Supplement to Anomalous Monism

Related Views

There are a number of philosophers and traditions that share the two key features of Anomalous Monism: its rejection of any reductive relationship between mental and physical events and properties, and its assertion of monism. In this section, we look briefly at one classic precursor to Anomalous Monism as well as several more recently developed positions that share these features. The comparisons help to shed further light on Anomalous Monism.

At the most general level, one distinctive component of Anomalous Monism is its a priori status. It is deduced logically from what are plausibly claimed to be a relatively bland set of assumptions themselves not clearly empirical in nature, and each, individually, acceptable to dualist ontological positions. (Certainly the anomalism principle is not empirical. While the cause-law principle has been claimed to be an empirical, and false, assumption (Cartwright 1983—see 3.3), we have seen (3.2) that Davidson himself views it as a priori. The interaction principle does not appear to be based upon empirical assumptions.) This a priori status sets Anomalous Monism apart from other forms of nonreductive monism that have been developed since Anomalous Monism was formulated. However, Anomalous Monism’s clearest philosophical ancestor, Spinoza (1985 [1677]), shared this a priori perspective, and Davidson explicitly acknowledges Spinoza’s anticipation of Anomalous Monism (Davidson 1999c). We begin with him.

1. Spinoza’s Parallelism

Spinoza held that the world was composed of only one kind of substance or stuff (monism) which exhibits distinct realms of physical and mental properties. On the standard reading of Spinoza’s metaphysics, these two realms are causally insulated from each other—while mental events can cause and result from other mental events, and physical events can cause and result from other physical events, there are no causal relations between mental and physical events. There are thus no strict psychophysical laws. But there are both strict physical and strict psychological laws. The causal insulation of the two realms, and the existence of strict psychological laws, appear to distinguish Spinoza’s position from that of Anomalous Monism.

Davidson, however, disputes this traditional reading of Spinoza’s metaphysics , emphasizing two key points. First, while Spinoza does indeed deny that there can be explanatory relations between the mental and the physical, his notion of explanation is quite demanding. ‘Explanation’ means ‘adequate explanation’, which in turn requires a demonstration of logical entailment between explanans and explanandum. Davidson happily concedes that no such relation exists between mental and physical properties and events. But he denies that one need impose such a strong requirement on causation and causal explanation. In any case, it is consistent with Spinoza’s position that mental events cause and are caused by physical events so long as one does not equate ‘cause’ with ‘logically entails’.

Second, and related to this, Davidson insists that while explanation is, intuitively, an intensional notion—one sensitive to how events are described—causation is extensional, obtaining between pairs of events independently of how they are described. As we have seen (1, 6–6.2), this distinction between causation and explanation is central to Anomalous Monism. Some interpreters of Spinoza, explicitly considering the question of his relation to Anomalous Monism, have denied that Spinoza would or should accept such an extensional account of causation (see Della Rocca 1991 and Jarrett 1991). Davidson replies that one needs to distinguish an opaque and a transparent concept of ‘cause’ (where the former involves sentences which do not allow the substitution salva veritate of co-referring expressions, and latter does allow such substitutions). Davidson accepts that Spinoza himself probably had in mind the opaque concept, in keeping with historical tradition, but that nothing stands in the way of his accepting a needed transparent concept as well. Davidson sees this as the only way to get Spinoza out of being saddled with the logical absurdity that would result from holding that, for instance, the physical event of a bell ringing cannot cause a mental awareness of the ringing even though that mental awareness is identical (as Spinoza’s monism requires) with a physical event in the brain caused by the ringing.

According to Davidson, what Spinoza is really committed to is denying the possibility of a fully adequate (complete) explanation of the occurrence of the awareness by appeal to the laws of nature and the cause described in physical terms. This does not preclude holding that the ringing of the bell may cause us to be aware of the ringing. Davidson goes on to reject Spinoza’s infamous doctrine of parallelism, the view that the temporal order of physical events corresponds to the order and connection of ideas. Since the physical domain is governed by strict laws, this would entail the possibility (indeed, necessity) of strict, purely psychological laws. Just as events described physically would have a fully adequate explanation in terms of strict physical laws and initial conditions, so too would events described mentally need to have a fully adequate explanation in terms of strict mental laws and initial (mental) conditions. Davidson rejects this picture (as indeed Anomalous Monism must) because too many causes and effects of mental events are not themselves events with mental descriptions—the mental domain is thus ‘open’ in a way that the physical domain is not (2.3). Every physical event has a fully adequate (strict) physical explanation, but no mental event can have a fully adequate (strict) mental explanation.

In these ways, then, Davidson finds points of significant contact between Anomalous Monism and Spinoza’s position, and attempts to soften or correct those points of apparent divergence. Davidson’s view appears to be that if Spinoza had had available to him the intensional-extensional distinction as well as a concept of causation that was not identical to logical entailment, his position would essentially be that of Anomalous Monism. However, related to Spinoza’s commitment to strict psychological laws is his infamous insistence on determinism and subsequent lack of free will and free action. Davidson claims, to the contrary, that Anomalous Monism, with its denial of strict psychophysical and psychological laws, is a key necessary condition of freedom (see Related Issues: 3. Anomalous Monism and Freedom).

2. Functionalism

Functionalist accounts of mental phenomena (for a good overview, see Block 1980) were the most prominent of the nonreductionist monist positions developed at around the same time as Anomalous Monism. According to functionalism, an adequate analysis of the meaning and individuation of propositional attitudes such as belief, desire, intention and other psychological states is in terms of the explanatory/causal role that they play in the etiology of behavior. Beliefs differ from desires, for instance, in the role that each plays in mediating the relations between perceptual inputs, behavioral outputs and other intervening psychological states. To believe something is just to be in a state that exhibits such a distinctive causal pattern. It is not relevant what realizes such a functional state, however, just so long as it is the sort of realizing media that can support such a pattern.

Associated with functionalism was the doctrine of multiple realizability: mental properties can, in practice as well as principle, be realized by a variety of media which do not share anything in common physically other than a capacity to support the distinctive pattern (Fodor 1974). Other species, with different internal wiring, can realize mental properties, and in principle so could extraterrestrial beings. Mental properties therefore cannot be reduced to physical properties because of this heterogeneous nature of the realizing physical media. However (at least according to most proponents of functionalism—see Lewis 1966), some physical media must play the realizing role—hence, monism.

Functionalism therefore differs from Anomalous Monism in appealing to multiple realizability rather than rationality as the ground for irreducibility. There are other important differences as well. For one thing, it is unclear what exactly grounds the monism of functionalism—in Anomalous Monism, the monism is derived in an a priori fashion from Davidson’s three principles, but it often seems to be simply an assumption within the functionalist framework (Fodor 1974, but again, see Lewis 1966). Indeed, some functionalists explicitly observe that their account is consistent with dualism (see Block 1980). Another key difference is that traditional functionalism has built into it a kind of reductionism, though not of the type-type variety. This comes out in the fact that the inputs and outputs between which the functional states are supposed to play their mediating role are typically required to be characterized in non-intentional terms. For instance, intending to stay dry would be (partially) defined not in terms of perceiving that it is raining and subsequently opening an umbrella, but instead in terms of something like sensory stimulations and mere bodily movements. Indeed, many functionalists claim to provide an analysis of mental properties in other, non-mental terms. Brian Loar (Loar 1981, 20–25) sees his functionalist account as a direct refutation of Anomalous Monism, purporting to account for the rational nature of mental states and events within a reductionist framework (see 4.2.3). But whether or not all functionalists view their accounts in these terms, it nonetheless appears that the nonreductionism of functionalism is of a vertical but not horizontal nature, so to speak. Mental properties cannot be reduced to their realizing physical properties (because of multiple realizability), but there will be strict lawlike generalizations (the distinctive patterns) that purport to define mental properties in non-mental terms—causal relations to non-mentally characterized inputs, outputs and other functional states.

Another point on which functionalism diverges from Anomalous Monism is in its attempt to account not only for the propositional attitudes—belief, desire, intention, etc.—but also for sentient states and events like pains and tickles—conscious phenomena that there is something it is like to experience (Nagel 1974). These wider aspirations have, however, proven to be especially problematic for functionalism. A standard objection has been that while the propositional attitudes may be given a plausible analysis in terms of causal patterns, the felt quality of sentient states and events cannot be analyzed in purely causal terms without losing touch with what is distinctive about such phenomena (Nagel 1974; Chalmers 1996; see Section 4 below).

Many of the same questions that arose in our examination of Anomalous Monism—in particular, concerning supervenience and mental causation—arise also in discussions of functionalism. Indeed, these questions arise for any property dualist monism—any theory on which mental and physical properties are thought of as distinct and irreducible but instantiated by the same set of states, events or substances. For instance, Kim 1992 argues that multiple realization actually entails a form of type-reduction, given the key physicalist assumption—the causal inheritance principle—that the causal powers/explanatory relevance of higher order properties is identical to and exhausted by those of all of their lower-order realizing properties. On this view, mental properties have no causal powers/explanatory value over and above those of their realizing physical properties. Kim’s formulation of the principle, however, is completely insensitive to the points about effect-types and interest-relativity of explanation discussed in 6.2 and the supplement on Mental Properties and Causal Relevance). A more nuanced formulation of the principle also amenable to physicalists would respect those points by selecting, from the full set of realizing causal powers, those that actually play an explanatory role relative to particular effect-types. Such a formulation of the principle would not clearly lead to the reductionist conclusion pressed by Kim, yet would retain a physicalist ontology and also respect the insights of the dual explananda approach.

3. Bare Materialism

Another version of nonreductive monism, put forward in different ways by Hornsby (1981, 1985, 1993), Leder (1985) and McDowell (1985), rejects the token-identity of Anomalous Monism and replaces it with a blander, bare materialist doctrine of substance monism. As we have already seen (5.2), this is motivated, in the first instance, by the concern that it is simply too demanding to require that every mental event bear a uniquely identifying description in the language of physics—the fine-grained spatiotemporal specificity of the language of physics appears ill-suited to mental events. Davidson’s early view, recall, was that there must be such a fine-grained physical description for every causally interacting mental event, though he made no attempt to provide examples. McDowell (1985) sees this requirement as an overreaction to the threat of Cartesian dualism. He puts the point as follows:

…since it is not events but substances that are composed of stuff, one can refuse to accept that all the events there are can be described in ‘physical’ terms, without thereby committing oneself to a non-‘physical’ stuff or compromising the thesis that persons are composed of nothing but matter. (McDowell 1985, 397)

This view is essentially shared by Hornsby and Leder, each of whom questions both the intelligibility of attaching precise spatiotemporal parameters to mental events, and the purported necessity of doing so, in order to maintain a materialist position. McDowell and Hornsby subsequently come to question the cause-law principle, which, when appended to the interaction and anomalism principles (both of which are accepted by McDowell and Hornsby) leads to the token-identity thesis they question. Each sees the cause-law principle as unmotivated and, as we have seen, McDowell claims it to be inconsistent with another of Davidson’s basic commitments—his rejection of scheme-content dualism (see 3.3 and the supplement on Related Issues (Anomalous Monism and Scheme-Content Dualism)).

We have already seen that Davidson later came to weaken his early claim regarding uniquely identifying strict law descriptions for mental events. So the rationale for bare materialism, as an alternative to Anomalous Monism, seems less compelling. With respect to bare materialism taken on its own, it is also unclear what its rationale is for asserting materialism, even one of this minimalist variety, which focuses on substances (the person or perhaps the body) rather than events undergone by substances. One virtue of Anomalous Monism is that it provides a justification for its form of materialism. It is also not clear how mental events, when thought of as not describable in the language of physics, can be held to interact with events describable in physical language. Here concerns with a lineage going back to the earliest critics of Descartes, such as Pierre Gassendi and Princess Elisabeth of Bohemia, again rear their heads: if physical but not mental events (which supposedly interact) have precise spatiotemporal locations, how can events of such different kinds causally interact, and where is the locus of interaction? These questions are just as pressing for proponents of minimal materialism who reject token-identities of mental and physical events.

As discussed in 5.2, the spatiotemporal objection to Anomalous Monism is difficult to evaluate, depending as it does on our own current intuitions about the intelligibility of recognizing precise spatiotemporal dimensions for mental events and states. There is also Davidson’s later rejection of the requirement that such descriptions be uniquely identifying to take into account. Davidson’s point, early and late, however, is that based upon a priori argument we know that there must be some such description, even if we may never actually be in a position to make the relevant identifications.

4. Other Positions

Various other nonreductive monist positions have been developed that are motivated by concerns very different than those of Anomalous Monism. These positions raise issues that go beyond what can be addressed here, but some are worth noting. As observed above, one motivation derives from concerns with sentient phenomena—whether, given distinctive properties attaching to conscious states and events, they can be explained in terms of underlying physical states and events. Proponents of these views deny that such an explanation is possible, and subsequently assert various forms of property dualism together with a substance monism (see Chalmers 1996). And another nonreductive monist position has been motivated by appeal to a semantic thesis concerning how mental contents of propositional attitudes are determined. Some externalist views like Davidson’s hold that mental contents are determined in part by physical environmental factors. Others emphasize social factors, such as the role that experts play in constituting norms of usage for concepts to which laypeople defer. Some proponents of this view conclude that the attitudes in which these contents figure cannot be held to be token-identical to underlying physical states of those agents, even though all states and events may indeed be physical in some other sense (Burge 1979, 1993). Davidson (1987a) has forcefully argued, against this view, that the token-identity theory of mind is consistent with semantic externalism. (For related discussion, see the supplement on Related Issues (Mental Anomalism and Semantic Externalism).)

Copyright © 2019 by
Steven Yalowitz <>

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