Preprint of an Article Published in
SPARC E-News, October/November 1999

Edward Zalta, Senior Research Scholar
Center for the Study of Language and Information
Stanford University

There are innovative efforts underway to address the "other" publishing crisis, namely that of costly publications in the humanities. In this article, I'll describe one such new effort — the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy — and the challenges it faces in the attempt to remain independent of commercial publishers.

In August 1998, Routledge published a new Encyclopedia of Philosophy. The pre-publication price was $3,000 (with CD). It was an expensive project to complete and so one might expect the result to be costly. But the fact is that the Routledge Encyclopedia was already out of date when it was published, for many of the entries had been written several years prior to August 1998!

At Stanford University's Center for the Study of Language and Information, we are building a new and alternative kind of reference work. The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (SEP), in contrast to the Routledge work, is a "dynamic" reference work. It enables professional philosophers around the world to collectively maintain a refereed, continuously updatable, online reference work. To implement this new concept, we developed a work-flow system which gives the authors of our entries and the members of our Board of Editors special password-protected access to our web server.

SEP authors are chosen to write entries on the basis of their expertise. They can upload their entries (and subsequent changes to their entries) to a private location on our server visible only to our Editorial Board members. The latter are notified whenever new entries or changes to entries have been posted and they can use a special web interface to view and referee the new content. So as authors go about their research and discover new and important work on their topics, they can access and update their entry, and their modifications will be vetted before publication. Errors and omissions can be corrected whenever they are discovered, and users can cite fixed, quarterly archives of the SEP.

A dynamic reference work therefore offers a rational approach to the task of tracking the important new ideas that are being published both in print and web-based media. So far, over 325 experts have accepted commissions to author and maintain 400 entries. These entries fall under 35 different general subject areas in philosophy, and for each subject area, there are often two or more subject editors who sit on our Editorial Board (there are now 60 members on our Board). Currently, over 100 of the commissioned entries have been written and are being maintained.

Dynamic reference works are not intended as replacements for electronic journals, for the latter are needed as forums dedicated solely to new research. But there are differences between the two kinds of publications. Electronic journals: (1) do not (and should not) update the articles they publish, (2) do not (and should not) aim to publish articles that introduce a comprehensive set of topics, (3) typically serve an audience of specialists, and (4) do not have to deal with the asynchronous activity of updating, refereeing, and tracking separate deadlines for entries, since they are published on a synchronized schedule.

We think that academics in other professions will see the value of dynamic reference works and organize similar projects. But in choosing to remain independent and low-cost, we do face hard questions. The most pressing of these is how to fund our project over the short and long term. The question becomes more difficult to answer when we consider that it may take 5-10 years for our growing reference work become mature and contain enough entries to command the attention of potential subscribers. Our NEH grant ends in August 2000 and we hope to obtain an NSF grant for the following three years. But without public funding during our startup period, it is not clear what we should do to meet our costs. The fact is that there is no proven, sound economic model for projects like ours. Some see professional societies as the answer. But the American Philosophical Association currently has a policy against funding publishing projects.

Even if a publishing house were to venture into uncharted commercial territory and offer to acquire our project, we would be reluctant to form such an alliance, for then everything would change. The publisher would have to pay the people who are now donating their time for the benefit of the profession, namely, the members of our Editorial Board and the authors. Authors would no longer be willing to format their own entries in HTML, since they would perceive that the publisher was offloading the task to them in order to increase profit margins. Not only would our reference work cease to be freely accessible, but our uncluttered, purely academic website might become filled with advertising. Moreover, decisions which might affect the interests of our profession (such as how much space to devote to a topic) might end up being made by people whose principal decision-making criteria focus on the effects that the decision will have on commerce.

We are therefore seeking library feedback as we forge our own model. The most likely scenario for the future is that we will have to charge university libraries around the world a yearly subscription fee (at about the cost of a good journal in philosophy), in return for which we would serve our pages to all the computers at their campus. But will university libraries be willing to subscribe during our startup period, as we grow from 100 entries to 300-500 entries? Will librarians think that the following facts justify the expense: (1) the entries published so far are high quality, in-depth pieces that are informative to both students and faculty, and not just in philosophy, (2) a minimum of 25-50 new entries are being published each year, and (3) the published entries are being maintained and updated?

These are important questions, and we may not discover the answers in advance. Whatever happens, it seems certain that if a commercial publisher were to take over our project, its cost and the cost of a subscription would rise dramatically.