Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
About the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Brief Description

Welcome to the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (SEP). From its inception, the SEP was designed so that each entry is maintained and kept up to date by an expert or group of experts in the field. All entries and substantive updates are refereed by the members of a distinguished Editorial Board before they are made public. Consequently, our dynamic reference work maintains academic standards while evolving and adapting in response to new research. You can cite fixed editions that are created on a quarterly basis and stored in our Archives (every entry contains a link to its complete archival history, identifying the fixed edition the reader should cite). The Table of Contents lists entries that are published or assigned. The Projected Table of Contents also lists entries which are currently unassigned but nevertheless projected.

The SEP's Publishing Model

The combination of features exhibited by the SEP publishing model distinguishes it from other attempts to build scholarly resources on the web. Our open access model has the following features: (1) a password-protected web interface for authors, which allows them to download entry templates, submit private drafts for review, and remotely edit/update their entries; (2) a password-protected web interface for the subject editors, which allows them to add new topics, commission new entries, referee unpublished entries and updates (updates can be displayed with the original and updated versions side-by-side with the differences highlighted) and accept/reject entries and revisions; (3) a secure web server for the principal editor, by which the entire collaborative process can be managed with a very small staff (the principal editor can add people, add entries, assign entries to editors, issue invitations, track deadlines, publish entries and updates, etc.); (4) a tracking system which logs the actions taken at the web interfaces, monitors the state of every entry, determines who owes work and when, automatically sends occasional, friendly email reminders, and provides a summary to the principal editor; (5) software which dynamically cross-references the SEP when new entries are published, and which periodically checks for broken links throughout the content; (6) software which automatically creates an archive every quarter, providing the proper basis for scholarly citation; and (7) mirror sites at universities in other parts of the world, which provide faster access to readers worldwide, provide access when the Stanford server is down for maintenance, and safeguard the digital content as extra backups. The SEP's publishing model therefore has the ability to deliver, with very low administrative and production costs, quality content meeting the highest of academic standards via a medium that is universally accessible.

Few dynamic reference works have been built to the specifications described in the previous paragraph. Most of the other encyclopedia projects available on the web lack some of the dynamic and scholarly features of the SEP. Either they (1) are costly and behind a subscription wall, invisible to search engines and so not as useful to academics and the general public; or (2) don't have an administrative system capable of screening new entries and updates prior to publication and ensuring that entries are responsive to new research, or (3) don't allow the authors/editors to directly contact the server to update/referee the content of the entries; or (4) lack a system of archives for stable, scholarly citation (thus, when entries change, the old content is just lost, and any citations to, or quotations from, prior content become impossible to verify), or (5) lack a university-based Advisory Board to vet the members of its Editorial Board.

The SEP's model may therefore represent a unique digital library concept: a scholarly dynamic reference work. A scholarly dynamic reference work differs from an academic journal, for academic journals (1) do not typically update the articles they publish, (2) do not aim to publish articles on a comprehensive set of topics, but rather, for the most part, publish articles that are randomly submitted by the members of the profession, (3) do not aim to cross-reference and create links among the concepts used in the articles they publish, (4) typically serve a narrow audience of specialists, and (5) do not have to deal with the asynchronous activity of updating, refereeing, and tracking separate deadlines for entries, since they are published on a synchronized schedule. Moreover, our reference work differs from a preprint exchanges, for the latter not only exhibit features (1), (2), (3), and (4) just mentioned, but also do not referee their publications and so need not incorporate a work-flow system that handles the asynchronous refereeing process that occurs between upload and publication in a dynamic reference work. None of this is to say that electronic journals and preprint exchanges have a faulty design, but rather that a scholarly dynamic reference work is a distinctive new kind of publication that represents a unique digital library concept.


The SEP project began in September 1995 when John Perry was the Director of the Center for the Study of Language and Information (CSLI). Perry's suggestion that CSLI enhance its web presence by creating a (static) online dictionary of philosophy was taken up by Edward N. Zalta, who developed the idea into that of a dynamic reference work. Zalta then started designing the SEP to be an online encyclopedia that would satisfy the highest academic standards. After two years of support from CSLI, our prototype became a proof of concept that earned the first of a series of successful grant applications. (See the History of Grants below.) The addition of Colin Allen and Uri Nodelman to the project in 1998 resulted in significant enhancements to the design and implementation of our new academic publishing model. They introduced browser-based file-upload, workflow principles that categorized the state of every entry and possible state transitions, remote HTML editing, an engine which compares an original and revised entry side-by-side in the browser with the differences highlighted, etc. Paul Daniell programmed/developed the new search engine that the SEP brought online in September 2006.

See the masthead on the Editorial Information page, for a list of other people involved in the project.

History of Grants

Grant Duration Grant Number Granting Organization Amount
10/1998–09/2000 #PA-23167-98 NEH/Preservation and Access Division $131,400
10/2000–09/2003 #IIS-9981549 NSF/Information and Intelligent Systems
(with support from NEH)
02/2002–08/2002 Officer's Grant Andrew W. Mellon Foundation $43,000
10/2003–09/2005 #PA-50133-03 NEH/Preservation and Access Division $300,828
01/2005–12/2008 #CH-50156 NEH/Office of Challenge Grants
(awarded to SOLINET for the SEP)
10/2005–09/2007 #PA-51255-05 NEH/Preservation and Access Division $150,000
09/2005–08/2007 #2005-6238 William and Flora Hewlett Foundation
Education, Technology, Open Content

Publications About the Stanford Encyclopedia

Information about our dynamic reference work can be found in the following papers and abstracts:


The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy is indebted to many people, both at Stanford and elsewhere, who have supported the efforts of the project in significant ways. First, and foremost, we'd like to thank Professor John Perry, who has served as the principal investigator on the SEP grants, provides high-level supervision on the project, serves as the SEP's advocate to the Stanford administration, and generously gives of his time in SEP fund-raising activities.

Fund-Raising Assistance

We are especially indebted to Patrick Byrne (Ph.D., Stanford, 1995) and The Byrne Foundation for a large and generous gift to the SEP, creating the John Perry Fund. The John Perry Fund forms an important part of the SEP's endowment. We are also deeply indebted to Michelle Wachs (J.D., Harvard, 1993) of Giving Solutions, whose tireless and enthusiastic efforts as the SEP's fund-raising consultant during the 2005–2006 and 2006–2007 academic years helped us achieve our fund-raising goals for those years. We were able to hire Michelle with funds from a generous grant by the Hewlett Foundation. We would also like to acknowledge the contribution of Javier Ergueta (M.B.A., Stanford, 1980), for his efforts and work in developing a business plan for the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy during the first six months of 2002. Javier's time was paid for through a generous grant by the Mellon Foundation. Thanks go the following students in John Perry's Fall 2004 Proseminar, for their help and assistance in implementing an important element of the SEP's fund-raising plan: Dan Giberman, Tomohiro Hoshi, Alistair Isaac, Daniel Long, Lindsay McLeary, Sarah Paul, Josh Snyder, Quayshawn Spencer and Johanna Wolff.

Programming Assistance

The Associate Editor (Colin Allen) and the Senior Editor (Uri Nodelman) have been the Principal and Associate Perl Programmers, respectively, on this project since 1998. Paul Daniell not only developed a customized search engine for the SEP, but also developed the software that administers the Friends of the SEP Society. During the 2007–2008 and 2008–2009 years, Jesse Alama has contributed his programming skills, in addition to his document editing skills. Eric Hammer ( programmed on the project in its early years, from 1995 to 1997. During the 2000–2001 and 2001–2002 academic years, David James Anderson (M.A./Philosophy) wrote important Perl programs and made other contributions to the project. We'd also like to thank John MacFarlane for developing a Perl program that automatically generates PDF versions of SEP entries in two-column landscape mode.

Editorial Assistance

The SEP would also like to thank the following people: Nathan Tawil, Paul E. Oppenheimer, Jesse Alama, Ben Wolfson, Tamar Lando, Matthew Barrett, and Arezoo Islami have provided, and in some cases continue to provide, valuable editorial and document-editing assistance. Kirsta Anderson (M.A./Philosophy) served as Assistant Editor during the 2003–2004 academic year, and did an outstanding job in SEP communications and control, offering many suggestions on how to improve our workflow system. Also, Daniel McKenzie served as Assistant Editor during the 2004–2005 academic year, and did a great job juggling communications/control and copy-editing. Others, including Matthew Barrett and Justin Pront, have helped on a smaller scale with SEP editorial duties.

New Technological Initiatives

The Encyclopedia would like acknowledge and thank the researchers and programmers who are contributing to SEP-enhancement initiatives being pursued by the Indiana Philosophy Ontology project (InPhO) at Indiana University, directed by Colin Allen. Special thanks go to: Cameron Buckner, Ruth Eberle, Nubli Kasa, and Jaimie Murdock, Mathias Niepert, Scott Weingart. Using a combination of text mining, human feedback, and machine reasoning, the InPhO project is enhancing such critical functions as cross-referencing the SEP, classifying topics, and organizing its bibliographic database.

General Assistance

The Encyclopedia would like to acknowledge the volunteer services of Gintautas Miliauskas (Vilnius University) and Jason Wu for carefully reading and copy-editing numerous SEP entries and notifying us about typographical and other errors found therein. We'd like to thank Nathan Tawil, who helped design the Encyclopedia entry format when the project started in 1995, and who has assisted the Principal Editor in editing certain entries. We're also indebted to David Barker-Plummer, Mark Greaves, Emma Pease, Susanne Riehemann, and Lynn Allen for their many helpful suggestions concerning the Encyclopedia project and the construction of this Web site.