Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Wittgenstein's Logical Atomism

1. This observation is owed to Ray Monk. See Monk 1996, 200. It was brought to my attention by Peter Simons.

2. Wittgenstein's logical atomism is related to his logical constructivism, according to which every proposition is the result of successive applications of one logical operation — the so-called “N-operator” — to a base of elementary propositions, but this topic goes beyond the scope of the present entry. For a discussion see Geach 1981, 1982; Fogelin 1982, 1987; Soames 1983.

3. There are difficulties in stating the appropriate constraints on these replacements. We cannot say that a given apparent name should be replaced by a synonymous term for a complex since Wittgenstein denies that sub-sentential expressions have sense (3.3). But nor would it be correct to say that an apparent name should be replaced by a co-referring expression, for strictly speaking, terms for complexes do not refer. It seems we can only say that the replacing term should have the same apparent reference as the term it replaces. By this means we might secure preservation of modal truth conditions, but whether that is all that Tractarian analysis is supposed to preserve is an open question.

4. In the original the word “about” occurs ungrammatically in the ellipsis. This seems to be a slip.

5. In the analysis of sentences containing “the F” espoused by Russell immediately prior to his adoption of theory of descriptions, the phrase “the F” is taken to have meaning in isolation. The meaning of “the F” is a propositional constituent distinct from the F, which bears the special relation of “denoting” to the F. The phrase “the F” is considered to both express and designate this “denoting concept.” The theory of descriptions, because it treats “the F” as having no meaning in isolation, enables one to recognize sentences in which “the F” occurs as expressing propositions without incurring a commitment to denoting concepts.

6. Both the claim that having an “indeterminate sense” is to be understood as failing to be truth-valued with respect to some possible world and the claim that Wittgenstein holds it to be essential to a proposition to have a determinate sense are defended on detailed textual grounds in Proops 2004, Section 5.

7. The general strategy of the argument of this paragraph, though not all of the details, is owed to Michael Kremer (in conversation).

8. At 3.0321, for example, he says: “We could present spatially an atomic fact which contradicted the laws of physics ” Although the immediate point of this remark is to draw a contrast with geometrical spatial presentations or pictures which cannot contradict the laws of geometry, it provides clear evidence that Wittgenstein takes possibility to outstrip physical possibility, for he holds that whatever we can picture—and presumably “spatial presentations” count as pictures—is possible (cf. 3 together with 3.02).

9. “Logical product (sum)” is Wittgenstein's terminology—borrowed from Russell—for a conjunction (disjunction).

10. The significance of these self-critical remarks from Moore's notes of Wittgenstein's lectures is discussed at length in Proops 2001.