Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Value Theory

Three Strategies for Solving the Wrong Kind of Reasons Problem

(1) Some authors have advocated denying that incentives like that provided by the evil demon's threat can ever provide you any reason to desire something bad. At most, they can provide you with a reason to intend to desire something bad, or to try to desire something bad. These authors typically explain away the apparent plausibility of the examples by attributing it to a widespread confusion between reasons to desire something, and reasons to get oneself to desire it. Similar things can be said about pragmatic reasons for belief, such as those entertained by Pascal in his wager. According to these theorists, reasoning like that in Pascal's wager doesn't give Pascal any reason whatsoever to believe in God — only reason to try to get himself to believe in God, which is quite a different thing.

This strategy obviously rises or falls with the plausibility of this highly committing claim. It may be true, but it doesn't have to be true, in order to solve the Wrong Kind of Reasons problem. If there are, in fact, both right and wrong kinds of reason to desire, but the Fitting Attitudes account makes reference only to reasons of the right kind, that would do as well at avoiding the problem as the initially counterintuitive hypothesis that there are not, in fact, any reasons of the wrong kind, in the first place. This makes it difficult to see what denying that there are any such reasons in the first place could be important enough to merit attributing the widespread confusion between reasons to desire and reasons to get oneself to desire, that this strategy requires. So this first sort of strategy does better, when supplemented by independent support.

(2) A competing strategy to solve the problem is to appeal, in one's Fitting Attitudes account, to a different deontic concept than “ought” or “reason”. It may be, according to this approach, that external incentives like monetary rewards or threats of harm can affect what one ought or has reason to desire, but there is another class of deontic concepts which are unaffected by such considerations. For example, it is plausible that monetary incentives don't affect which moves are legal or correct moves of some game. So deontic notions like legality and correctness may be closer to the kind of thing to which a successful Fitting Attitudes account needs to appeal, in contrast to ought or reason.

Nothing about the basic question of the priority between the evaluative and the deontic would be affected by this switch. But it is impacted by the popular idea of Reason-Basicness: that all normative concepts need to be understood in terms of reasons. Some philosophers have even gone so far as to claim that being accountable for in terms of reasons is constitutive of being normative, in the first place. And this idea is itself one of the motivations for adopting a Scanlon-style Fitting Attitudes theory. But theorists with this background commitment can accept this second solution to the Wrong Kind of Reasons problem only if concepts like legality and correctness can themselves be accounted for in terms of reasons. But accounting for correctness in terms of reasons itself requires a solution to the Wrong Kind of Reasons problem. So though philosophers who accept the thesis of Reason-Basicness may agree with this second solution, they can't hold that it is the whole story.

(3) According to yet a third strategy, this problem can be finessed by paying attention to who needs to have the reason to desire, according to the Fitting Attitudes account. Recall that the Sidgwickian slogan only mentions what “ought to be” desired, without making any reference to who ought to desire it. Similarly, the Scanlonian slogan only mentions what “provides reason”, without making any reference to for whom they are reasons. Yet a simple observation suggests that a great deal turns on this. For though special incentives may provide some people, under some circumstances, reasons to desire bad things, these reasons will be idiosyncratic with respect to desirers — reasons only for certain desirers, who have been offered the special incentives. Similarly, though credible threats may provide some people, under some circumstances, with sufficient reason to cheat at some game, those reasons are idiosyncratic, and not generally shared by players of that game. So if our Fitting Attitudes account says that something is good just in case necessarily, everyone (perhaps in some important class) has reason to desire it, then idiosyncratic reasons such as those created by external incentives will not constitute any sort of counterexample, in the first place. (This is just a sketch of what such an account might look like.)

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