Supplement to Anomalous Monism

Kim’s Reductio Strategy for Establishing Mental Anomalism

As we have seen in 4.2.1, one key problem with Kim’s reductio strategy for interpreting the argument for mental anomalism is that it fails to register Davidson’s distinction between strict and ceteris paribus laws. Can Kim’s very straightforward and elegant interpretative approach be saved by making requisite adjustments? It might not affect Kim’s basic point to formulate the rational principle deployed in his argument in ceteris paribus rather than strict form, while maintaining its necessary status: all things being equal, if an individual is attributed one belief he should be attributed another. This allows for exceptions under unusual circumstances, but insists that attributions of such exceptions must be well motivated and also not generally the case. But there would nonetheless be a contrast with the merely contingent status of any physical regularities. Suppose that there is a necessarily true descriptive psychological generalization

(1*) ‘ceteris paribus, M1 → M2’.

The most that can be derived from it together with strict bridge laws

(2) ‘P1 ↔ M1


(3) ‘P2 ↔ M2’ (assumed for the purposes of reductio)

would be the contingently true

(4*) ‘ceteris paribus, P1 → P2’,

not the strict law ‘P1 → P2’, due to the obvious invalidity of deriving a stronger modality (strict law) from a weaker one (ceteris paribus). How would these adjustments affect the reductio strategy of showing that presumptively contingent relations between physical states would be explained by necessary rational relations and vice-versa given (2) and (3)? Yalowitz (1997, 238–40) claims that the reductio would then fail, arguing in one direction that any troubling sense of constraint of the physical by the rational due to (2) and (3) would be lost because of the nonstrict nature of (4*) and subsequent allowance of exceptions to ‘P1 → P2’. Yalowitz’s idea seems to be that since not all cases of P1 result in the occurrence of a P2, there is no necessary relation between the types P1 and P2. And this seems to suggest that the constitutive essence of the physical has not been infected by that of the mental. The existence of exceptions by itself seems to secure the contingent status of relations between P1 and P2. As a result, the objection to bridge laws (2) and (3)—the point of Kim’s argument—would then be removed.

An analogous point could be made if explaining (1*) by (4*); here, Yalowitz’s criticism would presumably be that the troubling notion that certain mental possibilities which should be ruled out by the necessity of (1*) would not be ruled out, given (2) and (3), would be lost because of the now nonstrict nature of (1*) and subsequent allowance of the possibility of alternatives to M2 when an M1 occurs. Here, Yalowitz’s idea would seem to be that since the nonstrict nature of (1*) already allows exceptions, it could not be an objection to (2) and (3) that they allow the constitutive essence of the physical—contingency—to jeopardize the necessary nature of mental generalizations. This is because the nonstrict nature of (1*) already allows for cases where an M2 is not produced by an M1, and thus the relation between M1 and M2 is contingent.

However, there is room for debate here. Since we are trying to make room for the notion of necessary ceteris paribus generalizations like (1*) (see also 5.3 and 6.1), we need to be careful not to collapse the distinctions between strict and necessary generalizations and also between ceteris paribus and contingent generalizations. Yalowitz’s argument appears to be doing precisely this in holding that the existence of exceptions—the mark of a ceteris paribus generalization—entails a merely contingent relation between cases successfully covered (non-exceptions) by that generalization. This can be seen clearly by considering the following. The existence of exceptions does show that there is no necessary relation between P1 and P2—there are possible worlds (including the actual world) in which the latter does follow from the former. But this is orthogonal to the key question of whether there are possible worlds in which P1’s don’t cause P2’s ceteris paribus. And if the generalization is supposed to be necessary, as we are proposing in assuming (1*) and deriving (4*) from it, then this is not possible. Since certain possibilities about the relations between P1 and P2 are being ruled out by (1*) together with (2) and (3), it appears that Kim’s central point survives the adjusted argument and continues to hold: bridge laws like (2) and (3) enable the transference of the constitutive essences of the mental and physical from one to the other, and so must be rejected. In this case, the contingency of (4*) should allow for the possibility of the realization of its denial—not merely an exception like P3, which Yalowitz’s argument highlights, but rather a world in which it is false that ‘ceteris paribus, P1 → P2’. But this possibility, required by the constitutive essence of the physical (contingency), is ruled out by (2) and (3) given the necessity of (1*). So it is only by denying (2) and (3)—psychophysical anomalism—that the constitutive essences of the mental and the physical can be respected.

This point is even clearer if one considers the reverse version of the adjusted Kim argument, with (4*), together with (2) and (3), explaining (1*). Here the problem with (2) and (3) would be the following: according to the contingent status of (4*), there are possible worlds where ‘ceteris paribus, P1 → P2’ is false. The existence of exceptions allowed by (1*), while establishing that there are possible worlds (including the actual world) in which M1’s don’t cause M2’s, is, once again, orthogonal to the question of whether there are possible worlds in which ‘ceteris paribus M1 → M2’ is false. And since (4*) is only contingently true, there are indeed such worlds. Since certain possibilities about the relations between M1 and M2 are being ruled in by (4*) together with (2) and (3), it once again appears that Kim’s central point survives the adjusted argument and continues to hold. The necessity of (1*) should block the possibility of the realization of its denial—a world in which ‘ceteris paribus, M1 → M2’ is false. This impossibility, required by the constitutive essence of the mental, is ruled out by (4*), constituting a reductio of (2) and (3). Thus, Yalowitz’s objection to the adjusted Kim strategy for establishing psychophysical anomalism appears to fail.

Our adjustment of Kim’s argument, taking into account Davidson’s rejection of strict psychological laws and lack of reliance on the notion of a normative psychological principle, thus looks promising as a reconstruction of Davidson’s argument for psychophysical anomalism. Yalowitz (1997, 240), however, mentions a few other problems with it that are not easily dismissed or, for that matter, assessed. First, there is a concern about how the deductive-nomological model of explanation handles explanatory relations between ceteris paribus generalizations—if one generalization, which has exceptions, cannot explain why or when another generalization has exceptions, then it is a good question to ask how the former can be said to explain the fact that the latter holds when it does. (For related discussion, see Fodor 1974 and 1991, and Schiffer 1991.) Further, it is very unclear how the deductive-nomological model can be applied to generalizations of different modalities (necessary and contingent). And there is a related question about the legitimacy of substitutions within the sorts of modal contexts Kim is working with. In particular, are substitutions of physical for mental properties in metaphysically necessary generalizations like (1*) licensed by the existence of metaphysically contingent bridge laws relating mental and physical properties like (2) and (3)? If not, then the problematic derivations and explanations would not go through, and so neither would any transfer of constitutive essence from one domain to the other. These structural questions about Kim’s argument (both the original and the adjusted versions) make a final assessment of his approach too complex to settle here.

Copyright © 2019 by
Steven Yalowitz <>

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