Value Theory

First published Tue Feb 5, 2008; substantive revision Thu Jul 28, 2016

The term “value theory” is used in at least three different ways in philosophy. In its broadest sense, “value theory” is a catch-all label used to encompass all branches of moral philosophy, social and political philosophy, aesthetics, and sometimes feminist philosophy and the philosophy of religion — whatever areas of philosophy are deemed to encompass some “evaluative” aspect. In its narrowest sense, “value theory” is used for a relatively narrow area of normative ethical theory particularly, but not exclusively, of concern to consequentialists. In this narrow sense, “value theory” is roughly synonymous with “axiology”. Axiology can be thought of as primarily concerned with classifying what things are good, and how good they are. For instance, a traditional question of axiology concerns whether the objects of value are subjective psychological states, or objective states of the world.

But in a more useful sense, “value theory” designates the area of moral philosophy that is concerned with theoretical questions about value and goodness of all varieties — the theory of value. The theory of value, so construed, encompasses axiology, but also includes many other questions about the nature of value and its relation to other moral categories. The division of moral theory into the theory of value, as contrasting with other areas of investigation, cross-cuts the traditional classification of moral theory into normative and metaethical inquiry, but is a worthy distinction in its own right; theoretical questions about value constitute a core domain of interest in moral theory, often cross the boundaries between the normative and the metaethical, and have a distinguished history of investigation. This article surveys a range of the questions which come up in the theory of value, and attempts to impose some structure on the terrain by including some observations about how they are related to one another.

1. Basic Questions

The theory of value begins with a subject matter. It is hard to specify in some general way exactly what counts, but it certainly includes what we are talking about when we say any of the following sorts of things (compare Ziff [1960]):

“pleasure is good/bad”; “it would be good/bad if you did that”; “it is good/bad for him to talk to her”; “too much cholesterol is good/bad for your health”; “that is a good/bad knife”; “Jack is a good/bad thief”; “he's a good/bad man”; “it's good/bad that you came”; “it would be better/worse if you didn't”; “lettuce is better/worse for you than Oreos”; “my new can opener is better/worse than my old one”; “Mack is a better/worse thief than Jack”; “it's better/worse for it to end now, than for us to get caught later”; “best/worst of all, would be if they won the World Series and kept all of their players for next year”; “celery is the best/worst thing for your health”; “Mack is the best/worst thief around”

The word “value” doesn't appear anywhere on this list; it is full, however, of “good”, “better”, and “best”, and correspondingly of “bad”, “worse”, and “worst”. And these words are used in a number of different kinds of constructions, of which we may take these four to be the main exemplars:

  1. Pleasure is good.
  2. It is good that you came.
  3. It is good for him to talk to her.
  4. That is a good knife.

Sentences like 1, in which “good” is predicated of a mass term, constitute a central part of traditional axiology, in which philosophers have wanted to know what things (of which there can be more or less) are good. I'll stipulatively call them value claims, and use the word “stuff” for the kind of thing of which they predicate value (like pleasure, knowledge, and money). Sentences like 2 make claims about what I'll (again stipulatively) call goodness simpliciter; this is the kind of goodness appealed to by traditional utilitarianism. Sentences like 3 are good for sentences, and when the subject following “for” is a person, we usually take them to be claims about welfare or well-being. And sentences like 4 are what, following Geach [1960], I'll call attributive uses of “good”, because “good” functions as a predicate modifier, rather than as a predicate in its own right.

Many of the basic issues in the theory of value begin with questions or assumptions about how these various kinds of claim are related to one another. Some of these are introduced in the next two sections, focusing in 1.1 on the relationship between our four kinds of sentences, and focusing in 1.2 on the relationship between “good” and “better”, and between “good” and “bad”.

1.1 Varieties of Goodness

Claims about good simpliciter are those which have garnered the most attention in moral philosophy. This is partly because as it is usually understood, these are the “good” claims that consequentialists hold to have a bearing on what we ought to do. Consequentialism, so understood, is the view that you ought to do whatever action is such that things would be best if you did it. This leaves, however, a wide variety of possible theories about how such claims are related to other kinds of “good” claim.

1.1.1 Good Simpliciter and Good For

For example, consider a simple point of view theory, according to which what is good simpliciter differs from what is good for Jack, in that being good for Jack is being good from a certain point of view — Jack's — whereas being good simpliciter is being good from a more general point of view — the point of view of the universe (compare Nagel [1985]). The point of view theory reduces both good for and good simpliciter to good from the point of view of, and understands good simpliciter claims as about the point of view of the universe. One problem for this view is to make sense of what sort of thing points of view could be, such that Jack and the universe are both the kinds of thing to have one.

According to a different sort of theory, the agglomerative theory, goodness simpliciter is just what you get by “adding up” what is good for all of the various people that there are. Rawls [1971] attributes this view to utilitarians, and it fits with utilitarian discussions such as that of Smart's contribution to Smart and Williams [1973], but much more work would have to be done in order to make it precise. We sometimes say things like, “wearing that outfit in the sun all day is not going to be good for your tan line”, but your tan line is not one of the things whose good it seems plausible to “add up” in order to get what is good simpliciter. Certainly it is not one of the things whose good classical utilitarians would want to add up. So the fact that sapient and even sentient beings are not the only kinds of thing that things can be good or bad for sets an important constraint both on accounts of the good for relation, and on theories about how it is related to good simpliciter.

Rather than accounting for either of goodness simpliciter or goodness-for in terms of the other, some philosophers have taken one of these seriously at the expense of the other. For example, Philippa Foot [1985] gives an important but compressed argument that apparent talk about what is good simpliciter can be made sense of as ellipsed talk about what is good for some unmentioned person, and Foot's view can be strengthened (compare Shanklin [2011], Finlay [2014]) by allowing that apparent good simpliciter claims are often generically quantified statements about what is, in general, good for a person. Thomson [2008] famously defends a similar view.

G.E. Moore [1903], in contrast, struggled to make sense of good-for claims. In his refutation of egoism, Moore attributed to ethical egoists the theory that what is good for Jack (or “in Jack's good”) is just what is good and in Jack's possession, or alternatively, what it is good that Jack possesses. Moore didn't argue against these theses directly, but he did show that they cannot be combined with universalizable egoism. It is now generally recognized that to avoid Moore's arguments, egoists need only to reject these analyses of good for, which are in any case unpromising (Smith [2003]).

1.1.2 Attributive Good

Other kinds of views understand good simpliciter in terms of attributive good. What, after all, are the kinds of things to which we attribute goodness simpliciter? According to many philosophers, it is to propositions, or states of affairs. This is supported by a cursory study of the examples we have considered, in which what is being said to be good appears to be picked out by complementizers like “if”, “that”, and “for”: “it would be good if you did that”; “it's good that you came”; “it's better for it to end now”. If complementizer phrases denote propositions or possible states of affairs, then it is reasonable to conjecture, along with Foot [1985] that being good simpliciter is being a good state of affairs, and hence that it is a special case of attributive good (if it makes sense at all — Geach and Foot both argue that it does not, on the ground that states of affairs are too thin of a kind to support attributive good claims).

See the

Supplement on Four Complications about Attributive Good

for further complications that arise when we consider the attributive sense of “good”.

Some philosophers have used the examples of attributive good and good for in order to advance arguments against noncognitivist metaethical theories (See the entry cognitivism and non-cognitivism). The basic outlines of such an argument go like this: noncognitivist theories are designed to deal with good simpliciter, but have some kind of difficulties accounting for attributive good or for good for. Hence, there is a general problem with noncognitivist theories, or at least a significant lacuna they leave. It has similarly been worried that noncognitivist theories will have problems accounting for so-called “agent-relative” value [see section 4], again, apparently, because of its relational nature. There is no place to consider this claim here, but note that it would be surprising if relational uses of “good” like these were in fact a deep or special problem for noncognitivism; Hare's account in The Language of Morals (Hare [1952]) was specifically about attributive uses of “good”, and it is not clear why relational noncognitive attitudes should be harder to make sense of than relational beliefs.

1.1.3 Relational Strategies

In an extension of the strategies just discussed, some theorists have proposed views of “good” which aspire to treat all of good simpliciter, good for, and attributive good as special cases. A paradigm of this approach is the “end-relational” theory of Paul Ziff [1960] and Stephen Finlay [2004], [2014]. According to Ziff, all claims about goodness are relative to ends or purposes, and “good for” and attributive “good” sentences are simply different ways of making these purposes (more or less) explicit. Talk about what is good for Jack, for example, makes the purpose of Jack's being happy (say) explicit, while talk about what is a good knife makes our usual purposes for knives (cutting things, say) explicit. The claim about goodness is then relativized accordingly.

Views adopting this strategy need to develop in detail answers to just what, exactly, the further, relational, parameter on “good” is. Some hold that it is ends, while others say things like “aims”. A filled-out version of this view must also be able to tell us the mechanics of how these ends can be made explicit in “good for” and attributive “good” claims, and needs to really make sense of both of those kinds of claim as of one very general kind. And, of course, this sort of view yields the prediction that non-explicitly relativized “good” sentences — including those used throughout moral philosophy — are really only true or false once the end parameter is specified, perhaps by context.

This means that this view is open to the objection that it fails to account for a central class of uses of “good” in ethics, which by all evidence are non-relative, and for which the linguistic data do not support the hypothesis that they are context-sensitive. J.L. Mackie held a view like this one and embraced this result — Mackie's [1977] error theory about “good” extended only to such putative non-relational senses of “good”. Though he grants that there are such uses of “good”, Mackie concludes that they are mistaken. Finlay [2014], in contrast, argues that he can use ordinary pragmatic effects in order to explain the appearances. The apparently non-relational senses of “good”, Finlay argues, really are relational, and his theory aspires to explain why they seem otherwise.

1.1.4 What's Special About Value Claims

The sentences I have called “value claims” present special complications. Unlike the other sorts of “good” sentences, they do not appear to admit, in a natural way, of comparisons. Suppose, for example, with G.E. Moore, that pleasure is good and knowledge is good. Which, we might ask, is better? This question does not appear to make very much sense, until we fix on some amount of pleasure and some amount of knowledge. But if Sue is a good dancer and Huw is a good dancer, then it makes perfect sense to ask who is the better dancer, and without needing to fix on any particular amount of dancing — much less on any amount of Sue or Huw. In general, just as the kinds of thing that can be tall are the same kinds of thing as can be taller than each other, the kinds of thing that can be good are the same kinds of thing as can be better than one another. But the sentences that we are calling “value claims”, which predicate “good” of some stuff, appear not to be like this.

One possible response to this observation, if it is taken seriously, is to conclude that so-called “value claims” have a different kind of logical form or structure. One way of implementing this idea, the good-first theory, is to suppose that “pleasure is good” means something roughly like, “(other things equal) it is better for there to be more pleasure”, rather than, “pleasure is better than most things (in some relevant comparison class)”, on a model with “Sue is a good dancer”, which means roughly, “Sue is a better dancer than most (in some relevant comparison class)”. According to a very different kind of theory, the value-first theory, when we say that pleasure is good, we are saying that pleasure is a value, and things are better just in case there is more of the things which are values. These two theories offer competing orders of explanation for the same phenomenon. The good-first theory analyzes value claims in terms of “good” simpliciter, while the value-first theory analyzes “good” simpliciter in terms of value claims. The good-first theory corresponds to the thesis that states of affairs are the “primary bearers” of value; the value-first theory corresponds to the alternative thesis that it is things like pleasure or goodness (or perhaps their instances) that are the “primary bearers” of value.

According to a more skeptical view, sentences like “pleasure is good” do not express a distinctive kind of claim at all, but are merely what you get when you take a sentence like “pleasure is good for Jill to experience”, generically quantify out Jill, and ellipse “to experience”. Following an idea also developed by Finlay [2014], Robert Shanklin [2011] argues that in general, good-for sentences pattern with experiencer adjectives like “fun”, which admit of these very syntactic transformations: witness “Jack is fun for Jill to talk to”, ”Jack is fun to talk to”, “Jack is fun”. This view debunks the issue over which the views discussed in the last paragraph disagree, for it denies that there is any such distinct topic for value claims to be about. (It may also explain the failures of comparative forms, above, on the basis of differences in the elided material.)

1.2 Good, Better, Bad

1.2.1 Good and Better

On a natural view, the relationship between “good”, “better”, and “best” would seem to be the same as that between “tall”, “taller”, and “tallest”. “Tall” is a gradable adjective, and “taller” is its comparative form. On standard views, gradable adjectives are analyzed in terms of their comparative form. At bottom is the relation of being taller than, and someone is the tallest woman, just in case she is taller than every woman. Similarly, someone is tall, just in case she is taller than a contextually appropriate standard (Kennedy [2005]), or taller than sufficiently many (this many be vague) in some contextually appropriate comparison class.

Much moral philosophy appears to assume that things are very different for “good”, “better”, and “best”. Instead of treating “better than” as basic, and something as being good just in case it is better than sufficiently many in some comparison class, philosophers very often assume, or write as if they assume, that “good” is basic. For example, many theorists have proposed analyses of what it is to be good, which are incompatible with the claim that “good” is to be understood in terms of “better”. In the absence of some reason to think that “good” is very different from “tall”, however, this may be a very peculiar kind of claim to make, and it may distort some other issues in the theory of value.

1.2.2 Value

Moreover, it is difficult to see how one could do things the other way around, and understand “better” in terms of “good”. Jon is a better sprinter than Jan not because it is more the case that Jon is a good sprinter than that Jan is a good sprinter — they are both excellent sprinters, so neither one of these is more the case than the other. It is, however, possible to see how to understand both “good” and “better” in terms of value. If good is to better as tall is to taller, then the analogue of value should intuitively be height. One person is taller than another just in case her height is greater; similarly, one state of affairs is better than another just in case its value is greater. If we postulate something called “value” to play this role, then it is natural (though not obligatory) to identify value with amounts of values — amounts of things like pleasure or knowledge, which “value” claims claim to be good.

But this move appears to be implausible or unnecessary when applied to attributive “good”. It is not particularly plausible that there is such a thing as can-opener value, such that one can-opener is better than another just in case it has more can-opener value. In general, not all comparatives need be analyzable in terms of something like height, of which there can be literally more or less. Take, for example, the case of “scary”. The analogy with height would yield the prediction that if one horror film is scarier than another, it is because it has more of something — scariness — than the other. This may be right, but it is not obviously so. If it is not, then the analogy need not hold for “good” and its cognates, either. In this case, it may be that being better than does not merely amount to having more value than.

1.2.3 Good and Bad

These questions, moreover, are related to others. For example, “better” would appear to be the inverse relation of “worse”. A is better than B just in case B is worse than A. So if “good” is just “better than sufficiently many” and “bad” is just “worse than sufficiently many”, all of the interesting facts in the neighborhood would seem to be captured by an assessment of what stands in the better than relation to what. The same point goes if to be good is just to be better than a contextually set standard. But it has been held by many moral philosophers that an inventory of what is better than what would still leave something interesting and important out: what is good.

If this is right, then it is one important motivation for denying that “good” can be understood in terms of “better”. But it is important to be careful about this kind of argument. Suppose, for example, that, as is commonly held about “tall”, the relevant comparison class or standard for “good” is somehow supplied by the context of utterance. Then to know whether “that is good” is true, you do need to know more than all of the facts about what is better than what — you also need to know something about the comparison class or standard that is supplied by the context of utterance. The assumption that “good” is context-dependent in this way may therefore itself be just the kind of thing to explain the intuition which drives the preceding argument.

2. Traditional Questions

Traditional axiology seeks to investigate what things are good, how good they are, and how their goodness is related to one another. Whatever we take the “primary bearers” of value to be, one of the central questions of traditional axiology is that of what stuffs are good: what is of value.

2.1 Intrinsic Value

2.1.1 What is Intrinsic Value?

Of course, the central question philosophers have been interested in, is that of what is of intrinsic value, which is taken to contrast with instrumental value. Paradigmatically, money is supposed to be good, but not intrinsically good: it is supposed to be good because it leads to other good things: HD TV's and houses in desirable school districts and vanilla lattes, for example. These things, in turn, may only be good for what they lead to: exciting NFL Sundays and adequate educations and caffeine highs, for example. And those things, in turn, may be good only for what they lead to, but eventually, it is argued, something must be good, and not just for what it leads to. Such things are said to be intrinsically good.

Philosophers' adoption of the term “intrinsic” for this distinction reflects a common theory, according to which whatever is non-instrumentally good must be good in virtue of its intrinsic properties. This idea is supported by a natural argument: if something is good only because it is related to something else, the argument goes, then it must be its relation to the other thing that is non-instrumentally good, and the thing itself is good only because it is needed in order to obtain this relation. The premise in this argument is highly controversial (Schroeder [2005]), and in fact many philosophers believe that something can be non-instrumentally good in virtue of its relation to something else. Consequently, sometimes the term “intrinsic” is reserved for what is good in virtue of its intrinsic properties, or for the view that goodness itself is an intrinsic property, and non-instrumental value is instead called “telic” or “final” (Korsgaard [1983]). I'll stick to “intrinsic”, but keep in mind that intrinsic goodness may not be an intrinsic property, and that what is intrinsically good may turn out not to be so in virtue of its intrinsic properties.

See the

Supplement on Atomism/Holism about Value

for further discussion of the implications of the assumption that intrinsic value supervenes on intrinsic properties.

Instrumental value is also sometimes contrasted with “constitutive” value. The idea behind this distinction is that instrumental values lead causally to intrinsic values, while constitutive values amount to intrinsic values. For example, my giving you money, or a latte, may causally result in your experiencing pleasure, whereas your experiencing pleasure may constitute, without causing, your being happy. For many purposes this distinction is not very important and often not noted, and constitutive values can be thought, along with instrumental values, as things that are ways of getting something of intrinsic value. I'll use “instrumental” in a broad sense, to include such values.

2.1.2 What is the Intrinsic/Instrumental Distinction Among?

I have assumed, here, that the intrinsic/instrumental distinction is among what I have been calling “value claims”, such as “pleasure is good”, rather than among one of the other kinds of uses of “good” from part 1. It does not make sense, for example, to say that something is a good can opener, but only instrumentally, or that Sue is a good dancer, but only instrumentally. Perhaps it does make sense to say that vitamins are good for Jack, but only instrumentally; if that is right, then the instrumental/intrinsic distinction will be more general, and it may tell us something about the structure of and relationship between the different senses of “good”, to look at which uses of “good” allow an intrinsic/instrumental distinction.

It is sometimes said that consequentialists, since they appeal to claims about what is good simpliciter in their explanatory theories, are committed to holding that states of affairs are the “primary” bearers of value, and hence are the only things of intrinsic value. This is not right. First, consequentialists can appeal in their explanatory moral theory to facts about what state of affairs would be best, without holding that states of affairs are the “primary” bearers of value; instead of having a “good-first” theory, they may have a “value-first” theory (see section 1.1.4), according to which states of affairs are good or bad in virtue of there being more things of value in them. Moreover, even those who take a “good-first” theory are not really committed to holding that it is states of affairs that are intrinsically valuable; states of affairs are not, after all, something that you can collect more or less of. So they are not really in parallel to pleasure or knowledge.

For more discussion of intrinsic value, see the entry on intrinsic vs. extrinsic value.

2.2 Monism/Pluralism

One of the oldest questions in the theory of value is that of whether there is more than one fundamental (intrinsic) value. Monists say “no”, and pluralists say “yes”. This question only makes sense as a question about intrinsic values; clearly there is more than one instrumental value, and monists and pluralists will disagree, in many cases, not over whether something is of value, but over whether its value is intrinsic. For example, as important as he held the value of knowledge to be, Mill was committed to holding that its value is instrumental, not intrinsic. G.E. Moore disagreed, holding that knowledge is indeed a value, but an intrinsic one, and this expanded Moore's list of basic values. Mill's theory famously has a pluralistic element as well, in contrast with Bentham's, but whether Mill properly counts as a pluralist about value depends on whether his view was that there is only one value — happiness — but two different kinds of pleasure which contribute to it, one more effectively than the other, or whether his view was that each kind of pleasure is a distinctive value. This point will be important in what follows.

2.2.1 Ontology and Explanation

At least three quite different sorts of issues are at stake in this debate. First is an ontological/explanatory issue. Some monists have held that a plural list of values would be explanatorily unsatisfactory. If pleasure and knowledge are both values, they have held, there remains a further question to be asked: why? If this question has an answer, some have thought, it must be because there is a further, more basic, value under which the explanation subsumes both pleasure and knowledge. Hence, pluralist theories are either explanatorily inadequate, or have not really located the basic intrinsic values.

This argument relies on a highly controversial principle about how an explanation of why something is a value must work — a very similar principle to that which was appealed to in the argument that intrinsic value must be an intrinsic property [section 2.1.1]. If this principle is false, then an explanatory theory of why both pleasure and knowledge are values can be offered which does not work by subsuming them under a further, more fundamental value. Reductive theories of what it is to be a value satisfy this description, and other kinds of theory may do so, as well (Schroeder [2005]). If one of these kinds of theory is correct, then even pluralists can offer an explanation of why the basic values that they appeal to are values.

2.2.2 Revisionary Commitments?

Moreover, against the monist, the pluralist can argue that the basic posits to which her theory appeals are not different in kind from those to which the monist appeals; they are only different in number. This leads to the second major issue that is at stake in the debate between monists and pluralists. Monistic theories carry strong implications about what is of value. Given any monistic theory, everything that is of value must be either the one intrinsic value, or else must lead to the one intrinsic value. This means that if some things that are intuitively of value, such as knowledge, do not, in fact, always lead to what a theory holds to be the one intrinsic value (for example, pleasure), then the theory is committed to denying that these things are really always of value after all.

Confronted with these kinds of difficulties in subsuming everything that is pre-theoretically of value under one master value, pluralists don't fret: they simply add to their list of basic intrinsic values, and hence can be more confident in preserving the pre-theoretical phenomena. Monists, in contrast, have a choice. They can change their mind about the basic intrinsic value and try all over again, they can work on developing resourceful arguments that knowledge really does lead to pleasure, or they can bite the bullet and conclude that knowledge is really not, after all, always good, but only under certain specific conditions. If the explanatory commitments of the pluralist are not different in kind from those of the monist, but only different in number, then it is natural for the pluralist to think that this kind of slavish adherence to the number one is a kind of fetish it is better to do without, if we want to develop a theory that gets things right. This is a perspective that many historical pluralists have shared.

2.2.3 Incommensurability

The third important issue in the debate between monists and pluralists, and the most central over recent decades, is that over the relationship between pluralism and incommensurability. If one state of affairs is better than another just in case it contains more value than the other, and there are two or more basic intrinsic values, then it is not clear how two states of affairs can be compared, if one contains more of the first value, but the other contains more of the second. Which state of affairs is better, under such a circumstance? In contrast, if there is only one intrinsic value, then this can't happen: the state of affairs that is better is the one that has more of the basic intrinsic value, whatever that is.

Reasoning like this has led some philosophers to believe that pluralism is the key to explaining the complexity of real moral situations and the genuine tradeoffs that they involve. If some things really are incomparable or incommensurable, they reason, then pluralism about value could explain why. Very similar reasoning has led other philosophers, however, to the view that monism has to be right: practical wisdom requires being able to make choices, even in complicated situations, they argue. But that would be impossible, if the options available in some choice were incomparable in this way. So if pluralism leads to this kind of incomparability, then pluralism must be false.

In the next section, we'll consider the debate over the comparability of values on which this question hinges. But even if we grant all of the assumptions on both sides so far, monists have the better of these two arguments. Value pluralism may be one way to obtain incomparable options, but there could be other ways, even consistently with value monism. For example, take the interpretation of Mill on which he believes that there is only one intrinsic value — happiness — but that happiness is a complicated sort of thing, which can happen in each of two different ways — either through higher pleasures, or through lower pleasures. If Mill has this view, and holds, further, that it is in some cases indeterminate whether someone who has slightly more higher pleasures is happier than someone who has quite a few more lower pleasures, then he can explain why it is indeterminate whether it is better to be the first way or the second way, without having to appeal to pluralism in his theory of value. The pluralism would be within his theory of happiness alone.

See a more detailed discussion in the entry on value pluralism.

2.3 Incommensurability/Incomparability

We have just seen that one of the issues at stake in the debate between monists and pluralists about value turns on the question (vaguely put) of whether values can be incomparable or incommensurable. This is consequently an area of active dispute in its own right. There are, in fact, many distinct issues in this debate, and sometimes several of them are run together.

2.3.1 Is there Weak Incomparability?

One of the most important questions at stake is whether it must always be true, for two states of affairs, that things would be better if the first obtained than if the second did, that things would be better if the second obtained than if the first did, or that things would be equally good if either obtained. The claim that it can sometimes happen that none of these is true is sometimes referred to as the claim of incomparability, in this case as applied to good simpliciter. Ruth Chang [2002] has argued that in addition to “better than”, “worse than”, and “equally good”, there is a fourth “positive value relation”, which she calls parity. Chang reserves the use of “incomparable” to apply more narrowly, to the possibility that in addition to none of the other three relations holding between them, it is possible that two states of affairs may fail even to be “on a par”. However, we can distinguish between weak incomparability, defined as above, and strong incomparability, further requiring the lack of parity, whatever that turns out to be. Since the notion of parity is itself a theoretical idea about how to account for what happens when the other three relations fail to obtain, a question which I won't pursue here, it will be weak incomparability that will interest us here.

It is important to distinguish the question of whether good simpliciter admits of incomparability from the question of whether good for and attributive good admit of incomparability. Many discussions of the incomparability of values proceed at a very abstract level, and interchange examples of each of these kinds of value claims. For example, a typical example of a purported incomparability might compare, say, Mozart to Rodin. Is Mozart a better artist than Rodin? Is Rodin a better artist than Mozart? Are they equally good? If none of these is the case, then we have an example of incomparability in attributive good, but not an example of incomparability in good simpliciter. These questions may be parallel or closely related, and investigation of each may be instructive in consideration of the other, but they still need to be kept separate.

For example, one important argument against the incomparability of value was mentioned in the previous section. It is that incomparability would rule out the possibility of practical wisdom, because practical wisdom requires the ability to make correct choices even in complicated choice situations. Choices are presumably between actions, or between possible consequences of those actions. So it could be that attributive good is sometimes incomparable, because neither Mozart nor Rodin is a better artist than the other and they are not equally good, but that good simpliciter is always comparable, so that there is always an answer as to which of two actions would lead to an outcome that is better.

2.3.2 What Happens when there is Weak Incomparability?

Even once it is agreed that good simpliciter is incomparable in this sense, many theories have been offered as to what that incomparability involves and why it exists. One important constraint on such theories is that they not predict more incomparabilities than we really observe. For example, though Rodin may not be a better or worse artist than Mozart, nor equally good, he is certainly a better artist than Salieri — even though Salieri, like Mozart, is a better composer than Rodin. This is a problem for the idea that incomparability can be explained by value pluralism. The argument from value pluralism to incomparability suggested that it would be impossible to compare any two states of affairs where one contained more of one basic value and the other contained more of another. But cases like that of Rodin and Salieri show that the explanation of what is incomparable between Rodin and Mozart can't simply be that since Rodin is a better sculptor and Mozart is a better composer, there is no way of settling who is the better artist. If that were the correct explanation, then Rodin and Salieri would also be incomparable, but intuitively, they are not. Constraints like these can narrow down the viable theories about what is going on in cases of incomparability, and are evidence that incomparability is probably not going to be straightforwardly explained by value pluralism.

There are many other kinds of theses that go under the title of the incomparability or incommensurability of values. For example, some theories which posit lexical orderings are said to commit to “incomparabilities”. Kant's thesis that rational agents have a dignity and not a price is often taken to be a thesis about a kind of incommensurability, as well. Some have interpreted Kant to be holding simply that respect for rational agents is of infinite value, or that it is to be lexically ordered over the value of anything else. Another thesis in the neighborhood, however, would be somewhat weaker. It might be that a human life is “above price” in the sense that killing one to save one is not an acceptable exchange, but that for some positive value of n, killing one to save n would be an acceptable exchange. On this view, there is no single “exchange value” for a life, because the value of a human life depends on whether you are “buying” or “selling” — it is higher when you are going to take it away, but lower when you are going to preserve it. Such a view would intelligibly count as a kind of “incommensurability”, because it sets no single value on human lives.

A more detailed discussion of the commensurability of values can be found in the entry on incommensurable values.

3. Relation to the Deontic

One of the biggest and most important questions about value is the matter of its relation to the deontic — to categories like right, reason, rational, just, and ought. According to teleological views, of which classical consequentialism and universalizable egoism are classic examples, deontic categories are posterior to and to be explained in terms of evaluative categories like good and good for. The contrasting view, according to which deontic categories are prior to, and explain, the evaluative categories, is one which, as Aristotle says, has no name. But its most important genus is that of “fitting attitude” accounts, and Scanlon's [1998] “buck-passing” theory is another closely related contemporary example.

3.1 Teleology

Teleological theories are not, strictly speaking, theories about value. They are theories about right action, or about what one ought to do. But they are committed to claims about value, because they appeal to evaluative facts, in order to explain what is right and wrong, and what we ought to do — deontic facts. The most obvious consequence of these theories, is therefore that evaluative facts must not then be explained in terms of deontic facts. The evaluative, on such views, is prior to the deontic.

3.1.1 Classical Consequentialism

The most familiar sort of view falling under this umbrella is classical consequentialism, sometimes called (for reasons we'll see in section 3.3) “agent-neutral consequentialism”. According to classical consequentialism, every agent ought always to do whatever action, out of all of the actions available to her at that time, is the one such that if she did it, things would be best.

Classical consequentialism is sometimes supported by appeal to the intuition that one should always do the best action, and then the assumption that actions are only instrumentally good or bad — for the sake of what they lead to (compare especially Moore [1903]). The problem with this reasoning is that non-consequentialists can agree that agents ought always to do the best action. The important feature of this claim to recognize is that it is a claim not about intrinsic or instrumental value, but about attributive good. And as noted in section 2.1, “instrumental” and “intrinsic” don't really apply to attributive good. Just as how good of a can opener something is or how good of a torturer someone is does not depend on how good the world is, as a result of the fact that they exist, how good of an action something is need not depend on how good the world is, as a result that it happens. Indeed, if it did, then the evaluative standards governing actions would be quite different from those governing nearly everything else.

3.1.2 Problems in Principle vs. Problems of Implementation

Classical consequentialism, and its instantiation in the form of utilitarianism, has been well-explored, and its advantages and costs cannot be surveyed here. Many of the issues for classical consequentialism, however, are issues for details of its exact formulation or implementation, and not problems in principle with its appeal to the evaluative in order to explain the deontic. For example, the worry that consequentialism is too demanding has been addressed within the consequentialist framework, by replacing “best” with “good enough” — substituting a “satisficing” conception for a “maximizing” one (Slote [1989]). For another example, problems faced by certain consequentialist theories, like traditional utilitarianism, about accounting for things like justice can be solved by other consequentialist theories, simply by adopting a more generous picture about what sort of things contribute to how good things are (Sen [1982]).

In section 3.3 we'll address one of the most central issues about classical consequentialism: its inability to allow for agent-centered constraints. This issue does pose an in-principle general problem for the aspiration of consequentialism to explain deontic categories in terms of the evaluative. For more, see the entry on consequentialism and utilitarianism.

3.1.3 Other Teleological Theories

Universalizable egoism is another familiar teleological theory. According to universalizable egoism, each agent ought always to do whatever action has the feature that, of all available alternatives, it is the one such that, were she to do it, things would be best for her. Rather than asking agents to maximize the good, egoism asks agents to maximize what is good for them. Universalizable egoism shares many features with classical consequentialism, and Sidgwick found both deeply attractive. Many others have joined Sidgwick in holding that there is something deeply attractive about what consequentialism and egoism have in common — which involves, at minimum, the teleological idea that the deontic is to be explained in terms of the evaluative (Portmore [2005]).

Of course, not all teleological theories share the broad features of consequentialism and egoism. Classical Natural Law theories (Finnis [1980], Murphy [2001]) are teleological, in the sense that they seek to explain what we ought to do in terms of what is good, but they do so in a very different way from consequentialism and egoism. According to an example of such a Natural Law theory, there are a variety of natural values, each of which calls for a certain kind of distinctive response or respect, and agents ought always to act in ways that respond to the values with that kind of respect. For more on natural law theories, see the entry on the natural law tradition in ethics.

3.2 Fitting Attitudes

In contrast to teleological theories, which seek to account for deontic categories in terms of evaluative ones, Fitting Attitudes accounts aspire to account for evaluative categories — like good simpliciter, good for, and attributive good — in terms of the deontic. Whereas teleology has implications about value but is not itself a theory primarily about value, but rather about what is right, Fitting Attitudes accounts are primarily theses about value — in accounting for it in terms of the deontic, they tell us what it is for something to be good. Hence, they are theories about the nature of value.

The basic idea behind all kinds of Fitting Attitudes account is that “good” is closely linked to “desirable”. “Desireable”, of course, in contrast to “visible” and “audible”, which mean “able to be seen” and “able to be heard”, does not mean “able to be desired”. It means, rather, something like “correctly desired” or “appropriately desired”. If being good just is being desirable, and being desirable just is being correctly or appropriately desired, it follows that being good just is being correctly or appropriately desired. But correct and appropriate are deontic concepts, so if being good is just being desirable, then goodness can itself be accounted for in terms of the deontic. And that is the basic idea behind Fitting Attitudes accounts (Ewing [1947], Rabinowicz and Rönnow-Rasmussen [2004]).

3.2.1 Two Fitting Attitudes Accounts

Different Fitting Attitudes accounts, however, work by appealing to different deontic concepts. Some of the problems facing Fitting Attitudes views can be exhibited by considering a couple exemplars. According to a formula from Sidgwick, for example, the good is what ought to be desired. But this slogan is not by itself very helpful until we know more: desired by whom? By everyone? By at least someone? By someone in particular? And for which of our senses of “good” does this seek to provide an account? Is it an account of good simpliciter, saying that it would be good if p just in case ____ ought to desire that p, where “____” is filled in by whoever it is, who is supposed to have the desire? Or is it an account of “value” claims, saying that pleasure is good just in case pleasure ought to be desired by ____?

The former of these two accounts would fit in with the “good-first” theory from section 1.1.4; the latter would fit in with the “value-first” theory. We observed in section 1.1.4 that “value” claims don't admit of comparatives in the same way that other uses of “good” do; this is important here because if “better” simpliciter is prior to “good” simpliciter, then strictly speaking a “good-first” theorist needs to offer a Fitting Attitudes account of “better”, rather than of “good”. Such a modification of the Sidgwickian slogan might say that it would be better if p than if q just in case ____ ought to desire that p more than that q (or alternatively, to prefer p to q).

In What We Owe to Each Other, T.M. Scanlon offers an influential contemporary view with much in common with Fitting Attitudes accounts, which he called the Buck-Passing theory of value. According to Scanlon's slogan, “to call something valuable is to say that it has other properties that provide reasons for behaving in certain ways with respect to it.” One important difference from Sidgwick's view is that it appeals to a different deontic concept: reasons instead of ought. But it also aspires to be more neutral than Sidgwick's slogan on the specific response that is called for. Sidgwick's slogan required that it is desire that is always relevant, whereas Scanlon's slogan leaves open that there may be different “certain ways” of responding to different kinds of values.

But despite these differences, the Scanlonian slogan shares with the Sidgwickian slogan the feature of being massively underspecified. For which sense of “good” does it aspire to provide an account? Is it really supposed to be directly an account of “good”, or, if we respect the priority of “better” to “good”, should we really try to understand it as, at bottom, an account of “better than”? And crucially, which are the “certain ways” that are involved? It can't just be that the speaker has to have some certain ways in mind, because there are some ways of responding such that reasons to respond in that way are evidence that the thing in question is bad rather than that it is good — for example, the attitude of dread. So does the theory require that there is some particular set of certain ways, such that a thing is good just in case there are reasons to respond to it in any of those ways? Scanlon's initial remarks suggest rather that for each sort of thing, there are different “certain ways” such that when we say that that thing is good, we are saying that there are reasons to respond to it in those ways. This is a matter that would need to be sorted out by any worked out view.

A further complication with the Scanlonian formula, is that appealing in the analysis to the bare existential claim that there are reasons to respond to something in one of these “certain ways” faces large difficulties. Suppose, for example, that there is some reason to respond in one of the “certain ways”, but there are competing, and weightier, reasons not to, so that all things considered, responding in any of the “certain ways” would be a mistake. Plausibly, the thing under consideration should not turn out to be good in such a case. So even a view like Scanlon's, which appeals to reasons, may need, once it is more fully developed, to appeal to specific claims about the weight of those reasons.

3.2.2 The Wrong Kind of Reason

Even once these kinds of questions are sorted out, however, other significant questions remain. For example, one of the famous problems facing such views is the Wrong Kind of Reasons problem (Crisp [2000], Rabinowicz and Rönnow-Rasmussen [2004]). The problem arises from the observation that intuitively, some factors can affect what you ought to desire without affecting what is good. It may be true that if we make something better, then other things being equal, you ought to desire it more. But we can also create incentives for you to desire it, without making it any better. For example, you might be offered a substantial financial reward for desiring something bad, or an evil demon might (credibly) threaten to kill your family unless you do so. If these kinds of circumstances can affect what you ought to desire, as is at least intuitively plausible, then they will be counterexamples to views based on the Sidgwickian formula. Similarly, if these kinds of circumstances can give you reasons to desire the thing which is bad, then they will be counterexamples to views based on the Scanlonian formula. It is in the context of the Scanlonian formula that this issue has been called the “Wrong Kind of Reasons” problem, because if these circumstances do give you reasons to desire the thing that is bad, they are reasons of the wrong kind to figure in a Scanlon-style account of what it is to be good.

This issue has recently been the topic of much fruitful investigation, and investigators have drawn parallels between the kinds of reason to desire that are provided by these kinds of “external” incentives and familiar issues about pragmatic reasons for belief and the kind of reason to intend that exists in Gregory Kavka's Toxin Puzzle (Hieronymi [2005]). Focusing on the cases of desire, belief, and intention, which are all kinds of mental state, some have claimed that the distinction between the “right kind” and “wrong kind” of reason can be drawn on the basis of the distinction between “object-given” reasons, which refer to the object of the attitude, and “state-given” reasons, which refer to the mental state itself, rather than to its object (Parfit [2001], Piller [2006]). But questions have also been raised about whether the “object-given”/“state-given” distinction is general enough to really explain the distinction between reasons of the right kind and reasons of the wrong kind, and it has even been disputed whether the distinction tracks anything at all.

One reason to think that the distinction may not be general enough, is that situations very much like Wrong Kind of Reasons situations can arise even where no mental states are in play. For example, games are subject to norms of correctness. External incentives to cheat — for example, a credible threat from an evil demon that she will kill your family unless you do so — can plausibly not only provide you with reasons to cheat, but make it the case that you ought to. But just as such external incentives don't make it appropriate or correct to desire something bad, they don't make it a correct move of the game to cheat (Schroeder [2010]). If this is right, and the right kind/wrong kind distinction among reasons really does arise in a broad spectrum of cases, including ones like this one, it is not likely that a distinction that only applies to reasons for mental states is going to lie at the bottom of it.

3.2.3 Solving the Problem

Even once a successful classification of reasons of the “right” and “wrong” kinds has been given, however, a further move is needed in order actually to solve the Wrong Kind of Reasons problem for Fitting Attitudes accounts. At least three different strategies have developed for doing so. (1) The first is to deny that external incentives like those which create the problem can actually affect what you ought to desire, at all — or put in terms of reasons, to deny that reasons of the “wrong kind” are really reasons to desire at all (Hieronymi [2005], Way [2012]). (2) According to a second approach, Fitting Attitudes accounts should not appeal to the notion of “ought” or “reason” at all, but rather to some other deontic concept, for which we won't be able to reconstruct the problem. Candidate proposals include the notion of the “fitting” (whence “Fitting Attitudes”) or “appropriate”, and the concept of correctness (McHugh and Way [2016]). (3) And according to yet a third approach, the problem should ultimately be addressed by being more careful about the question of who the Fitting Attitudes account says ought to, or has a reason to, have the requisite desire, or about what explains this reason (Schroeder [2010]).

Independently of the prospects for any particular solution, however, Fitting Attitudes theorists can appeal to arguments for optimism that this problem must have some solution. After all, the basic idea behind the Fitting Attitudes approach is that “good” is like “desirable”. But it is highly plausible that “desirable” means something like “fittingly or correctly desired” — after all, desirability is a normative, not a merely descriptive, characteristic, and it has something to do with desire. So there must be some deontic category which we can compose with “desire”, “admire”, and “detest” in order to yield notions like that of the desirable, the admirable, and the detestable, without fear of reasons of the wrong kind. Whatever that deontic category is, it will do for the Fitting Attitudes analysis of “good”.

Further discussion of fitting attitudes accounts of value and the wrong kind of reasons problem can be found in the entry on fitting attitude theories of value.

3.2.4 Application to the Varieties of Goodness

One significant attraction to Fitting Attitudes-style accounts, is that they offer prospects of being successfully applied to attributive good and good for, as well as to good simpliciter (Darwall [2002], Rönnow-Rasmussen [2009]). Just as reasons to prefer one state of affairs to another can underwrite one state of affairs being better than another, reasons to choose one can-opener over another can underwrite its being a better can opener than the other, and reasons to prefer some state of affairs for someone's sake can underwrite its being better for that person than another. For example, here is a quick sketch of what an account might look like, which accepts the good-first theory from section 1.1.4, holds as in section 1.1.2 that good simpliciter is a special case of attributive good, and understands attributive “good” in terms of attributive “better” and “good for” in terms of “better for”:

Attributive better: For all kinds K, and things A and B, for A to be a better K than B is for the set of all of the right kind of reasons to choose A over B when selecting a K to be weightier than the set of all of the right kind of reasons to choose B over A when selecting a K.

Better for: For all things A, B, and C, A is better for C than B is just in case the set of all of the right kind of reasons to choose A over B on C's behalf is weightier than the set of all of the right kind of reasons to choose B over A on C's behalf.

If being a good K is just being a better K than most (in some comparison class), and “it would be good if p” just means that p‘s obtaining is a good state of affairs, and value claims like “pleasure is good” just mean that other things being equal, it is better for there to be more pleasure, then this pair of accounts has the right structure to account for the full range of “good” claims that we have encountered. But it also shows how the various senses of “good” are related, and allows that even attributive good and good for have, at bottom, a common shared structure. So the prospect of being able to offer such a unified story about what the various senses of “good” have in common, though not the exclusive property of the Fitting Attitudes approach, is nevertheless one of its attractions.

3.3 Agent-Relative Value?

3.3.1 Agent-Centered Constraints

The most central, in-principle problem for classical consequentialism is the possibility of what are called agent-centered constraints (Scheffler [1983]). It has long been a traditional objection to utilitarian theories that because they place no intrinsic disvalue on wrong actions like murder, they yield the prediction that if you have a choice between murdering and allowing two people to die, it is clear that you should murder. After all, other things being equal, the situation is stacked 2-to-1 — there are two deaths on one side, but only one death on the other, and each death is equally bad.

Consequentialists who hold that killings of innocents are intrinsically bad can avoid this prediction. As long as a murder is at least twice as bad as an ordinary death not by murder, consequentialists can explain why you ought not to murder, even in order to prevent two deaths. So there is no in-principle problem for consequentialism posed by this sort of example; whether it is an issue for a given consequentialist depends on her axiology: on what she thinks is intrinsically bad, and how bad she thinks it is.

But the problem is very closely related to a genuine problem for consequentialism. What if you could prevent two murders by murdering? Postulating an intrinsic disvalue to murders does nothing to account for the intuition that you still ought not to murder, even in this case. But most people find it pre-theoretically natural to assume that even if you should murder in order to prevent thousands of murders, you shouldn't do it in order to prevent just two. The constraint against murdering, on this natural intuition, goes beyond the idea that murders are bad. It requires that the badness of your own murders affects what you should do more than it affects what others should do in order to prevent you from murdering. That is why it is called “agent-centered”.

3.3.2 Agent-Relative Value

The problem with agent-centered constraints is that there seems to be no single natural way of evaluating outcomes that yields all of the right predictions. For each agent, there is some way of evaluating outcomes that yields the right predictions about what she ought to do, but these rankings treat that agent's murders as contributing more to the badness of outcomes than other agents' murders. So as a result, an incompatible ranking of outcomes appears to be required in order to yield the right predictions about what some other agent ought to do — namely, one which rates his murders as contributing more to the badness of outcomes than the first agent's murders. (The situation is slightly more complicated — Oddie and Milne [1991] prove that under pretty minimal assumptions there is always some agent-neutral ranking that yields the right consequentialist predictions, but their proof does not show that this ranking has any independent plausibility, and Nair [2014] argues that it cannot be an independently plausible account of what is a better outcome.)

As a result of this observation, philosophers have postulated a thing called agent-relative value. The idea of agent-relative value is that if the better than relation is relativized to agents, then outcomes in which Franz murders can be worse-relative-to Franz than outcomes in which Jens murders, even though outcomes in which Jens murders are worse-relative-to Jens than outcomes in which Franz murders. These contrasting rankings of these two kinds of outcomes are not incompatible, because each is relativized to a different agent — the former to Franz, and the latter to Jens.

The idea of agent-relative value is attractive to teleologists, because it allows a view that is very similar in structure to classical consequentialism to account for constraints. According to this view, sometimes called Agent-Relative Teleology or Agent-Centered Consequentialism, each agent ought always to do what will bring about the results that are best-relative-to her. Such a view can easily accommodate an agent-centered constraint not to murder, on the assumption that each agent's murders are sufficiently worse-relative-to her than other agent's murders are (Sen [1983], Portmore [2007]).

Some philosophers have claimed that Agent-Relative Teleology is not even a distinct theory from classical consequentialism, holding that the word “good” in English picks out agent-relative value in a context-dependent way, so that when consequentialists say, “everyone ought to do what will have the best results”, what they are really saying is that “everyone ought to do what will have the best-relative-to-her results” (Smith [2003]). And other philosophers have suggested that Agent-Relative Teleology is such an attractive theory that everyone is really committed to it (Dreier [1996]). These thesis are bold claims in the theory of value, because they tell us strong and surprising things about the nature of what we are talking about, when we use the word, “good”.

3.3.3 Problems and Prospects

In fact, it is highly controversial whether there is even such a thing as agent-relative value in the first place. Agent-Relative Teleologists typically appeal to a distinction between agent-relative and agent-neutral value, but others have contested that no one has ever successfully made such a distinction in a theory-neutral way (Schroeder [2007]). Moreover, even if there is such a distinction, relativizing “good” to agents is not sufficient to deal with all intuitive cases of constraints, because common sense allows that you ought not to murder, even in order to prevent yourself from murdering twice in the future. In order to deal with such cases, “good” will need to be relativized not just to agents, but to times (Brook [1991]). Yet a further source of difficulties arises for views according to which “good” in English is used to make claims about agent-relative value in a context-dependent way; such views fail ordinary tests for context-dependence, and don't always generate the readings of sentences which their proponents require.

One of the motivations for thinking that there must be such a thing as agent-relative value comes from proponents of Fitting Attitudes accounts of value, and goes like this: if the good is what ought to be desired, then there will be two kinds of good. What ought to be desired by everyone will be the “agent-neutral” good, and what ought to be desired by some particular person will be the good relative-to that person. Ancestors of this idea can be found in Sidgwick and Ewing, and it has found a number of contemporary proponents. Whether it is right will turn not only on whether Fitting Attitudes accounts turn out to be correct, but on what role the answer to the questions, “who ought?” or “whose reasons?” plays in the shape of an adequate Fitting Attitudes account. All of these issues remain unresolved.

The questions of whether there is such a thing as agent-relative value, and if so, what role it might play in an agent-centered variant on classical consequentialism, are at the heart of the debate between consequentialists and deontologists, and over the fundamental question of the relative priority of the evaluative versus the deontic. These are large and open questions, but as I hope I've illustrated here, they are intimately interconnected with a very wide range of both traditional and non-traditional questions in the theory of value, broadly construed.


Works Cited

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Other Important Works

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