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Mary Wollstonecraft

First published Wed Apr 16, 2008

Mary Wollstonecraft (1759–1798) was a moral and political theorist whose analysis of the condition of women in modern society retains much of its original radicalism. One of the reasons her pronouncements on the subject remain challenging is that her reflections on the status of the female sex were part of an attempt to come to a comprehensive understanding of human relations within a civilization increasingly governed by acquisitiveness. Her first publication was on the education of daughters, but she went on to write about politics, history and various aspects of philosophy in a number of different genres that included critical reviews, translations, pamphlets, and novels. Best known for her Vindication of the Rights of Woman (1792), her influence went beyond the substantial contribution to feminism she is mostly remembered for and extended to shaping the art of travel writing as a literary genre and, through her account of her journey through Scandinavia, she had an impact on the Romantic movement.

1. Biography

The second of seven children, Mary Wollstonecraft was born in Spitalfields, London, on 27 April 1759, in a house in Primrose Street. Her paternal grandfather was a successful master weaver who left a sizeable legacy, but her father, Edward John, mismanaged his share of the inheritance. He tried to establish himself as a gentleman farmer in Epping. This was the first of the family's several moves, each of which marked its financial and social decline. Only Mary's brother, Edward (Ned), was to receive a formal education; he became a lawyer. He had also inherited directly from his grandfather a substantial part of the latter's legacy.

Wollstonecraft's own somewhat haphazard education was, however, not entirely unusual for someone of her sex and position, nor was it particularly deficient. Her published writings show her to have acquired a true command of the Bible, a good knowledge of the works of several of the most famous ancients and of the writings of Shakespeare and Milton. The nature and extent of her reading was partly owed to the friendship shown to her in her youth by a retired clergyman and his wife. Nevertheless, as a woman from an impecunious family, her prospects were very limited. In relatively rapid succession, she was to enter the most likely occupations for someone of her sex and circumstances: a lady's companion, a schoolteacher, and a governess.

In 1778, she was engaged as a companion to a Mrs Dawson and lived at Bath. She returned home to nurse her ailing mother in the latter part of 1781. After Mrs Wollstonecraft's death, in the spring of 1782, Mary lived with the Bloods, the impoverished family of her dearest friend, Fanny. In the winter of 1783, Mary left them in order to attend to her sister Eliza and her newly born daughter. There followed the first of the emotionally very difficult episodes in Mary's life. What prompted Mary to intervene as decisively as she did in her sister's marriage remains somewhat of a mystery; but in the course of January 1784, Mary took her sister away, and the two women went into hiding, leaving Eliza's infant daughter behind; the baby died the following August.

By February of that year, the two sisters had already been planning to establish a school with Fanny Blood. Mary's other sister, Everina, joined in the project a little later. They first set their sights on Islington, then moved to Newington Green, where Mary met the moral and political thinker, the Reverend Richard Price, head of Newington's thriving Dissenting community, and heard him preach. This was a crucial encounter for Mary. Several years later, she was to rise to his defence in a Vindication of the Rights of Men (1790), and it was through her connections to members of this community that she was to gain an introduction to her future publisher, friend, and one might even say, patron, Joseph Johnson.

In November 1785, Wollstonecraft set off on a trip to Lisbon, where her friend Fanny, who had married that February, was expecting her first child. On board the ship, Mary met a man suffering from consumption; she nursed him for a fortnight, the length of the journey. This experience is related in her first novel, Mary, a Fiction (1788). She gained a very unfavourable opinion of Portuguese life and society, which seemed to her ruled by irrationality and superstitions. Mary's brief stay in Portugal was, furthermore, to be a profoundly unhappy one, for both Fanny and her baby died shortly after the delivery.

On her return to England, Wollstonecraft found her school in a dire state. Far from providing her with a reliable income and some stability, it was to be a source of endless worries and a financial drain. Only Joseph Johnson's advance on her first book, Thoughts on the Education of Daughters: with Reflections on Female Conduct in the more important Duties of Life (1787) helped ease her considerable financial difficulties. It consists of brief discussions on such topics as ‘Moral Discipline’, ‘Artificial Manners’, ‘Boardings-Schools’, ‘The Benefits Which Arise From Disappointments’, ‘The Observance of Sunday’, and ‘On the Treatment of Servants’.

Following the collapse of her school, Wollstonecraft became a governess to the family of Lord Kingsborough for a brief and unsatisfactory period. The position took her to Ireland, where she completed Mary, A Fiction. On her return to London, Joseph Johnson came to the rescue once again by giving her some literary employment. In 1787, she also began, but never completed, The Cave of Fancy. A Tale. The same year, she wrote Original Stories from Real Life; with Conversations, calculated to Regulate the Affections, and Form the Mind to Truth and Goodness (1788); it appeared in two other London editions in her life time (1791 and 1796), the last of which illustrated by William Blake. Wollstonecraft's anthology, The Female Reader; Miscellaneous Pieces in Prose and Verse; Selected from the Best Writers and Disposed under Proper Heads; for the Improvement of Young Women (1789), was compiled in the same period and published under the name of ‘Mr. Cresswick, teacher of Elocution’; it pursues themes to be found in her previous works and contains excerpts mostly from the Bible and Shakespeare's plays, as well as many by various eighteenth-century authors, such as Voltaire, Hume, Steele, Charlotte Smith, and Madame de Genlis.

To understand the extent to which Wollstonecraft made up for the lack of a formal education, it is essential to remember that her talents extended to translating and reviewing, and that these two activities, quite apart from her own intellectual curiosity, acquainted her with a great many authors, including Leibniz and Kant. She translated Jacques Necker's Of the Importance of Religious Opinions (1788), Rev. C. G. Salzmann's Elements of Morality, for the Use of Children; with an Introductory Address to Parents (1790), and Madame de Cambon's Young Grandison (1790). In each case, the texts she produced were almost as if her own, not just because she was in agreement with their original authors, but because she more or less re-wrote them. The Reverend Salzmann is unlikely to have resented her for this, as he was to translate into German both A Vindication of the Rights of Woman and William Godwin's Memoirs of the Author of a Vindication of the Rights of Woman (1798).

Throughout the period covered by these translations Wollstonecraft wrote for the Analytical Review, which her publisher, Joseph Johnson, together with Thomas Christie, started in May 1788. She was involved with this publication either as a reviewer or as editorial assistant for most of its relatively short life. Despite her own practice of the genre, her many reviews reveal the degree to which, she, like many other moralists in the eighteenth century, feared the moral consequences of reading novels. She believed that even those of a relatively superior quality encouraged vanity and selfishness. She was to concede, however, that reading such works might nonetheless be better than not reading at all. Besides novels, Wollstonecraft reviewed poetry, travel accounts, educational works, collected sermons, biographies, natural histories, and essays and treatises on subjects such as Shakespeare, happiness, theology, music, architecture and the awfulness of solitary confinement; the authors whose works she commented on, included Madame de Staël, Emanuel Swedenborg, Lord Kames, Rousseau, and William Smellie. Until the end of 1789, her articles were mostly of a moral and aesthetic nature. However in December 1789, she reviewed a speech by her old friend, Richard Price, entitled A Discourse on the Love of our Country, delivered on Nov. 4, 1789, at the Meeting-House in the Old Jewry, to the Society for Commemorating the Revolution of Great Britain. With an Appendix, containing the report of the Committee of the Society; and Account of the Population of France; and the Declarations of the Rights by the National Assembly of France (1789). This address to the Revolution Society in commemoration of the events of 1688 partly prompted Burke to compose his very famous Reflections on the Revolution in France, and on the Proceedings in Certain Societies in London Relative to that Event (1790).

Burke's attack on Price in that work in turn led Wollstonecraft, egged on by her publisher, Johnson, to take up her pen in the aged Reverend's defence. A Vindication of the Rights of Men (1790) was almost certainly the first of many responses Burke's Reflections elicited. Initially published anonymously at the end of November, the second edition that quickly followed in mid-December bore its author's name and marked a turning point in her career; it established her a political writer. In September 1791, Wollstonecraft began A Vindication of the Rights of Woman: with Strictures on Political and Moral Subjects, which elaborated a number of points made in the previous Vindication, namely, that in most cases, marriage was nothing but a property relation, and that the education women received ensured that they could not meet the expectations society had of them and almost certainly guaranteed them an unhappy life.

Following the publication of her second Vindication, Wollstonecraft was introduced to the French statesman and diplomat, Charles Talleyrand, on his mission to London on the part of the Constituent Assembly in February 1792. She dedicated the second edition of the A Vindication of the Rights of Woman to him. In December 1792, she travelled to France where she met Gilbert Imlay, an American merchant and author of A Topographical Descriptions of the Western Territory of North America (1792) and The Emigrants (1793). As British subjects were increasingly at risk under the Terror, Wollstonecraft passed as Imlay's wife so as to benefit from the security enjoyed at the time by American citizens. They never married. Imlay was probably the source of Wollstonecraft's greatest unhappiness, first through his lack of ardour for her, then because of his infidelity, and finally because of his complete rejection of her. Most of all, her love of Imlay brought Wollstonecraft to the realisation that the passions are not so easily brought to heel by reason.

Wollstonecraft had a girl by Imlay. She was born at Le Havre in May 1794 and named Fanny, after Wollstonecraft's friend, Fanny Blood. A year after Fanny's birth, Wollstonecraft twice attempted suicide, first in May, then in October 1795. She broke with Imlay finally in March 1796. In April of the same year, she renewed her acquaintance with William Godwin and they became lovers that summer. They were to marry at St Pancras church in March 1797. On the 30th August, Mary Wollstonecraft Godwin, future author of Frankenstein and wife of Shelley, was born.

2. Pedagogical Writings

Apart from Mary, a Fiction and The Cave of Fancy Wollstonecraft's early writings were of a pedagogical nature. These reveal the profound influence John Locke had on Wollstonecraft's thought, and several of the arguments of his Some Thoughts Concerning Education (1693) are echoed in Wollstonecraft's conception of morality and the best manner to inculcate it in individuals at the earliest possible age. The opening paragraph of her Thoughts on the Education of Daughters speaks of the duty parents have to ensure that ‘reason should cultivate and govern those instincts which are implanted in us to render the path of duty pleasant—for if they are not governed they will run wild; and strengthen the passions which are ever endeavouring to obtain dominion—I mean vanity and self-love.’ Similarly, the beginning of her Original Stories from Real Life stated its author's intent, namely to seek ‘to cure those faults by reason, which ought never to have taken root in the infant mind. Good habits, imperceptibly fixed, are far preferable to the precepts of reason; but as this task requires more judgement than generally falls to the lot of parents, substitutes must be sought for, and medicines given, when regimen would have answered the purpose better’. Wollstonecraft's prescriptions to counter the deplorable education she thought her contemporaries were inflicting on their children takes the form of a tale about two girls, Mary and Caroline. At the beginning of the story, the reader finds the girls left to the management of ignorant servants (one of Locke's great bugbears), but they are eventually placed under the tuition of a woman of tenderness and discernment. The book shows how the latter succeeds in teaching contemptuous Mary and vain Caroline to avoid anger, exercise compassion, love truth and virtue, and respect the whole of God's creation.

That reason must rule supreme is a running theme of Wollstonecraft's works written prior to her sojourn in Revolutionary France and, all the more, prior to her travels through Scandinavia. It is stressed in her Vindication of the Rights of Woman (1792). Other continuities between her Thoughts on the Education of Daughters and the Vindication include her preference for an education conducted at home, and her insistence that girls and young women be made to acquire ‘inner resources’ so as to make them as psychologically independent as possible. The Thoughts also reveals Wollstonecraft's conviction that universal benevolence is the first virtue, as well as her faith in a providentially ordained universe. She enjoined her readers to prepare their children for ‘the main business of our lives’, namely, the acquisition of virtue, and, unsurprisingly given her own history, she urged parents to strengthen their children's characters so as to enhance their capacity to survive personal tragedies. Self-mastery was thus the aim of education and it was the duty of parents to ensure that their children received it.

3. Moral and Political Writings

When Wollstonecraft began to engage in political commentary in reviewing Price's A Discourse on the Love of our Country, she praised him for his account of true patriotism as ‘the result of reason, not the undirected impulse of nature, ever tending to selfish extremes’ as well as his defence of Christianity's prescription of universal benevolence against those who argued such sentiment to be incompatible with the love of one's country. She endorsed his view of liberty of conscience as a sacred right and wrote sympathetically about his plea for the repeal of the Test and Corporation Acts, which imposed civil disabilities on Dissenters. She also seemed to support his claim that the political Settlement of 1689 was wanting in that it did not make for full representation of the people and hence made only for partial liberty. Finally, Wollstonecraft reproduced the passage in which Price linked the American and French revolutions and clamoured for the end of despotism throughout Europe.

When not so long thereafter she came to write her Vindication of the Rights of Men (1790), Wollstonecraft attacked Edmund Burke for having set upon an harmless elderly preacher in his Reflections; yet her own review justifies Burke's depiction of Price's sermon as inflammatory. Far from thinking that the events taking place in France gave grounds for rejoicing, Burke feared their consequences from the very start. The National Assembly's confiscation of the Church's property, he predicted, would lead to further confiscations, undermine the fundamental right to property, and result in anarchy, which only the rise of a charismatic figure could bring to an end.

Of the many disagreements between Price and Wollstonecraft, on the one hand, and Burke, on the other, one of the deepest was over their respective view of the nature of civil society and of political power in general. The two friends believed that government, the rule of law, and all human relations could be simplified, explicated, and rendered transparent, and both were convinced that this was the task ahead for all lovers of liberty. For Burke, on the contrary, civil society consisted of countless ineffable links between individuals. The latter's relationship to authority was for the most part no less ineffable; moreover, he believed sound political judgement to be the product of experience, and he cautioned prudence. To sweep away established practices and institutions and think of politics as a mere matter of administrating in accordance with a set of abstract rules or rights uninformed by the customs and culture, and hence the national character, of a people was, in his view, to demonstrate a crass disregard for the most obvious facts of human nature and history. Burke's argument led him to dwell on France's financial position in some detail, and he defended its royal family and its Church; he insisted, moreover, that it was already benefiting from a policy of gradual reform. The over-all effect he sought to achieve was to depict his opponent as theoretically confused, politically naive, generally misinformed, and, most damnable of all, his sermon on the Love of our Country with all its affirmation of feelings for humanity proved him to be unpatriotic.

Wollstonecraft's Vindication was the first of many replies. It is an interesting and rhetorically powerful work in its own right as well as a necessary introduction to the Vindication of the Rights of Woman. It consists mostly of a sustained attack on Burke rather than a defence of the rights of man. This is partly because Wollstonecraft took for granted a Lockean conception of God-given rights discoverable by reason, except when the latter was warped by self-love. Wollstonecraft further believed that God made all things right and that the cause of all evil was man. In her view, Burke's Reflections showed its author to be blind to man-made poverty and injustice; this she attributed to his infatuation with rank, Queen Marie-Antoinette, and the English Constitution. Demonstrating her familiarity with Burke's other works and speeches, especially A Philosophical Enquiry into the Origin of our Ideas of the Sublime and Beautiful (1757) and the Speech on Conciliation with America (1775), she also argued that he was inconsistent, if only because of the impossibility, as she saw it, of reconciling his sympathy for the American cause with his reaction to events in France. In this, Wollstonecraft was far from alone and many who had followed Burke's parliamentary career and heard his Speeches to the House of Commons were astonished by what they thought was a radical and inexplicable change of position.

As she was to do in her next and more famous Vindication, Wollstonecraft did not simply clamour for rights, but emphasised that these entail duties; but she also insisted that none could be expected to perform duties whose natural rights were not respected. Furthermore she used David Hume's History of England (1754–62) to contend that England's laws were the product of historical contingency and insisted that only those institutions that could withstand the scrutiny of reason and be shown to be in conformity with natural rights and God's justice merited respect and obedience. There was no question of blanket reverence for the past and its juridical legacy. As for civilization, she thought its progress very uneven and dismissed the culture of politeness and polish as nothing but a screen behind which hypocrisy, egotism and greed festered unchecked. Finally, opposing nature and reason to artifice and politeness, she made herself the true patriot and Burke the fickle Francophile. She was the clear-headed independent thinker, he the emotive creature of a system of patronage. She exhibited manly virtues, he effeminacy.

In the midst of her tirade she turned, rather unexpectedly, to the subject of family life and the limits of parental authority, especially in relation to arranged marriages. She condemned marriages of convenience together with late marriages: both fostered immorality in her view. Indeed, from her perspective, nearly every aspect of the prevailing culture had that consequence, for, in bringing girls up to be nothing but empty headed play-things, parents made for a morally bankrupt society. Such beings could never make dutiful mothers, as they took the horizon to be the eyes of the men they flirted with. The moral depravity of a society devoted to the acquisition of property and its conspicuous display rather than to the pursuit of reason and the protection of natural rights found the means of its reproduction in the family, she contended. Here her dispute was not just with Burke, but implicitly also with Price. In his sermon, he had deplored the sexual depravity of the times that he saw embodied even in those he considered patriots. But to seek only to vindicate the rights of men, as Price had done, was insufficient and misconceived, according to Wollstonecraft. If one sought a truly moral society, the family had to be changed and this, in turn, required a complete change in the nature of the relationship between men and women before, and within, marriage. Only a sound upbringing of both the sexes could secure that. This was the nub of her attack on political theorists and educationalists alike.

When Wollstonecraft came to write The Vindication of the Rights of Woman, which she did within a matter of months following the publication of her first overtly political work, the moral rejuvenation of society and the happiness of individual women were woven together. Women were ill-prepared for their duties as social beings and imprisoned in a web of false expectations that would inevitably make them miserable. She wanted women to be transformed into rational and independent beings whose sense of worth came, not from their appearance, but from their inner perception of self-command and knowledge. Women had to be educated; their minds and bodies had to be trained. This would make them good companions, wives, mothers and citizens. Above all it would make them fully human, that is, beings ruled by reason and characterised by self-command. Besides criticisms of existing pedagogical practices and theories, most notably Rousseau's Emile (1762), the Vindication contains many social and political proposals which range from a detailed outline of necessary changes in school curriculum to the suggestion that women be granted not only civil and political rights, but have elected representatives of their own. It argues that women should be taught skills so as to be able to support themselves and their children in widowhood, and never have to marry or remarry out of financial necessity. It seeks to reclaim midwifery for women, against the encroachment of men into this profession, and contends that women could be physicians just as well as nurses. It urges women to extend their interests to encompass politics and the concerns of the whole of humanity. It also contains advice on how to make marriages last. In Wollstonecraft's view, marriages ought to have friendship rather than physical attraction as their basis. Husbands and wives ought not, moreover, to be overly intimate and should maintain a degree of reserve towards each other.

Wollstonecraft wanted women to aspire to full citizenship, to be worthy of it,and this necessitated the development of reason. Rational women would perceive their real duties. They would forgo the world of mere appearances, the world of insatiable needs on which eighteenth-century society was based, as Adam Smith had explained more lucidly than anyone, and of which France was the embodiment, in Wollstonecraft's conception.

That she embraced the social and economic consequences of her vision of happy marriages, based on friendship and producing the next moral generation was spelled out further in her subsequent work, An Historical and Moral View of the Origin and Progress of the French Revolution; and the Effect It Has Produced in Europe (1794). In that work, she endeavoured, amongst other things, to assess the merits and demerits of the progress of humanity and establish the causes of French despotism. The picture she drew of ancient régime France was of a country ruled by superstition, and morally and politically degenerate. Borrowing from Smith, whose Theory of Moral Sentiments (1759) and Inquiry into the Nature and Causes of the Wealth of Nations (1776) she had drawn on previously, she sketched a possible future society in which the division of labour would be kept to a minimum and the sexes would be not only educated together but encouraged to work in family units. Single sex institutions and, for instance, all-male workshops encouraged lasciviousness in her view. She thus looked forward to a society in which small businesses and farms would provide basic, instead of superfluous, needs.

Only the combination of her experience of her unrequited love for Imlay, the dictates of her own emotions, and the tribulations of a trip in Northern Europe led her to reconsider her views of reason. Indeed, she was to review her opinion of France, polite culture and manners, even Catholicism which she had abhorred, a loathing that her stay in Portugal had done much to strengthen The Letters Written During A Short Residence in Sweden, Norway and Denmark (1796), whose influence on travel literature as well as the romantic movement was by no means negligible, show Wollstonecraft to have begun to espouse a more nuanced view of the world, and to have sought to develop a more fluid account of the relationship between reason and passion, as well as of modernity. Thus she grew a little closer to Burke in that she came to think that the tyranny of commercial wealth might be worse than that of rank and privilege. Whilst in France, she had already begun to write less critically of the English system of government. She had witnessed the Terror, fallen in love, born a child out of wedlock, been rejected, and attempted suicide. A second suicide attempt lay ahead. So did the prospect of happiness with William Godwin, a prospect cut short by her death in childbirth. Posthumous notoriety was to follow as Wollstonecraft became identified only with the Vindication of the Rights of Woman and that work was ironically, in turn, equated with a flouting of social conventions, principally in relation to marriage.

4. Reputation

Although she was very much encouraged by her publisher, Joseph Johnson, she received little support from fellow intellectuals in her lifetime. Even Godwin did not take to her on their first meeting. Very few of the foremost women writers gave Wollstonecraft their wholehearted support in the eighteenth century. Many mocked her, but only very rarely were her ideas genuinely assessed in the way they have come to be in the last few decades. The leading poet, Anna Barbauld (1743–1825) was one of the few members of the radical intelligentsia of the time whose opposition to Wollstonecraft was the product of a real engagement with her views on women. By the end of the 1790s and for most of the nineteenth century, Wollstonecraft was derided by many, if only because of what was deemed to have been a scandalous personal life. There were, to be sure, important exceptions, especially in America. Such praise as she did receive on both sides of the Atlantic came, however, from only the most superficial acquaintance with her ideas or her intellectual persona

And so it was that from the end of the century and throughout the next, she who had endeavoured to place marriage on a solid foundation by providing an account of the education that would prepare spouses for it was to be primarily thought of as someone who had sought to pass as married when she wasn't and as the mother of an illegitimate child. Much of this reputation was owed to Godwin's frank, arguably unnecessarily frank, account of Wollstonecraft's life, in Memoirs of the Author of a ‘Vindication of the Rights of Woman’ (1798). It revealed, amongst other personal details, her relationship with Imlay and thereby cast a deep shadow over her reputation. In any event, John Stuart Mill's Subjection of Women (1869) was to eclipse most other contributions to feminist debates of the period.

In the twentieth century, and especially following the growth of feminism in the Anglo-Saxon world in the 1960s, scholars disregarded the vicissitudes of Wollstonecraft's private life and heralded her as the first English feminist. She came to be read principally within the context of the history of the women's movement. In the last two decades of the twentieth century, however, a growing number of commentators have looked at A Vindication of the Rights of Woman in its historical and intellectual context rather than in isolation or in relation to subsequent feminist theories. This has led to renewed interest in her other political writings, including her Letters Written During A Short Residence in Sweden, Norway and Denmark. Wollstonecraft is thus no longer seen as just a scandalous literary figure, nor the embodiment of a nascent feminism which only reached maturity two hundred years later, but as an Enlightenment moral and political thinker whose works present a self-contained argument about the kind of change society would need to undergo for men and women to be virtuous in both the private and the public sphere and thereby secure the chance of a measure of happiness.


Primary Sources

Listed below are the earliest editions of Wollstonecraft's works, followed by the dates of other editions published in her lifetime, and some later editions of each of the texts. All appear in The Works of Mary Wollstonecraft, Janet Todd and Marilyn Butler, eds., London, Pickering and Chatto, 1989, 7 vols (thereafter cited as Works)

Translations by Mary Wollstonecraft

All three works are included in Works.

Other works

All included in Works.

Posthumous publications

All incomplete and in Works

Other Primary Works of Relevance

Other Collections of Wollstonecraft's works


A selection:



The following is a selection. Note also, the introductions to the various editions of Wollstonecraft's works listed above.

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Burke, Edmund | feminist (interventions): ethics | Godwin, William | Locke, John