next up previous
Next: Computer Supported Collaborative Work Up: Introduction Previous: Introduction

Basic Description of Dynamic Encyclopedias

We have recently developed the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (URL = The principal innovative feature of this dynamic encyclopedia is that authors have an ftp (`file transfer protocol') account on the multi-user computer that runs the encyclopedia's World Wide Web server. This feature not only enables the encyclopedia to become functional quickly, but also gives the authors of the entries the ability to revise, expand, and update their entries whenever needed.

Traditionally, encyclopedias have not been very responsive to new research and developments in the field--it is just too expensive to publish regularly new editions in a fixed medium such as print and CD-ROM. However, a dynamic encyclopedia simply evolves and quickly adapts to reflect advances in research. We believe that the process of updating individual entries never ceases, and that any encyclopedia which takes account of this fact will necessarily be more useful in the long run than those which don't.

Authors who have a strong interest in and commitment to the topics on which they write will be motivated to keep their entries abreast of the latest advances in research. Indeed, dynamic encyclopedias may speed up the dissemination of new ideas. Of course, there may come a time when an author wants to transfer responsibility for maintaining the entry to someone else. In such cases, there is the possibility of having multiple entries on a single topic, and this is one of the new possibilities that can be explored in a dynamic encyclopedia.

Here is how we implemented our dynamic encyclopedia. We connected a multi-user (UNIX) workstation to the Internet and installed a World Wide Web server. We then created a cover page, a table of contents, an editorial page, and a directory entitled entries. We recruited Editorial Board members for the job of identifying topics, soliciting authors, and reviewing the the entries and updates when they are received. Once an Editorial Board member decides on a topic and has found an author to write it, he or she passes on the information to the Editor of the encyclopedia, who creates an ftp account and home directory for the author on the workstation and then sends the author the information on how to ftp the entries and updates when they are ready. So when authors ftp an entry or an update to their home directory, it becomes part of the encyclopedia* and the Board member responsible for that entry is automatically notified. It is then his or her responsibility to evaluate the (modified) entry and notify the author of any changes that should be made.

The innovative features of a dynamic encyclopedia that has been organized on the above plan are:

  1. It can be expanded indefinitely; there is no limit to its inclusiveness or size. New or previously unrecognized topics within a given discipline can be included as they are discovered or judged to be important.
  2. It eliminates the lag time between the writing and publication of the entries.
  3. It eliminates many of the expenses of producing a printed document or CD-ROM: typesetting, copy-editing, printing, and distribution expenses are no longer necessary.
  4. It can change in response to new technology as the latter develops, such as new tools, languages, and techniques.
In addition, statistics software for the encyclopedia can maintain logs of access to the encyclopedia, such as which sites users access it from, which entries they access most, which topics they search for, etc. Such information can help inform decisions about which additional entries to solicit, which authors to recruit to write them, etc.

An important motivating feature of using the Internet as a medium is that the encyclopedia can reach a wider audience than is possible with traditional academic journals and books. Because of this, we are recruiting authors capable of writing articles that are of interest not only to specialists.

next up previous
Next: Computer Supported Collaborative Work Up: Introduction Previous: Introduction

Eric Hammer and Edward N. Zalta
Wed May 14 17:44:00 PDT 1997