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Folk Psychology as Mental Simulation

The simulation (or, "mental simulation") theory maintains that human beings are able to use the resources of their own minds to simulate the psychological causes of the behavior of others, typically by making decisions within a "pretend" context. The theory is usually, though not always, taken to present a serious challenge to the assumption that a theory underlies everyday human competence in predicting and explaining behavior, including the capacity to ascribe mental states to others. Unlike earlier controversies concerning the role of empathetic understanding and historical reenactment in the human sciences, the current debate between the simulation theory and the "theory" theory appeals to empirical findings, particularly experimental results concerning children's development of psychological competence. These are detailed in what follows.

What is Meant by `Simulation'?

Like the term `theory,' `simulation' has come to be used broadly and in a variety of ways. Simulation is sometimes equated with role-taking, or "putting oneself in the other's place." However, it is often taken to include mere "projection," or reliance on a shared world of facts and emotive and motivational charges, without adjustments in imagination; e.g., where there is no need to put oneself in the other's place, as one is, in all relevant respects, already there. (Gordon calls this the default mode of simulation.) Sometimes it is taken to include as well automatic responses such as the subliminal mimicry of facial expressions and bodily movements. Stephen Stich and Shaun Nichols, whose critical papers have clarified the issues and helped refine the theory, urge that the term be dropped in favor of a finer-grained terminology.

Simulation is often conceived in cognitive-scientific terms: one's own behavior control system is employed as a manipulable model of other such systems. The system is first taken off-line, so that the output is not actual behavior but only predictions or anticipations of behavior, and inputs and system parameters are accordingly not limited to those that would regulate one's own behavior. Many proponents hold that, because one human behavior control system is being used to model others, general information about such systems is unnecessary. The simulation is thus said to be process-driven rather than theory-driven (Goldman).

The simulation theory is often thought to require that, to anticipate or to explain another's behavior, one has to make decisions in the role of the other--something we are not frequently aware of doing. However, decision-making, insofar as it results in a decision to perform a definite action, would always yield a definite prediction. Something short of decision-making would better account for our actual capacity to anticipate behavior, limited as it is. For people commonly allow a range of indeterminacy in their expectations of what others will do: some actions are seen as unsurprising given the person and the situation, and others as very surprising. Even if one does not make a decision in the role of the other, one can, by making adjustments in imagination, make some possible actions appear attractive (and thus unsurprising) and others unattractive (and thus surprising).

Varieties of Simulation Theory

Alvin Goldman and the psychologist Paul Harris conceive simulation differently from Robert Gordon and Jane Heal, the philosophers who, working independently, introduced the theory in 1986. According to Goldman and (less clearly) Harris, to ascribe mental states to others by simulation, one must already be able to ascribe mental states to oneself by introspection, and thus must already possess the relevant mental state concepts. Gordon holds a contrary view suggested by both Kant and Quine: Only those who can simulate can understand an ascription of, e.g., belief--that to S it is the case that p. While no simulation theorist claims that all our everyday explanations and predictions of the actions of other people are based on role-taking, Heal in particular has been a moderating influence, arguing for a hybrid simulation-and-theory account that reserves simulation primarily for items with rationally linked content, such as beliefs, desires, and actions.

The introspectionist account of simulation may suggest that simulation is just an application of the argument from analogy. According to one version of this argument,

I am conscious in myself of a series of facts connected by an uniform sequence, of which the beginning is modifications of my body, the middle is feelings, the end is outward demeanour. In the case of other human beings I have the evidence of my senses for the first and last links of the series, but not for the intermediate supposing the link to be of the same nature as in the case of which I have experience,...I bring other human beings, as phenomena, under the same generalizations which I know by experience to be the true theory of my own existence. -- J.S. Mill, An Examination of Sir William Hamilton's Philosophy. 6th edition. London, 1869.

Likewise, the "one system modeling another"account may suggest that simulation is a device for discerning what goes on "inside" another, based on an assumption of the internal similarity of the simulating system and the target system. However, where one explains or predicts another's behavior in terms of a shared, jointly known world, there is no question of internal resemblance between simulator and target, only one of what it is about the world that moves the other to action. What is presumed is not similarity but access, not that the other believes as one does but that the other has access to (what one presumes to be) the world.

Areas of Empirical Investigation

Three main areas of empirical investigation have been thought especially relevant to the debate: The numerous other empirical questions of possible relevance to the debate include the following:
Does brain imaging reveal that systems and processes employed in decision-making are reemployed in the explanation and prediction of others' behavior?
Does narrative (including film narrative) create emotional and motivational effects by the same processes that create them in real-life situations?

Some philosophers think the simulation theory may shed light on issues in traditional philosophy of mind and language concerning intentionality, referential opacity, broad and narrow content, the nature of mental causation, Twin Earth problems, the problem of other minds, and the peculiarities of self-knowledge. Several philosophers have applied the theory to aesthetics, ethics, and philosophy of the social sciences. Success or failure of these efforts to answer philosophical problems may be considered empirical tests of the theory, in a suitably broad sense of "empirical."


Principal Sources: Collections: Further Readings


A large portion of this entry is excerpted, with permission, from "Simulation vs Theory Theory", MIT Encyclopedia of Cognitive Science (MIT Press, 1999)

Related Entries

materialism, eliminative | folk psychology, as a theory

Copyright © 1997, 1998 by
Robert M. Gordon

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First published: December 8, 1997
Content last modified: May 12, 1998