that for the time being there exists no conclusive no-go theorem against time machines. The character of the material covered in this article makes it inevitable that its content is of a rather technical nature. We contend, however, that philosophers should nevertheless be interested in this literature for at least two reasons. First, the topic of time machines leads to a number of interesting foundations issues in classical and quantum theories of gravity; and second, philosophers can contribute to the topic by clarifying what it means for a device to count as a time machine, by relating the debate to other concerns such as Penrose's cosmic censorship conjecture and the fate of determinism in general relativity theory, and by eliminating a number of confusions regarding the status of the paradoxes of time travel. The present article addresses these ambitions in as non-technical a manner as possible, and the reader is referred to the relevant physics literature for details.

- 1. Introduction: time travel vs. time machines
- 2. What is a (Thornian) time machine? Preliminaries
- 3. When can a would-be time machine be held responsible for the emergence of CTCs?
- 4. No-go results for (Thornian) time machines in classical general relativity theory
- 5. No-go results in quantum gravity
- 6. Conclusion
- Bibliography
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Introduction: time travel vs. time machine

The topic of time machines is the subject of a sizable and growing
physics literature, some of which has filtered down to popular and
semi-popular
presentations.^{[1]}
The issues raised by this topic are largely
oblique, if not orthogonal, to those treated in the philosophical
literature on time
travel.^{[2]}
Most significantly, the so-called paradoxes
of time travel do not play a substantial role in the physics literature
on time machines. This literature equates the possibility of time
travel with the existence of closed timelike curves (CTCs) or
worldlines for material particles that are smooth, future-directed
timelike curves with
self-intersections.^{[3]}
Since time machines
designate devices which bring about the existence of CTCs and thus
enable time travel, the paradoxes of time travel are irrelevant for
attempted “no-go” results for time machines because these
results concern what happens before the emergence of
CTCs.^{[4]}
This, in our
opinion, is fortunate since the paradoxes of time travel are nothing
more than a crude way of bringing out the fact that the application of
familiar local laws of relativistic physics to a spacetime background
which contains CTCs typically requires that consistency constraints on
initial data must be met in order for a local solution of the laws to
be extendable to a global solution. The nature and status of these
constraints is the subject of ongoing discussion. We will not try to
advance the discussion of this issue
here;^{[5]}
rather, our aim is to
acquaint the reader with the issues addressed in the physics literature
on time machines and to connect them with issues in the philosophy of
space and time and, more generally, with issues in the foundations of
physics.

Paradox mongers can be reassured in that if a paradox is lost in shifting the focus from time travel itself to time machines, then a paradox is also gained: if it is possible to operate a time machine device that produces CTCs, then it is possible to alter the structure of spacetime such that determinism fails; but by undercutting determinism, the time machine undercuts the claim that it is responsible for producing CTCs. But just as the grandfather paradox is a crude way of making a point, so this new paradox is a crude way of indicating that it is going to be difficult to specify what it means to be a time machine. This is a task that calls not for paradox mongering but for scientifically informed philosophizing. The present article will provide the initial steps of this task and will indicate what remains to be done. But aside from paradoxes, the main payoff of the topic of time machines is that it provides a quick route to the heart of a number of foundations problems in classical general relativity theory and in attempts to produce a quantum theory of gravity by combining general relativity and quantum mechanics. We will indicate the shape of some of these problems here, but will refer the interested reader elsewhere for technical details.

There are at least two distinct general notions of time machines,
which we will call *Wellsian* and *Thornian* for short.
In *The Time Machine*, H. G. Wells (1931) described what has
become science fiction's paradigmatic conception of a time machine: the
intrepid operator fastens her seat belt, dials the target
date—past or future—into the counter, throws a lever, and
sits back while time rewinds or fast forwards until the target date is
reached. We will not broach the issue of whether or not a Wellsian time
machine can be implemented within a relativistic spacetime framework.
For, as will soon become clear, the time machines which have recently
come into prominence in the physics literature are of an utterly
different kind. This second kind of time machine was originally
proposed by Kip Thorne and his collaborators (see Morris and Thorne
1988; Morris, Thorne, and Yurtsever 1988). These articles considered
the possibility that, without violating the laws of general
relativistic physics, an advanced civilization might manipulate
concentrations of matter-energy so as to produce CTCs where none would
have existed otherwise. In their example, the production of
“wormholes” was used to generate the required spacetime
structure. But this is only one of the ways in which a time machine
might operate, and in what follows any device which affects the
spacetime structure in such a way that CTCs result will be dubbed a
*Thornian time machine*. We will only be concerned with this
variety of time machine, leaving the Wellsian variety to science
fiction writers. This will disappoint the aficionados of science
fiction since Thornian time machines do not have the magical ability to
transport the would-be time traveler to the past of the events that
constitute the operation of the time machine. For those more interested
in science than in science fiction, this loss is balanced by the gain
in realism and the connection to contemporary research in physics.

In Sections 2 and 3 we investigate the circumstances under which it is plausible to see a Thornian time machine at work. The main difficulty lies in specifying the conditions needed to make sense of the notion that the time machine “produces” or is “responsible for” the appearances of CTCs. We argue that at present there is no satisfactory resolution of this difficulty and, thus, that the topic of time machines in a general relativistic setting is somewhat ill-defined. This fact does not prevent progress from being made on the topic; for if one's aim is to establish no-go results for time machines it suffices to identify necessary conditions for the operation of a time machine and then to prove, under suitable hypotheses about what is physically possible, that it is not physically possible to satisfy said necessary conditions. In Section 4 we review various no-go results which depend only on classical general relativity theory. Section 5 surveys results that appeal to quantum effects. Conclusions are presented in Section 6.

## 2. What is a (Thornian) time machine? Preliminiaries

The setting for the discussion is a *general relativistic
spacetime*
(*M*, *g _{ab}*) where

*M*is a differentiable manifold and

*g*is a Lorentz signature metric defined on all of

_{ab}*M*. The central issue addressed in the physics literature on time machines is whether in this general setting it is physically possible to operate a Thornian time machine. This issue is to be settled by proving theorems about the solutions to the equations that represent what are taken to be physical laws operating in the general relativistic setting—or at least this is so once the notion of a Thornian time machine has been explicated. Unfortunately, no adequate and generally accepted explication that lends itself to the required mathematical proofs is to be found in the literature. This is neither surprising nor deplorable. Mathematical physicists do no wait until some concept has received its final explication before trying to prove theorems about it; indeed, the process of theorem proving is often an essential part of conceptual clarification. The moral is well illustrated by the history of the concept of a spacetime singularity in general relativity where this concept received its now canonical definition only in the process of proving the Penrose-Hawking-Geroch singularity theorems, which came at the end of a decades long dispute over the issue of whether spacetime singularities are a generic feature of solutions to Einstein's gravitational field equations.

^{[6]}However, this is not to say that philosophers interested in time machines should simply wait until the dust has settled in the physics literature; indeed, the physics literature could benefit from deployment of the analytical skills that are the stock in trade of philosophy. For example, the paradoxes of time travel and the fate of time machines are not infrequently confused in the physics literature, and as will become evident below, subtler confusions abound as well.

The question of whether a Thornian time machine—a device that
produces CTCs—can be seen to be at work only makes sense if the
spacetime has at least three features: temporal orientability, a
definite time orientation, and a causally innocuous past. In order to
make the notion of a CTC meaningful, the spacetime must be
*temporally orientable* (i.e., must admit a consistent time
directionality), and one of the two possible time orientations has to
be singled out as giving *the* direction of
time.^{[7]}
Non-temporal orientability is not really an obstacle since if a
given general relativistic spacetime is not temporally orientable, a
spacetime that is everywhere locally the same as the given spacetime
and is itself temporally orientable can be obtained by passing to a
covering
spacetime.^{[8]}
How to justify the singling out of one of
the two possible orientations as future pointing requires a solution to
the problem of the direction of time, a problem which is still subject
to lively debate (see Callender 2001). But for present purposes we
simply assume that a temporal orientation has been provided. A CTC is
then (by definition) a parameterized closed spacetime curve whose
tangent is everywhere a future-pointing timelike vector. A CTC can be
thought of as the world line of some possible observer whose life
history is linearly ordered in the small but not in the large: the
observer has a consistent experience of the “next moment,”
and the “next,” etc., but eventually the “next
moment” brings her back to whatever event she regards as the
starting point.

As for the third condition—a causally innocuous past—the
question of the possibility of operating a device that produces CTCs
presupposes that there is a time before which no CTCs existed. Thus,
Gödel spacetime, so beloved of the time travel literature, is not
a candidate for hosting a Thornian time machine since through every
point in this spacetime there is a CTC. We make this third condition
precise by requiring that the spacetime admits a *global time
slice* Σ (i.e., a spacelike hypersurface without
edges);^{[9]}
that Σ is two-sided and
partitions
*M* into three
parts—Σ itself, the part of
*M*
on the past side of
Σ and the part of
*M*
on the future side of Σ—and that there are no
CTCs that lie on the past side of Σ. The first two clauses of
this requirement together entail that the time slice Σ is a
*partial Cauchy surface*, i.e., Σ is a time slice that is
not intersected more than once by any future-directed timelike
curve.^{[10]}

Now suppose that the state on a partial Cauchy surface
Σ_{0} with no CTCs to its past is to be thought of as
giving a snapshot of the universe at a moment before the machine is
turned on. The subsequent realization of a Thornian time machine
scenario requires that the *chronology violating region*
*V* ⊆ *M*,
the region of spacetime traced out by
CTCs,^{[11]}
is non-null and lies to the future of Σ_{0}. The fact
that *V* ≠ ∅ does not lead to any consistency
constraints on initial data on Σ_{0} since, by
hypothesis, Σ_{0} is not intersected more than once by
any timelike curve, and thus, insofar as the so-called paradoxes of
time travel are concerned with such constraints, the paradoxes do not
arise with respect to Σ_{0}. But by the same token, the
option of traveling back into the past of Σ_{0} is ruled
out by the set up as it has been sketched so far, since otherwise
Σ_{0} would not be a partial Cauchy surface. This just
goes to underscore the point made above that the fans of science
fiction stories of time machines will not find the present context of
discussion broad enough to encompass their vision of how time machines
should operate; they may now stop reading this article and return to
their novels.

As a concrete example of these concepts, consider the (1 +
1)-dimensional Misner spacetime
(see Figure 1)
which exhibits some of the causal features of Taub-NUT spacetime, a vacuum
solution to Einstein's gravitational field equations. It satisfies all
three of the conditions discussed above. It is temporally orientable,
and a time orientation has been singled out—the shading in the
figure indicates the future lobes of the light cones. To the past of
the partial Cauchy surface Σ_{0} lies the Taub region
where the causal structure of spacetime is as bland as can be desired.
But to the future of Σ_{0} the light cones begin to
“tip over,” and eventually the tipping results in CTCs in
the NUT region.

The issue that must be faced now is what further conditions must be
imposed in order that the appearance of CTCs to the future of
Σ_{0} can be attributed to the operation of a time
machine. Not surprisingly, the answer depends not just on the
structure of the spacetime at issue but also on the physical laws that
govern the evolution of the spacetime structure. If one adopts the
attitude that the label “time machine” is to be reserved
for devices that operate within a finite spatial range for a finite
stretch of time, then one will want to impose requirements to assure
that what happens in a compact region of spacetime lying on or to the
future of Σ_{0} is responsible for the CTCs. Or one
could be more liberal and allow the would-be time machine to be spread
over an infinite space. We will adopt the more liberal stance since it
avoids various complications while still sufficing to elicit key
points. Again, one could reserve the label “time machine”
for devices that manipulate concentrations of mass-energy in some
specified ways. For example, based on Gödel spacetime—where
matter is everywhere rotating and a CTC passes through every spacetime
point—one might conjecture that setting into sufficiently rapid
rotation a finite mass concentration of appropriate shape will
eventuate in CTCs. But with the goal in mind of proving negative
general results, it is better to proceed in a more abstract
fashion. Think of the conditions on the partial Cauchy surface
Σ_{0} as encoding the instructions for the operation of
the time machine. The details of the operation of the
device—whether it operates in a finite region of spacetime,
whether it operates by setting matter into rotation, etc.—can be
left to the side. What must be addressed, however, is whether the
processes that evolve from the state on Σ_{0} can be
deemed to be responsible for the subsequent appearance of CTCs.

## 3. When can a would-be time machine be held responsible for the emergence of CTCs?

The most obvious move is to construe “responsible for”
in the sense of causal determinism. But in the present setting this
move quickly runs into a dead end. For if CTCs exist to the future of
Σ_{0} they are not causally determined by the state on
Σ_{0} since the time travel region *V*, if it is
non-null, lies outside the *future domain of dependence*
*D*^{+}(Σ_{0}) of Σ_{0}, the
portion of spacetime where the field equations of relativistic physics
uniquely determine the state of things from the state on
Σ_{0}.^{[12]}
The point is illustrated by the toy model
of
Figure 1.
The surface labeled
*H*^{+}(Σ_{0}) is called the *future Cauchy
horizon* of Σ_{0}. It is the future boundary of
*D*^{+}(Σ_{0}),^{[13]}
and it separates the
portion of spacetime where conditions are causally determined by the
state on Σ_{0} from the portion where conditions are not so determined.
And, as advertised, the CTCs in the model of
Figure 1
lie beyond *H*^{+}(Σ_{0}).

Thus, if the operation of a Thornian time machine is to be a live
possibility, some condition weaker than causal determinism must be used
to capture the sense in which the state on Σ_{0} can be deemed to be
responsible for the subsequent development of CTCs. Given the failure
of causal determinism, it seems the next best thing to demand that the
region *V* is “adjacent” to the future domain of
dependence *D*^{+}(Σ_{0}). Here is an
initial stab at such an adjacency condition. Consider causal curves
which have a future endpoint in the time travel region *V* and
no past endpoint. Such a curve may never leave *V*; but if it
does, require that it intersects Σ_{0}. But this
requirement is too strong because it rules out Thornian time machines
altogether. For a curve of the type in question to reach
Σ_{0} it must intersect
*H*^{+}(Σ_{0}), but once it reaches
*H*^{+}(Σ_{0}) it can be continued
endlessly into the past without meeting Σ_{0} because the generators of
*H*^{+}(Σ_{0}) are past endless null
geodesics that never meet
Σ_{0}.^{[14]}
This difficulty can
be overcome by weakening the requirement at issue by rephrasing it in
terms of timelike curves rather than causal curves. Now the set of
candidate time machine spacetimes satisfying the weakened requirement
is non-empty—as illustrated, once again, by the spacetime of
Figure 1.
But the weakened requirement is too weak, as
illustrated by the (1 + 1)-dimensional version of Deutsch-Politzer
spacetime^{[15]}
(see Figure 2),
which is
constructed from two-dimensional Minkowski spacetime by deleting the
points *p*_{1}–*p*_{4} and then
gluing together the strips as shown. Every past endless timelike curve
that emerges from the time travel region *V* of Deutsch-Politzer
spacetime does meet Σ_{0}. But this spacetime is not a
plausible candidate for a time machine spacetime. Up to and including
the time Σ_{0} (which can be placed as close to
*V* as desired) this spacetime is identical with empty Minkowski
spacetime. If the state of the corresponding portion of Minkowski
spacetime is not responsible for the development of CTCs—and it
certainly is not since there are no CTCs in Minkowski
spacetime—how can the state on the portion of Deutsch-Politzer
spacetime up to and including the time Σ_{0} be held
responsible for the CTCs that appear in the future?

The deletion of the points *p*_{1}-*p*_{4}
means that the Deutsch-Politzer spacetime is singular in the sense that
it is *geodesically
incomplete*.^{[16]}
It would be too
drastic to require of a time-machine hosting spacetime that it be
geodesically complete. And in any case the offending feature of
Deutsch-Politzer can be gotten rid of by the following trick.
Multiplying the flat Lorentzian metric η_{ab} of
Deutsch-Politzer spacetime by a scalar function
*f*(*x*, *t*) > 0
produces a new metric
η′_{ab} := *f η _{ab}*
which is conformal to the original metric and, thus, has exactly the
same causal features as the original metric. But if the conformal
factor

*f*is chosen to “blow up” as the missing points

*p*

_{1}–

*p*

_{4}are approached, the resulting spacetime is geodesically complete—intuitively, the singularities have been pushed off to infinity.

A more subtle way to exclude Deutsch-Politzer spacetime focuses on
the generators of *H*^{+}(Σ_{0}). The
stipulations laid down so far for Thornian time machines imply that the
generators of *H*^{+}(Σ_{0}) cannot
intersect Σ_{0}. But in addition it can be required that
these generators do not “emerge from a singularity” and do
not “come from infinity,” and this would suffice to rule
out Deutsch-Politzer spacetime and its conformal cousins as legitimate
candidates for time machine spacetimes. More precisely, we can impose
what Stephen Hawking (1992a,b) calls the requirement that
*H*^{+}(Σ_{0}) be *compactly generated*;
namely, the past endless null geodesics that generate
*H*^{+}(Σ_{0}) must, if extended far
enough into past, fall into and remain in a compact subset of
spacetime. Obviously the spacetime of
Figure 1
fulfills Hawking's requirement—since in this case
*H*^{+}(Σ_{0}) is itself compact—but
just as obviously the spacetime of
Figure 2
(conformally doctored or not) does not.

Imposing the requirement of a compactly generated future Cauchy
horizon has not only the negative virtue of excluding some unsuited
candidate time machine spacetimes but a positive virtue as well. It is
easily proved that if *H*^{+}(Σ_{0}) is
compactly generated then the condition of *strong causality* is violated
on *H*^{+}(Σ_{0}), which means,
intuitively, there are almost closed causal curves near
*H*^{+}(Σ_{0}).^{[17]}
This violation can be
taken as an indication that the seeds of CTCs have been planted on
Σ_{0} and that by the time
*H*^{+}(Σ_{0}) is reached they are ready
to bloom.

However, we still have no guarantee that if CTCs do bloom to the
future of Σ_{0}, then the state on Σ_{0} is
responsible for the blooming. Of course, we have already learned that
we cannot have the iron clad guarantee of causal determinism that the
state on Σ_{0} is responsible for the actual blooming in
all of its particularity. But we might hope for a guarantee that the
state on Σ_{0} is responsible for the blooming of
*some* CTCs—the actual ones or others. The difference
takes a bit of explaining. The failure of causal determinism is aptly
pictured by the image of a future “branching” of world
histories, with the different branches representing different
alternative possible futures of (the domain of dependence of)
Σ_{0} that are compatible with the actual past and the
laws of physics. And so it is in the present setting: if
*H*^{+}(Σ_{0}) ≠ ∅,
then there will generally be different ways to extend the spacetime
model beyond *H*^{+}(Σ_{0}), all
compatible with the laws of general relativistic physics. But if CTCs
are present in all of these extensions, even through the details of
the CTCs may vary from one extension to another, then the state on
Σ_{0} can rightly be deemed to be responsible for the
fact that subsequently CTCs did develop.

Not surprisingly, the would-be time machine operator cannot hope to
set conditions on Σ_{0} such that every mathematically
possible extension of *D*^{+}(Σ_{0})
contains CTCs. Reverting to the example of
Figure 1,
a CTC-free extension of *D*^{+}(Σ_{0}) is
obtained by having the light cones “tip back up” starting
on *H*^{+}(Σ_{0}) so that although a
closed null curve develops, no CTCs appear in the extension. Here the
would-be time machine operator might hope to save the day by showing
that the extension in question is not physically possible because the
laws of physics dictate that once the light cones start to tip over in
the way shown in
Figure 1,
they keep tipping until
CTCs form. That such an appeal to the laws of physics (which in the end
may rule out the operation of a time machine) cannot be avoided is also
shown by a second way of creating CTC-free extensions of
*D*^{+}(Σ_{0}) in
Figure 1;
namely, allow the light cones to continue to tip but delete a
vertical strip of spacetime extending from
*H*^{+}(Σ_{0}) into the future, thus
preventing a timelike curve from circling around the cylinder and
closing on itself. This and similar examples can be bypassed by the
additional reasonable requirement that the relevant extensions to
consider are *maximal*, i.e., cannot be further extended in the sense of
being isometrically embeddable as a proper subset of a larger
spacetime. But (as the alert reader will have perceived) this
additional requirement can be finessed by means of the stratagem used
above; namely, multiplying the metric by a conformal factor does not
change the causal features of the model, but by choosing this factor to
approach 0 or ∞ as the deleted strip is approached the maximality
of the extension can be secured.

At this juncture the natural move for the would-be time machine
operator is to try to show that the maximal CTC-free extensions created
by the conformal doctoring exceed the bounds of physical possibility.
In general relativity theory these bounds are set using the
*stress-energy tensor* *T _{ab}*, which specifies the
distribution of matter-energy in the spacetime
(

*M*,

*g*). The basic requirement is that together

_{ab}*T*and

_{ab}*g*satisfy the Einstein gravitational field equations for all of

_{ab}*M*. But without further specificity this requirement does little to limit the possible metrics of spacetime. For given an arbitrary metric

*g*defined on

_{ab}*M*, the Einstein tensor

*G*[

_{ab}*g*]—a functional constructed from the metric

_{ab}*g*and its derivatives—can be computed and the result taken to define a stress-energy tensor

_{ab}*T*; the resulting pair

_{ab}*T*and

_{ab}*g*automatically satisfies the Einstein gravitational field equations, which have the form

_{ab}*G*[

_{ab}*g*] ∝

_{ab}*T*. The requirement that the Einstein equations be satisfied gains bite in one of two ways: either by imposing energy conditions on

_{ab}*T*, such as the

_{ab}*weak energy condition*that says that the energy density is non-negative and/or the

*dominant energy condition*which says that the flow of energy-momentum is not spacelike;

^{[18]}or by requiring that

*T*arises from known matter fields and that together

_{ab}*T*and

_{ab}*g*satisfy the coupled Einstein-matter field equations.

_{ab}
Alas, it seems that the would-be time machine operator is not saved
by appeal to these or other requirements that can be stated in terms of
local conditions on *T _{ab}* and

*g*. A theorem by Krasnikov (2002, 2003) establishes that for every time-oriented spacetime (

_{ab}*M*,

*g*), there exists a maximal extension that does not contain any CTCs, except, perhaps, in the chronological past of the image of

_{ab}*M*in the extension. Furthermore, Krasnikov shows how these extensions can be constructed such that local conditions, such as satisfying the Einstein field equations or energy conditions, can be carried over from the initial spacetime to the maximal CTC-free extension. Thus, if a time machine were defined as a device which leads to CTCs in

*all*possible extensions of

*H*

^{+}(Σ

_{0}) satisfying the conditions laid down thus far, it appears as if Krasnikov's theorem effectively prohibits time machines.

The would-be time machine operator need not capitulate in the face
of Krasnikov's theorem. Recall that the main difficulty in specifying
the conditions for the successful operation of Thornian time machines
traces to the fact that the standard form of causal determinism does
not apply to the production of CTCs. But causal determinism can fail
for reasons that have nothing to do with CTCs or other acausal features
of relativistic spacetimes, and it seems only fair to assure that these
modes of failure have been removed before proceeding to discuss the
prospects for time machines. To zero in on the modes of failure at
issue, consider vacuum solutions (*T _{ab}* ≡ 0) to
Einstein's field equations. Let
(

*M*,

*g*) and (

_{ab}*M*′,

*g*′

_{ab}) be two such solutions, and let

*Σ ⊂*and Σ′ ⊂

*M**M*′ be spacelike hypersurfaces of their respective spacetimes. Suppose that there is an isometry Ψ from some neighborhood

*N*(Σ) of Σ onto a neighborhood

*N*′(Σ′) of Σ′. Does it follow, as we would want determinism to guarantee, that Ψ is extendible to an isometry from

*D*

^{+}(Σ) onto

*D*

^{+}(Σ′)? To see why the answer is negative, start with any solution (

*M*,

*g*) of the vacuum Einstein equations, and cut out a closed set of points lying to the future of

_{ab}*N*(Σ) and in

*D*

^{+}(Σ). Denote the surgically altered manifold by

*M** and the restriction of

*g*to

_{ab}*M** by

*g**. Then (

_{ab}*M**,

*g**

_{ab}) is also a solution of the vacuum Einstein equations. But obviously the pair of solutions (

*M*,

*g*) and (

_{ab}*M**,

*g**

_{ab}) violates the condition that determinism was supposed to guarantee as Ψ is not extendible to an isometry from

*D*

^{+}(Σ) onto

*D*

^{+}(Σ*). It might seem that the requirement, contemplated above, that the spacetimes under consideration be maximal, already rules out spacetimes that have “holes” in them. But while maximality does rule out the surgically mutilated spacetime just constructed, it does not guarantee hole freeness in the sense needed to make sure that determinism does not stumble before it gets to the starting gate. That (

*M*,

*g*) is hole free in the relevant sense requires that if Σ ⊂

_{ab}*M*is a spacelike hypersurface, there does not exist a spacetime (

*M*′,

*g*′

_{ab}) and an isometric embedding Φ of

*D*

^{+}(Σ) into

*M*′ such that Φ(

*D*

^{+}(Σ)) is a proper subset of

*D*

^{+}(Φ(Σ)). A theorem due to Robert Geroch (1977, 87), who is responsible for this definition, asserts that if Σ ⊂

*M*and Σ′ ⊂

*M*′ are spacelike hypersurfaces in hole-free spacetimes (

*M*,

*g*) and (

_{ab}*M*′,

*g*′

_{ab}), respectively, and if there exists an isometry Ψ:

*M*→

*M*′, then Ψ is indeed extendible to an isometry between

*D*

^{+}(Σ) and

*D*

^{+}(Σ′). Thus, hole freeness precludes an important mode of failure of determinism which we wish to exclude in our discussion of time machines. It can be shown that hole freeness entails, but is not entailed by, maximality.

^{[19]}And it is just this gap that gives the would-be time machine operator some hope, for it is not obvious that Krasnikov's construction, which produces maximal CTC-free extensions, also produces hole-free extensions.

Thus, we propose that one clear sense of what it would mean for a
Thornian time machine to operate in the setting of general relativity
theory is given by the following assertion: the laws of general
relativistic physics allow solutions containing a partial Cauchy
surface Σ_{0} such that no CTCs lie to the past of
Σ_{0} but every extension of
*D*^{+}(Σ_{0}) as a hole free solution of
the laws contains CTCs. Correspondingly, a proof of the physical
impossibility of time machines would take the form of showing that this
assertion is false for the actual laws of physics, consisting,
presumably, of Einstein's field equations plus energy conditions and,
perhaps, some additional restrictions as well. And a proof of the
emptiness of the associated concept of a Thornian time machine would
take the form of showing that the assertion is false independently of
the details of the laws of physics, as long as they take the form of
local conditions on *T _{ab}* and

*g*.

_{ab}If such an emptiness proof should be forthcoming, the fan of time machines can retreat to a weaker concept of Thornian time machine by taking a page from probabilistic accounts of causation, the idea being that a time machine can be seen to be at work if its operation increases the probability of the appearance of CTCs. Since general relativity theory itself is innocent of probabilities, they have to be introduced by hand, either by inserting them into the models of the theory, i.e., by modifying the theory at the level of the object-language, or by defining measures on sets of models, i.e., by modifying the theory at the level of the meta-language. Since the former would change the character of the theory, only the latter will be considered. The project for making sense of the notion that a time machine as a probabilistic cause of the appearance of CTCs would then take the following form. First define a normalized measure on the set of models having a partial Cauchy surface to the past of which there are no CTCs. Then show that the subset of models that have CTCs to the future of the partial Cauchy surface has non-zero measure. Next, identify a range of conditions on or near the partial Cauchy surface that are naturally construed as settings of a device that is a would-be probabilistic cause of CTCs, and show that the subset of models satisfying these conditions has non-zero measure. Finally, show that conditionalizing on the latter subset increases the measure of the former subset. Assuming that this formal exercise can be successfully carried out, there remains the task of justifying the measure constructed as a measure of objective chance. This task is especially daunting in the cosmological setting since neither of the leading interpretations of objective chance seems applicable. The frequency interpretation is strained since the development of CTCs may be a non-repeated phenomenon; and the propensity interpretation is equally strained since, barring just-so stories about the Creator throwing darts at the Cosmic Dart Board, there is no chance mechanism for producing cosmological models.

We conclude that, even apart from general doubts about a probabilistic account of causation, the resort to a probabilistic conception of time machines is a desperate stretch, at least in the context of classical general relativity theory. In a quantum theory of gravity, a probabilistic conception of time machines may be appropriate if the theory itself provides the transition probabilities between the relevant states. But an evaluation of this prospect must wait until the theory of quantum gravity is available.

## 4. No-go results for (Thornian) time machines in classical general relativity theory

In order to appreciate the physics literature aimed at proving no-go
results for time machines it is helpful to view these efforts as part
of the broader project of proving *chronology protections
theorems*, which in turn is part of a still larger project of
proving *cosmic censorship theorems*. To explain, we start with
cosmic censorship and work backwards.

For sake of simplicity, concentrate on the initial value problem for
vacuum solutions (*T _{ab}* ≡ 0) to Einstein's
field equations. Start with a three-manifold Σ equipped with
quantities which, when Σ is embedded as a spacelike submanifold
of spacetime, become initial data for the vacuum field equations.
Corresponding to the initial data there exists a
unique

^{[20]}maximal development (

*M*,

*g*) for which (the image of the embedded) Σ is a Cauchy surface.

_{ab}^{[21]}This solution, however, may not be maximal simpliciter, i.e., it may be possible to isometrically embed it as a proper part of a larger spacetime, which itself may be a vacuum solution to the field equations; if so Σ will not be a Cauchy surface for the extended spacetime, which fails to be a globally hyperbolic spacetime.

^{[22]}This situation can arise because of a poor choice of initial value hypersurface, as illustrated in Figure 3 by taking Σ to be the indicated spacelike hyperboloid of (1 + 1)-dimensional Minkowski spacetime. But, more interestingly, the situation can arise because the Einstein equations allow various pathologies, collectively referred to as “naked singularities,” to develop from regular initial data. The strong form of Penrose's celebrated

*cosmic censorship conjecture*proposes that, consistent with Einstein's field equations, such pathologies do not arise under physically reasonable conditions or else that the conditions leading to the pathologies are highly non-generic within the space of all solutions to the field equations. A small amount of progress has been made on stating and proving precise versions of this conjecture.

^{[23]}

One way in which strong cosmic censorship can be violated is through
the emergence of acausal features. Returning to the example of Misner
spacetime
(Figure 1),
the spacetime up to
*H*^{+}(Σ_{0}) is the unique maximal
development of the vacuum Einstein equations for which
Σ_{0} is a Cauchy surface. But this development is
extendible, and in the extension illustrated in
Figure 1
global hyperbolicity of the development is lost because of the
presence of CTCs. The *chronology protection conjecture* then
can be construed as a subconjecture of the cosmic censorship
conjecture, saying, roughly, that consistent with Einstein field
equations, CTCs do not arise under physically reasonable conditions or
else that the conditions are highly non-generic within the space of all
solutions to the field equations. No-go results for time machines are
then special forms of chronology protection theorems that deal with
cases where the CTCs are manufactured by time machines. In the other
direction, a very general chronology protection theorem will
automatically provide a no-go result for time machines, however that
notion is understood, and a theorem establishing strong cosmic
censorship will automatically impose chronology protection.

The most widely discussed chronology protection theorem/no-go result
for time machines in the context of classical general relativity theory
is due to Hawking (1992a). Before stating the result, note first that,
independently of the Einstein field equations and energy conditions, a
partial Cauchy surface Σ must be compact if its future Cauchy
horizon *H*^{+}(Σ) is compact (see Hawking 1992a
and Chrusciel and Isenberg 1993). However, it is geometrically allowed
that Σ is non-compact if *H*^{+}(Σ) is
required only to be compactly generated rather than compact. But what
Hawking showed is that this geometrical possibility is ruled out by
imposing Einstein's field equations and the weak energy condition.
Thus, if Σ_{0} is a partial Cauchy surface representing
the situation just before or just as the would-be Thornian time machine
is switched on, and if a necessary condition for seeing a Thornian time
machine at work is that *H*^{+}(Σ_{0}) is
compactly generated, then consistently with Einstein's field equations
and the weak energy condition, a Thornian time machine cannot operate
in a spatially open universe since Σ_{0} must be
compact.

This no-go result does not touch the situation illustrated in
Figure 1.
Taub-NUT spacetime is a vacuum solution to
Einstein's field equations so the weak energy condition is
automatically satisfied, and
*H*^{+}(Σ_{0}) is compact and, a fortiori,
compactly generated. Hawking's theorem is not contradicted since
Σ_{0} is compact. By the same token the theorem does not
speak to the possibility of operating a Thornian time machine in a
spatially closed universe. To help fill the gap, Hawking proved that
when Σ_{0} is compact and
*H*^{+}(Σ_{0}) is compactly generated, the
Einstein field equations and the weak energy condition together
guarantee that both the convergence and shear of the null geodesic
generators of *H*^{+}(Σ_{0}) must vanish,
which he interpreted to imply that no observers can cross over
*H*^{+}(Σ_{0}) to enter the chronology
violating region *V*. But rather than showing that it is
physically impossible to operate a Thornian time machine in a closed
universe, this result shows only that, given the correctness of
Hawking's interpretation, the observers who operate the time machine
cannot take advantage of the CTCs it produces.

There are two sources of doubt about the effectiveness of Hawking's
no-go result even for open universes. The first stems from possible
violations of the weak energy condition by stress-energy tensors
arising from classical relativistic matter fields (see Vollick 1997 and
Visser and Barcelo
2000).^{[24]}
The second stems from the fact that
Hawking's theorem functions as a chronology protection theorem only by
way of serving as a potential no-go result for Thornian time machines
since the crucial condition that
*H*^{+}(Σ_{0}) is compactly generated is
supposedly justified by being a necessary condition for the operation
of such machine. But in retrospect, the motivation for this condition
seems frayed. As argued in the previous section, if the Einstein field
equations and energy conditions entail that all hole free extensions of
*D*^{+}(Σ_{0}) contain CTCs, then it is
plausible to see a Thornian time machine at work, quite regardless of
whether or not *H*^{+}(Σ_{0}) is compactly
generated or not. Of course, it remains to establish the existence of
cases where this entailment holds. If it should turn out that there are
no such cases, then the prospects of Thornian time machines are dealt a
severe blow, but the reasons are independent of Hawking's theorem. On
the other hand, if such cases do exist then our conjecture would be
that they exist even when some of the generators of
*H*^{+}(Σ_{0}) come from singularities or
infinity and, thus, *H*^{+}(Σ_{0}) is not
compactly
generated.^{[25]}

## 5. No-go results in quantum gravity

Three degrees of quantum involvement in gravity can be
distinguished. The first degree, referred to as quantum field theory
on curved spacetimes, simply takes off the shelf a spacetime provided
by general relativity theory and then proceeds to study the behavior
of quantum fields on this background spacetime. The Unruh effect,
which predicts the thermalization of a free scalar quantum field near
the horizon of a black hole, lies within this ambit. The second degree
of involvement, referred to as semi-classical quantum gravity,
attempts to calculate the backreaction of the quantum fields on
spacetime metric by computing the expectation value
<Ψ|*T _{ab}*|Ψ> of the stress-energy
tensor in some appropriate quantum state |Ψ>
and then inserting the value into Einstein's field equations in place
of

*T*.

_{ab}^{[26]}Hawking's celebrated prediction of black hole radiation belongs to this ambit.

^{[27]}The third degree of involvement attempts to produce a genuine quantum theory of gravity in the sense that the gravitational degrees of freedom are quantized. Currently loop quantum gravity and string theory are the main research programs aimed at this goal.

^{[28]}

The first degree of quantum involvement, if not opening the door to
Thornian time machines, at least seemed to remove some obstacles since
quantum fields are known to lead to violations of the energy
conditions used in the setting of classical general relativity theory
to prove chronology protection theorems and no-go results for time
machines. However, the second degree of quantum involvement seemed,
at least initially, to slam the door shut. The intuitive idea was
this. Start with a general relativistic spacetime where CTCs develop
to the future of *H*^{+}(Σ) (often referred to as
the “chronology horizon”) for some suitable partial Cauchy
surface Σ. Find that the propagation of a quantum field on this
spacetime background is such that
<Ψ|*T _{ab}*|Ψ> “blows up” as

*H*

^{+}(Σ) is approached from the past. Conclude that the backreaction on the spacetime metric creates unbounded curvature, which effectively cuts off the future development that would otherwise eventuate in CTCs. These intuitions were partly vindicated by detailed calculations in several models. But eventually a number of exceptions were found in which the backreaction remains arbitrarily small near

*H*

^{+}(Σ).

^{[29]}This seemed to leave the door ajar for Thornian time machines.

But fortunes were reversed once again by a result of Kay, Radzikowski,
and Wald (1997). The details of their theorem are too technical to
review here, but the structure of the argument is easy to grasp. The
naïve calculation of <Ψ|*T _{ab}*|Ψ>
results in infinities which have to be subtracted off to produce a
renormalized expectation value
<Ψ|

*T*|Ψ>

_{ab}*with a finite value. The standard renormalization procedure uses a limiting procedure that is mathematically well-defined if, and only if, a certain condition obtains.*

_{R}^{[30]}The KRW theorem shows that this condition is violated for points on

*H*

^{+}(Σ) and, thus, that the expectation value of the stress-energy tensor is not well-defined at the chronology horizon.

While the KRW theorem is undoubtedly of fundamental importance for
semi-classical quantum gravity, it does not serve as an effective
no-go result for Thornian time machines. In the first place, the
theorem assumes, in concert with Hawking's chronology protection
theorem, that *H*^{+}(Σ) is compactly generated,
and we repeat that it is far from clear that this assumption is
necessary for seeing a Thornian time machine in operation. A second,
and more fundamental, reservation applies even if a compactly
generated *H*^{+}(Σ) is accepted as a necessary
condition for time machines. The KRW theorem functions as a no-go
result by providing a *reductio ad absurdum* with a dubious
absurdity: roughly, if you try to operate a Thornian time machine, you
will end up invalidating semi-classical quantum gravity. But
semi-classical quantum gravity was never viewed as anything more than
a stepping stone to a genuine quantum theory of gravity, and its
breakdown is expected to be manifested when Planck-scale physics comes
into play. This worry is underscored by Visser's (1997, 2003) findings
that in chronology violating models trans-Planckian physics can be
expected to come into play before *H*^{+}(Σ) is
reached.

It thus seems that if some quantum mechanism is to serve as the basis
for chronology protection, it must be found in the third degree of
quantum involvement in gravity. Both loop quantum gravity and string
theory have demonstrated the ability to cure some of the curvature
singularities of classical general relativity theory. But as far as we
are aware there are no demonstrations that either of these approaches
to quantum gravity can get rid of the acausal features exhibited in
various solutions to Einstein's field equations. An alternative
approach to formulate a fully-fledged quantum theory of gravity
attempts to capture the Planck-scale structure of spacetime by
constructing it from causal
sets.^{[31]}
Since these sets must be acyclic, i.e., no element in a causal set
can causally precede itself, CTCs are ruled out a priori. Actually, a
theorem due to Malament (1977) suggests that any Planck-scale approach
encoding only the causal structure of a spacetime cannot permit CTCs
either in the smooth classical spacetimes or a corresponding
phenomenon in their quantum
counterparts.^{[32]}

In sum, the existing no-go results that use the first two degrees of quantum involvement are not very convincing, and the third degree of involvement is not mature enough to allow useful pronouncements.

## 6. Conclusion

Hawking opined that “[i]t seems there is a chronology protection
agency, which prevents the appearance of closed timelike curves and so
makes the universe safe for historians” (1992a, 603). He may be
right, but to date there are no convincing arguments that such an
Agency is housed in either classical general relativity theory or in
semi-classical quantum gravity. And it is too early to tell whether
this Agency is housed in loop quantum gravity or string theory. But
even if it should turn out that Hawking is wrong in that the laws of
physics do not support a Chronology Protection Agency, it could still
be the case that the laws support an Anti-Time Machine Agency. For it
could turn out that while the laws do not prevent the development of
CTCs, they also do not make it possible to attribute the appearance of
CTCs to the workings of any would-be time machine. We argued that a
strong presumption in favor of the latter would be created in
classical general relativity theory by the demonstration that for any
model satisfying Einstein's field equations and energy conditions as
well as possessing a partial Cauchy surface Σ_{0} to the
future of which there are CTCs, there are hole free extensions of
*D*^{+}(Σ_{0}) satisfying Einstein's
field equations and energy conditions but containing no CTCs to the
future of Σ_{0}. There are no doubt alternative
approaches to understanding what it means for a device to be
“responsible for” the development of CTCs. Exploring
these alternatives is one place that philosophers can hope to make a
contribution to an ongoing discussion that, to date, has been carried
mainly by the physics community. Participating in this discussion
means that philosophers have to forsake the activity of logical
gymnastics with the paradoxes of time travel for the more arduous but
(we believe) rewarding activity of digging into the foundations of
physics.

Time machines may never see daylight, and perhaps so for principled reasons that stem from basic physical laws. But even if mathematical theorems in the various theories concerned succeed in establishing the impossibility of time machines, understanding why time machines cannot be constructed will shed light on central problems in the foundations of physics. As we have argued in Section 4, for instance, the hunt for time machines in general relativity theory should be interpreted as a core issue in studying the fortunes of Penrose's cosmic censorship conjecture. This conjecture arguably constitutes the most important open problem in general relativity theory. Similarly, as discussed in Section 5, mathematical theorems related to various aspects of time machines offer results relevant for the search of a quantum theory of gravity. In sum, studying the possibilities for operating a time machine turns out to be not a scientifically peripheral or frivolous weekend activity but a useful way of probing the foundations of classical and quantum theories of gravity.

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## Related Entries

determinism: causal | space and time: the hole argument | time: thermodynamic asymmetry in | time travel: and modern physics

### Acknowledgments

We thank Carlo Rovelli for discussions and John Norton for comments on an earlier draft. C.W. acknowledges support by the Swiss National Science Foundation (grant PBSK1-102693).