A Priori Justification and Knowledge

First published Sun Dec 9, 2007; substantive revision Mon May 19, 2014

A priori justification is a type of epistemic justification that is, in some sense, independent of experience. Gettier examples have led most philosophers to think that having a justified true belief is not sufficient for knowledge (see sec. 5, below, and the example, Sheep), but many still believe that it is necessary. For those that do, a priori knowledge is knowledge based on a priori justification. There are a variety of views about whether a priori justification can be defeated (overridden or undercut) by other evidence, especially empirical evidence, and a variety of views about whether a priori justification, and knowledge, must be only of necessary or analytic propositions (see examples (1a)–(4a) and (7a)–(14a), below), or at least of ones believed to be necessary or analytic.

A priori justification seems to rest on rational intuitions, or insights, but there are a variety of views about the nature of these intuitions or insights. There are different explanations of how these intuitions provide justification, if they do. Some philosophers do not see a priori justification as resting on any evidence, either experiential or nonexperiential, and so not resting on rational intuitions or insights at all. Their idea is that in some circumstances it can be default reasonable for a person to accept a proposition, or that the person is entitled to accept certain presuppositions independent of any evidence. Of course, there are also many objections to the idea that there can be a priori justification. Finally, rationalists think that there can be a priori justification and knowledge of the world while empiricists deny this.

Because most philosophers believe that knowledge requires justification, it is widely thought that a priori knowledge is just a special kind of knowledge, namely, knowledge that is based solely on a priori justification. That makes the notion of a priori justification central, and that is why I will focus this discussion on that notion. I will make only a few remarks about a priori knowledge at the end of this essay. The following list indicates the topics that will be presented and addressed.

1. Examples that illustrate the difference between a priori and a posteriori (empirical) justification

A priori justification is a certain kind of justification often contrasted with empirical, or a posteriori, justification. To get an idea of the difference, consider the following pairs of propositions. In each case, the first member of the pair is supposed to be an example in which, if we are justified in believing the proposition, we are a priori justified in believing it, and the second member an example in which, if we are justified in believing the proposition, we are a posteriori (that is, empirically) justified in believing it. Some of the propositions are false, but that does not mean that we could not be justified in believing them before we had evidence that they are false.

  • 1 a. All bachelors are unmarried.
  • b. All bachelors in the U.S. are taxed at a different rate from married men.
  • 2a. All crows are birds.
  • b. All crows are black.
  • 3a. All vixens are female.
  • b. All vixens are cunning.
  • 4a. Green is a color.
  • b. Grass is green.
  • 5a. No object can be red and green all over at the same time.
  • b. There are ripe tomatoes that are now red all over but were green all over weeks earlier.
  • 6a. If A is taller than B, and B is taller than C, then A is taller than C.
  • b. Shaquille O'Neale is taller than Kobe Bryant, and Kobe Bryant is taller than Tony Parker (famous basketball players).
  • 7a. A house is an abode for living.
  • b. A house undermined will fall.
  • 8a.All rubies are red.
  • bi. All rubies have chemical structure Al2O3.
  • ii. Topaz is either blue, orange, yellow, or yellowish brown.
  • iii. Water is H2O.
  • 9a. 2 + 2 = 4.
  • b. 2 quarts of any liquid added to 2 more quarts of any liquid = 4 quarts of liquid.
  • 10a. All squares are rectangles.
  • b. No square-shaped object has a surface area greater than the total surface area of the United States.
  • 11a. If you know something, you believe it and it's true.
  • b. I know that the earth is the third planet from the sun.
  • 12a. Happiness is an intrinsic good.
  • b. Happiness is produced by a person's belief that the most important things in her life are going well.
  • 13a. It is wrong to punish the innocent.
  • b. People who are unjustly punished often become resentful.
  • 14a. Torturing people just for the fun of it is wrong.
  • b. Torture often produces unreliable testimony.

In each example, it is possible for someone to be justified in believing the first member of the pair (or in the case of 8, the first of four members) in a way that is different from how it is possible for someone to be justified in believing the second member of the pair. Let's say that the first members are justified a priori; the latter members, a posteriori (or empirically) justified, if justified at all.

2. What sorts of propositions can be a priori justified and known?

A justified proposition need not be true. (9b) is false, for if you add two quarts of carbon tetrachloride to two quarts of water you will get less than four quarts of liquid because the molecules pack together in a way that diminishes the total volume. Still, someone not knowing of such examples might be justified in believing (9b). (8bii) is also false; topaz can be other colors than the four listed. “All rubies are red” might strike you as being like “All crows are black”, and so lead you to believe that if we are justified in believing that all rubies are red, the justification must be empirical. But gemologists think that rubies must be red, that it is conceptually required that they be red. In any case, let's assume that the concept of a ruby requires that rubies be red. Then that concept would be a hybrid concept. Necessarily, a ruby is a red stone, and that it must be red can be known a priori. Also, a ruby necessarily has the chemical composition of Al2O3, and that it must have that composition can be known only empirically. Hence, its essence is knowable in part a priori and in part only empirically. So rubies would not be like topaz where the underlying chemical structure alone determines whether some stone is a topaz, and that structure can only be known empirically. In that respect, topaz is like water because what water is essentially can only be known empirically.

Just as we can be empirically justified in believing a false proposition (e.g., 9b), we can also be a priori justified in believing a false proposition. Many physicists believe that there are genuinely random events at the subatomic level, and so believe it false that every event has a cause. However, Kant may have been a priori justified in believing it true since no one back then had the knowledge of physics that we now possess. You might initially be a priori justified in believing that no matter how happiness has been produced it is intrinsically good (12a), or that it is always wrong to punish an innocent person (13a), and later think of counterexamples to such claims (e.g., happiness had through the suffering of others or punishing an innocent person to prevent some evil men from punishing him and many other innocent people). Then your initial a priori justification would be defeated. These examples show that a priori justification is fallible and defeasible (i.e., it can be defeated by further evidence).

Consider another example that makes this point. A particular sorites paradox involving heaps consists of the general claim that, if you take one bean away from a heap of beans, you still have a heap and a particular claim that, say, a cone-shaped stack of ten thousand beans is a heap. These two premises will lead you, bean by bean, to the conclusion that one, or even no beans, is a heap! It seems that we are a priori justified in believing both the general and the particular claim to be true, but at least one of them must not be true (perhaps the general claim is false, or even neither true nor false) because together they lead to an absurd conclusion. So this is another reason to think that a priori justification is fallible. (See Sosa 1998: 258–59, for an example about heaps and Bealer 1998: 202, where he argues that philosophical paradoxes show that intuition is fallible. With a paradox, you are justified in believing each of a set of propositions taken separately, but at least one of them must be false because the set is inconsistent.)

Why have others thought this impossible? Kant said that a priori knowledge is “knowledge that is absolutely independent of all experience” (Kant 1787: 43). But the requirement that a priori knowledge (and justification) be absolutely independent of all experience seems too stringent and suggests that all a priori knowledge (and justification) must rest on innate ideas. A more plausible requirement is that a priori knowledge and justification be independent of all experience beyond what is needed to grasp the relevant concepts involved in the relevant proposition (see below, sec. 4).

When it is just a matter of a priori justification, not knowledge, Philip Kitcher thinks that if there is such a thing as all things considered a priori justification, then “a person is entitled to ignore empirical information about the type of world she inhabits” (Kitcher 1983: 30; see, also, 24, 80–87). Hilary Putnam thinks that if there is that sort of justification, then there are “truths which it is always rational to believe” (Putnam 1983: 90). On Kitcher's understanding of a priori justification, it is not defeasible by empirical information; on Putnam's, it is not defeasible at all. But insofar as justification is relative to the evidence a person has, or should have, it is possible for further evidence, either empirical or from intuition or rational insight, to override or undercut a person's current evidence and thereby destroy that person's current justification and knowledge. Nothing in the nature of a priori justification rules out that possibility. (See the discussion of Hartry Field, sec. 6, below, for more on why it is possible for empirical evidence in particular to defeat a priori justification.)

Not all necessary truths can be justified a priori. (8bi) and (8biii) are necessary truths that can be justified only empirically. On the other hand, some think that there are contingent truths that can be justified, and known, a priori. Saul Kripke proposed that “the standard meter stick in Paris is a meter long” is such an example (Kripke 1972: 274–75). Others have countered that what is justified a priori is “the length of the stick designated as the meter stick on some appropriate date and time is a meter long”, and that that proposition is necessarily true. We know empirically that a certain stick was so designated, and so are derivatively and empirically justified in believing of a particular stick (the standard meter stick in Paris) that its length on that appropriate date and time is one meter.

But there are other candidates for contingent truths that are a priori knowable and justifiable. Gareth Evans thinks that we can be a priori justified in believing, and know, the contingent proposition, “If actually p, then p”, and particular instantiations of it. Consider, “if the post is actually red, then it is red”. This proposition is contingent because the post could be red in the actual world but not red in some other possible world. So in some other possible world, w2, its antecedent can be true (because its antecedent is about the color of the post in the actual world, w1) and it's consequent false (because the post is not red in w2 and the consequent is about the color of the post in that world). A conditional that is necessarily true cannot have a true antecedent and a false consequent in any possible world. However, we can know independently of experience (that is, a priori) that if the post is actually red, then it's red since it is true in the actual world. In this respect the proposition is like the one expressed by “if something is a crow, it is black” since it, too, is true in the actual world but not necessarily true. But unlike that proposition about crows, “if actually p, then p” can be known to be true a priori. Hence it is an example of a contingent proposition that is knowable a priori (cf., Evans 1979: 83–85, for his discussion of this topic).

While we have seen that not all necessary truths are capable of being justified, or known, a priori (e.g., 8bi and 8biii), there is a difference between necessarily true propositions that might be known, or justified, a priori. The propositions expressed by (5a) and (6a) seem different from the propositions expressed by the other first members of the other pairs. Those other propositions seem to be analytic. A sentence is analytic if, and only if, it can be changed so as to express a logical truth by substituting appropriate synonyms for relevant terms and expressions in the sentence. So, for instance, “all vixens are female” will express a logical truth of the form if A&B, then A if we substitute for “vixen”, “female fox”, for it will then say: if something is a female fox, it is a female. But no substitution of synonyms for terms or expressions in (5a) and (6a) will yield a logical truth. The propositions expressed by (5a) and (6a) are often said to be synthetic a priori propositions because they are not analytic (they're synthetic) but are a priori knowable and justifiable.

Up to this point, I have been discussing what sorts of propositions can be justified, or known, a priori, and whether a priori justification is fallible and defeasible. But what does it mean to say that someone is a priori justified in believing propositions like those expressed by each of the first sentences in the fourteen pairs, that is, by (1a)–(14a)? I will now turn to that question.

3. A priori justification is justification independent of experience, but what is meant by “experience”?

A standard answer to the question about the nature of a priori justification is the following: someone is a priori justified in believing some proposition if, and only if, he is justified independently of experience in believing that proposition. Various things have been meant by “experience”. On a narrow account, “experience” refers to sense experience, that is, to experiences that come from the use of our five senses: sight, touch, hearing, smell, and taste. However, this narrow account implies that justification based on introspection, proprioception (our kinesthetic sense of the position and movements of our body), memory, and testimony would be a priori justification. That means that if I am justified in believing that the earth is the third planet from the sun (11b), it would be an example of a priori justification since it is based on the testimony of my science teachers or what I have read in some book. Also, on this account of experience, I could be a priori justified in believing: “I had cereal for breakfast this morning”, “My feet are resting on the floor”, and “I'm feeling tired right now”, since the justification of those three propositions is based on memory, proprioception, and introspection, respectively, not on any of the five senses. Given these considerations, perhaps “independent of experience” should be taken to mean “independent of sense experience, introspection, proprioception, memory, and testimony”. A priori justification is independent of experience in that sense. But this suggestion is also too narrow.

What if people had other sources of experience like telepathy, clairvoyance, echo-location (like bats have), electrolocation (like duck-billed platypuses have), and the ability to tell north from south and east from west, even after having been spun around several times with their eyes closed (see the example of Truenorth, sec. 10, below)? Or what if God exists and reveals things to certain people? Should beliefs based on divine revelation and these other sources be considered beliefs based on experience, not independent of it? One can argue that they should because any belief justified on the basis of these experiences would not be justified solely on the basis of the person's understanding the proposition which is the object of her belief. Any beliefs based on experiences other than those involving the understanding should be considered to be based on experience, not independent of experience.

A plausible positive account of a priori justification says that a person is a priori justified in believing some proposition if, and only if, that justification rests solely on her understanding the proposition which is the object of her belief. Then a posteriori justification would be justification that does not rest solely on understanding such a proposition. No one can be justified in believing (2b): all crows are black, without understanding that proposition, but any justification for believing that proposition would not rest solely on that understanding. The justification would have to come from testimony or seeing lots of black, and no non-black, crows. But someone could be a priori justified in believing (2a): all crows are birds, solely on the basis of understanding (2a). The same holds for all the other first members of the fourteen examples.

With perhaps the exception of (5a) (more below on this), experiences of how the world is seem to have no relevance to whether someone is justified in believing (1a)–(14a), provided, of course, that statements of the form “All As are Bs” (e.g., “All bachelors are unmarried”, “All vixens are female”, “All crows are birds”, etc.) are not taken to imply that there are any As, that is, are instead interpreted as conditionals of the form : “If something is an A, then it is a B”, which have no “existential import” regarding As. Even with (5a), we could be justified in believing that no object can be red and green all over at the same time if we had the experiences that people in the film The Matrix typically have, even though the world is nothing like what they think it is. Even here, how the world really is seems to have no relevance to whether we are justified in believing that no object can be red and green all over at the same time.

Albert Casullo challenges people to say what underlies and grounds the list of things considered to be “experiences” such that a priori justification must (in some sense; see sec. 4, below) be independent of them. He recommends that we take “experience” to be a natural kind term like “water”, “aluminum”, and “horse”, and discover empirically what its essence is (Casullo 2003: 159). Then we will have a way to distinguish experiential from nonexperiential (a priori) justification.

The problem with giving a natural kind account of “experience” is the same problem that faces those who wish to give a natural kind account of “good” or “right” or a host of other terms. I'll call it The Problem of Possible and Unwelcome Big Surprises (the PUBS problem for short). The problem is that on this account we may discover empirically that things that, intuitively, are not experiences, are experiences, and that things that, intuitively, are experiences, are not experiences. Something similar happens when we discover empirically that the essence of “mammal” implies that whales (which, initially, seem to be fish, not mammals) are mammals, or that not all stones called “jade” are really the same thing even though, initially, they seem to be. There is nothing wrong with these “big surprises” because biology and chemistry should determine empirically what is the best way to “carve nature at the joints”, that is, the best way to categorize phenomena according to the best scientific theories.

The worry is that the best psychological theories might categorize experiences in such a way that what, intuitively, seem to be nonexperiential sources of justification (say, intellectual intuitions or rational insights; see sec. 5, below) will turn out not to be such sources and what, intuitively, seem to be experiential sources of justification will not turn out to be such sources (say, sense experience or introspection). That is because the best psychological theories will be concerned with categorizing experiences causally, that is, according to their role in causing beliefs and behavior. That focus ignores the epistemic relevance of experiences, that is, their relevance to justifying beliefs. Similar remarks apply to so-called nonexperiential sources of justification: because the best psychological theories might categorize them according their causal roles, they might not categorize them according to their epistemic relevance.

Further, if the best psychological theories give a naturalistic account of justifying experiences (whether empirical or a priori), for all we know those theories will imply that sense experience and introspection do not provide justification and that hunches and guesses do. That is because the properties normally possessed by a kind of thing (say, water) may turn out not to be necessary properties of that kind of thing (e.g., being clear, odorless, colorless, thirst-quenching, etc.) if the term (“water”) that refers to that kind of thing is a natural kind term. So, if “justifying experience” is a natural kind expression, we cannot be certain that experiences that seem to provide justification for beliefs will really provide that justification, and vice versa. But it seems that we can be certain that sense experience and introspection had under certain conditions do provide justification (even if they do not guarantee that the corresponding beliefs are objectively likely to be true, as happens in demon world and Matrix-type situations) and that hunches and guesses do not (at least when there is no track record that would confirm their reliability).

“Experience” cannot be a natural kind term whose essence must be discoverable empirically if we are taking it in a sense relevant to epistemic justification. If it were a natural kind term, we could not know before empirical investigation that some things don't justify and others do, but it seems we can (though those convinced, or even puzzled, by skeptical arguments would disagree).

4. What is meant by independent in the phrase “independent of experience”?

As noted in the previous section, we take it that a belief that is “independent of experience” is based solely on understanding the proposition which is its object; all others are based on experience. But people sometimes understand “independent of experience” to mean something else. Some have taken it to mean “apart from experience”. But how could there be any justification apart from experience? Don't people have to learn from experience what bachelors, crows, and knowledge are in order to be justified in believing (1a), (3a), and (11a)? These are not innate ideas that people are born with, even if there are some innate ideas. And even if we are born with some innate capacities, say, to learn a language and to reason, those capacities by themselves do not provide justification for believing any of (1a)–(14a).

It seems impossible for there to be any justification completely independent of experience. We need to distinguish the experience needed to acquire the relevant concepts involved in (1a)–(14a) and any additional experience needed to determine whether the relevant propositions that contain those concepts are true or false. To say that a person could be justified in believing any of (1a)–(14a) independent of experience means that they could be justified independent of experience beyond that which is needed to acquire the relevant concepts needed to understand those propositions. For a person to be justified in believing any of (1b)–(14b), it is also true that she must have enough experience to acquire the relevant concepts expressed in those propositions. Having those concepts is necessary for her to understand the relevant propositions, and she cannot justifiedly believe a proposition that she does not understand. However, she must also have additional experience beyond that in order to determine whether the relevant proposition is true or false, or be aware of the testimony of someone who has had the requisite additional experience. That additional experience is not required for someone to tell whether (1a)–(14a) are true or false. For someone to be a priori justified in believing some proposition is for her to be justified absent experiences beyond those required for her to acquire the relevant concepts employed in the statement of that proposition. This is sometimes described as the view that a priori justification depends only on enabling experiences, that is, the experiences a person needs in order to understand the proposition at issue.

There are two ways that someone could be justified in believing some proposition without having experiences beyond those required to acquire the relevant concepts: (1) being justified in believing the proposition on the basis of output (evidence) from a nonexperiential source (for example, on the basis of rational intuitions or insights) or (2) being entitled to accept that proposition without any output (evidence) from any source.

5. A priori justification as resting on some nonexperiential source of evidence: intuition and rational insight

Suppose a priori justification rests on output (evidence) from some nonexperiential source. What sort of evidence could that be? A standard answer is that intuition, or rational insight, is the basis of a priori justification. And what are intuitions, or rational insights? Laurence BonJour thinks that rational insight is an immediate, non-inferential grasp, apprehension, or “seeing” that some proposition is necessarily true (BonJour 1998: 106). He goes on to argue that a proposition's appearing to be necessarily true is the foundation of a priori justification, for he wants to allow that such justification can be fallible and defeasible. So for BonJour it is apparent rational insights that are the evidence on which a priori justification rests, not rational insights themselves (1998: 112–13 and secs. 4.5, 4.6). After publishing In Defense of Pure Reason (1998), and in response to comments by Paul Boghossian (2001), BonJour wrote that these appearances are not propositional, that is they are not appearances that something is the case (BonJour 2001a: 677–78; BonJour 2005a: 100). In this respect, they are unlike beliefs and more like perceptual sensations.

George Bealer characterizes a rational intuition as an intellectual seeming that some proposition is necessarily, or possibly, true (Bealer 1998: 207–08). He contrasts intuitions with “judgments, guesses, and hunches” (1998: 210–11), common sense, belief, and even an inclination to believe (1998: 208–09). The following example shows how something may seem true to someone even though he does not believe it, and how someone can believe something that does not seem true to him.

Monty Hall was the host of the game show “Let's Make a Deal”. Contestants would choose one of three doors and behind one of them was a big prize; behind the others, some worthless joke prize (say, a hundred boxes of tissue to dry their tears). Monty would open one of the doors with a joke prize behind it and then ask the contestant whether he wanted to stick with the door he had chosen or switch to the other unopened door. It can be shown that the probability that the contestant will win the big prize if he switches is 2/3, but only 1/3 if he sticks. But it seems to many that the probability of his winning is 1/2 regardless of whether he sticks or switches since there are only two unopened doors left. Call that “seeming” an intuition. For some people, it still seems that the probability is 1/2 even when they do not believe that it is, say, because they have proven for themselves that the probability of winning by switching is 2/3 or because they trust the reliable testimony of someone who has. This example shows that someone can have an intuition that a proposition is true, but not believe it, and conversely, can believe some proposition (namely, that the probability is not 1/2) without having the corresponding intuition (see Russell 2010: 464, for the Monty Hall example). Another example from Brian Weatherson shows that a person may believe something that is even necessarily true where she does not have any intuition that it is true. She might believe, on the basis of calculation, that 643 × 721 = 463,603 yet have no intuition that it's true (Weatherson 2003: 3).

Intuitions are non-inferential in that they are not the conclusion of some piece of reasoning. Like sensations, they must be occurrent but unlike beliefs, which need not be. You can have a belief that P while not considering P, but you can't have an intuition that P while not considering P.

Bealer distinguishes between rational or intellectual intuitions on the one hand and physical intuitions on the other, saying that a person could have a physical, but not an intellectual, intuition that (7b): A house undermined will fall (Bealer 1992: 102). (I take it that physical intuitions are of propositions about a physical event, state of affairs, or object.) Presumably, he would say that a person could have an intellectual intuition that (7a): A house is an abode for living. What makes physical and intellectual intuitions, intuitions, for Bealer, and what distinguishes them? Well, intuitions regarding both (7b) and (7a) are noninferential, occurrent seemings, and both propositions seem obviously true. According to Bealer, what distinguishes intellectual from other intuitions is that intellectual intuitions are modal: the propositions that are their objects seem possibly, or necessarily, true. (Recall that BonJour required this of apparent rational insights.) For those who do not think that intuitions must have as their objects propositions about what is possibly, or necessarily, true, they might distinguish intuitions from hunches in that intuitions are necessarily a product of a person's understanding a proposition while hunches and guesses are not.

Must intellectual intuitions be modal? Couldn't it just seem that each of (1a)–(14a) are true without their seeming necessarily true? In a footnote, even BonJour allows that there could be an unsophisticated person who lacks the concept of necessity who accepts some proposition because it seems overwhelmingly obvious, not because it is seems necessarily true. According to BonJour, this person would have an intuition that the proposition is true, and that intuition would provide evidence if it were a response to what is in fact “the apparent necessity of the proposition”, (BonJour 1998: 114, note 23; Russell 2010: 465). There are lots of thought experiments in philosophy that are intended to evoke intuitions, even in people who do possess the concept of necessity, that some proposition is true, not that it is necessarily true. Bealer himself offers an example that I will call Sheep (Bealer 1992: 3–4; no doubt based on Roderick Chisholm's example in Chisholm 1989: 93). In the example, you are driving on a country road and spot some animals in a nearby field that look just like sheep. However, they are really poodles bred and clipped to look like sheep by the jokester farmer who owns them. On the basis of seeing these animals, you form the belief that there are sheep in the field. As it turns out, there are—lying down, out of sight, behind some large boulders in the far corner of the field. So you have a justified true belief that there are sheep in the field, justified because you are justified in believing that: (a) the creatures you are looking at are sheep, (b) if they are sheep, then there are sheep in the field, and that (c) there are sheep in the field follows from (a) and (b). However, most people when considering this example have the intuition that (d) you do not know that there are sheep in the field. The intuition is not (d*) = necessarily, in these circumstances you do not know that there are sheep in the field, even if (d*) is true. (Of course, some may have the intuition that, in the situation, you couldn't know that there are sheep in the field, but people need not have that modal intuition.) There are many others examples in epistemology and ethics like Sheep in that they evoke some intuition that P, not an intuition that necessarily, P.

Further, Albert Casullo has argued that if intellectual intuitions are distinguished by their modal status, there is no guarantee that those intuitions do not come from an experiential source (2012b: 237–238). Perhaps Casullo is thinking that someone might have the intuition that necessarily, water is H2O = (8biii) or (less likely) that necessarily, rubies are Al2O3 = (8bi), where such an intuition would have an empirical or a posteriori source. So there is no guarantee that intuitions so understood provide a priori justification insofar as that sort of justification must derive from some nonexperiential source.

An alternative way of distinguishing intellectual from physical intuitions is to hold that intellectual intuitions must be based solely on the understanding while physical intuitions cannot be (see above, sec. 3). On this account, if a person is a priori justified in believing (1a)–(14a) it is because she understands what those propositions mean, that understanding is the basis of her intuition that they are true, and that intuition is the a priori justification for her believing that they are true. In the case of the physical intuition that a house undermined will fall, that intuition is not based solely on the person's understanding what the proposition means and so her intuitive belief that it is true is not a priori justified.

It might be thought that this way of characterizing intellectual intuition, and thereby a priori justification, implies that only analytic statements can be justified a priori, where an analytic sentence is one that can be changed so that it expresses a logical truth by substituting synonyms for relevant terms or expressions (see above, sec. 2). But in a broad sense propositions like “no object can be red and green all over at the same time” are true “in virtue of their meaning”, even if they are not analytic (they're synthetic). You cannot substitute synonyms for relevant terms in “no object can be red and green all over at the same time” and derive a proposition whose form is some logical truth, say, a logical truth of the form A = A. But to fully understand the proposition you have to understand not only the concepts involved but also their relationship. So, for instance, you need to understand what happiness is and what it is for something to be an intrinsic good, and the relationship between happiness and intrinsic goodness, to fully understand (12a): Happiness is an intrinsic good. Similar remarks apply to (5a), the proposition about no object's being red and green all over at the same time, and (6a), the proposition about “taller than”.

Perhaps part of the justification for believing “no object can be red and green all over at the same time” is that no one has been able to think of a counterexample to it, that is, an example that shows it to be false. Maybe the best explanation of those failures is that the proposition is necessarily true and that is why we are justified in believing the red-green proposition. That sort of justification would not be based on intuition. However, Gilbert Harman has said that the best explanation of our failure to find a counterexample to some proposition may be due to our limited imaginations (Harman 2001). So it seems problematic whether there is some non-intuitional source of the justification of the red-green proposition.

Harman even thinks that there are counterexamples to that proposition (Harman 2001), in which case there would not be a lack of counterexamples and so nothing to explain. Harman gives examples of how an object could look red all over from one angle and green all over from a slightly different angle, or red all over to one eye but green all over to the other. But the relation between looking red or green and being red or green is complex. These examples do not show that an object could be red all over and green all over at the same time. Perhaps the thing to say about these examples is that the object is neither red all over nor green all over at the same time. Hence it is not both red and green all over at the same time and so does not contradict (5a).

That it just seems obvious that no object could be red and green all over at the same time is an intellectual intuition that provides some justification for believing that proposition. That is compatible with there also being other grounds for believing it true.

The most promising account of a priori justification in terms of a nonexperiential source of evidence is one that sees intellectual intuition, rational insight, or apparent rational insight, as providing the relevant a priori evidence with its source being reason, not some special faculty of intuition analogous, say, to sight, which is a source of empirical evidence. One function of reason involves “seeing” how evidence supports a conclusion, and in deductive reasoning, “seeing” how conclusions follow from premises. This same ability is exercised when reason “sees” that some proposition is true, or necessarily true, simply in virtue of the person's understanding the proposition. However, this intellectual “seeing” need not have qualia associated with it, unlike perceptual seeing, which does. Apparent rational insights need not be accompanied by appearances, if “appearances” necessarily involve qualia. The metaphor of “seeing” logical connections or that certain propositions are true should not mislead us into thinking that there is a special, quasi-perceptual faculty along with sight, touch, hearing, etc. Reason can “grasp” and “see” without there being any analogue to having certain feelings or having visual sensations.

6. A priori justification as not resting on any nonexperiential source of evidence

Recently some philosophers have thought that a person can be justified in believing, or accepting, a proposition without having any evidence to support it, and so even if there is no nonexperiential source of evidence for that belief, or acceptance. Timothy Williamson has argued that certain acquired skills can provide justification for believing a proposition for which the person does not have evidence. For instance, a person might be justified in believing that two marks nine inches apart are further apart than the front and back legs of an ant, even though he is not now looking at an ant, and so lacks visual evidence to support his belief (Willamson 2007b: 166–67; cited in Casullo 2012c: 312–18). The proposal is that it is his skill at making comparisons of length, not his evidence, that supports his judgment.

Even if true, it seems that we can distinguish empirically based from understanding based skills. A person's skill at making comparisons of length is empirically based while his skill at judging, say, that in Sheep you do not know that there are sheep in the field is based in his understanding the concept “knowledge”. So even if the exercise of relevant skills can provide justification apart from evidence, it still allows for a way to distinguish a priori from a posteriori (empirical) justification, provided the intellectual skill that involves understanding is founded on no more than “enabling” experiences (see above, sec. 4).

Another view that rejects the idea that a justified belief must be founded on evidence says that all of our beliefs are prima facie justified so all of them are what one might call “default reasonable”, that is, justified barring reasons to reject them (this is what Gilbert Harman (2001) calls “general foundationalism”). On some accounts of a priori justification, namely those that hold that a priori justification is justification independent of empirical evidence, general foundationalism would imply that all of a person's beliefs are prima facie (or weakly) a priori justified since that justification would stem merely from the fact that the person believes them, not from any empirical evidence that supports them. On this view, and contrary to initial appearances, there is really no difference in the way the propositions at the start of this essay are prima facie justified since they are all weakly a priori justified if you accept them. If some are all things considered less justified than others, it is because of the relationships between them. Coherence considerations account for all things considered justification and are what upsets initially equal prima facie justification. Further, this view has the implication that you could be prima facie justified in believing extremely bizarre propositions, say, beliefs about what happens on the planet Gliese 581d (Russell 2012: 100), even though you have no empirical or testimonial evidence to support your beliefs about this alien planet. (You may, but need not, also believe that the Gliesians are in touch with you (but not others) via telepathy because you are “the chosen one”.). Insofar as you have no defeating evidence, you could even be all things considered justified in believing all those things about the Glieseans, despite having no evidence to support your beliefs.

Hartry Field also holds that belief in certain propositions can be “default reasonable”, that is, justified but not on the basis of evidence. He seems to think that if a belief's being “default reasonable” were sufficient for its being a priori justified, too many beliefs would count as being a priori justified. That's because he thinks, for example, that “People usually tell the truth” is default reasonable but not a priori justified. So he adds the requirement that an a priori justified belief cannot be empirically defeasible (Field 2000: 119–20; cited in Casullo 2012c: 318–20). But that requirement seems too stringent. Suppose I have an intuition that, necessarily, if P, then Q for some specific P and Q (say, that necessarily, if a person has a justified true belief, he has knowledge). Then it is possible for me to be a priori justified in believing that conditional is true. However, if I think of a possible example where P obtains but Q does not, that a priori justification will be defeated. But an actual example known empirically to obtain of a P that is not a Q is a possible example. (A student once described such an example to me. She did not want her mother to know she had gotten a tattoo. So she threw away the receipt. But her mom found her boyfriend's receipt with no name on it in the glove compartment of her car and, on that good evidence, concluded that she had gotten a tattoo! Her mom had a justified true belief, but not knowledge, that my student had gotten a tattoo.) So actual examples known empirically to obtain can defeat a priori justification.

Further, I might be a priori justified in believing the conclusion of some mathematical proof I have constructed, but that justification can be defeated by the testimony of excellent mathematicians who tell me that the proof is unsound. Since testimony is an empirical source, this is another example of how a priori justification can be defeated by empirical evidence. (Thanks to an anonymous referee for suggesting this example to me.) It is a mistake to think that a priori justification cannot be empirically defeasible. Of course, if Field allows that a priori justification can be empirically defeated, he faces the same problem as Harman in drawing the boundaries of a priori justification too broadly.

A final attempt at offering a view of a priori justification that does not rest on nonexperiential evidence holds that we are entitled to accept certain propositions on no evidence and that entitlement on no grounds (evidence) is what a priori justification amounts to. To be entitled to accept, or trust, some presupposition is for it to be rational to accept or trust it, though this is supposed to be different from being justified in believing it. Crispin Wright proposes that the laws of logic and the presupposition that I am not now in the midst of a coherent and continuing dream, not now a brain-in-a vat, etc., are rational presuppositions. That's because certain “cognitive projects” (i) could not be pursued without presupposing those things, (ii) there is no evidence to think that those presuppositions are false (even if also none to think them true), and (iii) nothing will be lost, and something may be gained, by accepting these presuppositions (so dominance considerations recommend accepting them) (see Jenkins 2006). Of course, the gains and losses must not be pragmatic gains and losses (gains and losses in happiness, prestige, accomplishments, wealth and the like). Otherwise all that would follow is that it is practically rational to accept the presuppositions. The gains and losses must be epistemic (say, having to do with truth, or probable truth, or with evidence), for Wright wants the rational acceptance of such presuppositions to be an answer to the skeptic.

But even if we accept that the gains and losses must be epistemic, there seem to be counterexamples to Wright's view. Given (i)–(iii) above, Wright should count the view that there are no miracles as a rational presupposition of science because (i) science could not be pursued if it assumed that some phenomena might have supernatural causes (then why continue to look for natural causes instead of positing some supernatural cause of some phenomena?), (ii) there is no evidence to think that there are miracles (people being deceived, or deceiving others, is at least as good an explanation of apparent miracles, as Hume proposed), and (iii) nothing may be lost, and something gained, by making this presupposition (scientists will continue to look for natural causes and thereby find some they would otherwise not have found if they assumed that there could be supernatural causes). But even if within the cognitive project of science we are entitled to accept that there are no miracles, it does not seem that we are entitled a priori to accept it. Any such entitlement would seem to rest on inductive grounds: in the past, phenomena have been capable of being explained without invoking God or any other spiritual or immaterial beings as causes. So probably in the future they will be explained in naturalistic terms, too.

Counterexamples aside, some have questioned whether the project-relative rationality of a presupposition (determined by the epistemic value of the consequences of accepting it) is enough to make it rational to accept that presupposition (Jenkins 2006). For instance, when conducting certain inquiries, it might be rational relative to some project or kind of inquiry to accept that the world is a pretty orderly place, yet not epistemically rational to accept the presupposition itself (maybe we should suspend judgment about that until we go look at the world). This objection parallels a standard objection to rule egoism in the practical realm in which critics point out that it may be in a person's rational self-interest to accept a set of rules (analogues to Wright's presuppositions) for action but not in her rational self-interest always to act in accordance with some rule in that set (the analogue to its not always being rational to believe in accordance with those presuppositions).

Sometimes Wright does not seem to appeal to a dominance argument to make his case that it is rational to accept a presupposition. Sometimes it seems that the answer for Wright will depend on whether that presupposition rests on “more secure” presuppositions or not (Wright 2004a: 192; cited in Casullo 2012c: 321–22). But that seems to allow a presupposition based on a whim that does not rest on any more secure presuppositions could be justified, and even a priori justified.

In summary, it seems that accounts of a priori justification that do not hold that it rests on evidence provided by a nonexperiental source are in danger of counting certain beliefs or acceptances as a priori justified that, intuitively, do not seem to be. They are in danger of drawing the circle of a priori justification too broadly to include propositions that are “default reasonable” (Harman) or are presuppositions of science (Wright) that may be justified but do not seem to be a priori justified. The attempt by Field to narrow the circle rests on a false assumption, namely, that a priori justification cannot be defeated by empirical evidence.

Since a correct account of intuition can explain why we are justified in accepting the laws of logic (and, I'd add, of induction and inference to the best explanation), these cases do not represent problems for rational intuitionism. It's true that rational intuitionism cannot explain why we are a priori justified in accepting the proposition that we are not now in the midst of a persistent coherent dream or in accepting that there are no miracles, but that is not a problem. We can be a posteriori justified in believing these things even if we are not a priori justified in accepting them.

I will now turn to considerations that seem to count for the view that intellectual intuitions are evidence for the propositions that are their objects.

7. Why we should think that intellectual intuitions provide evidence for the propositions that are their objects

There are four arguments for the view that intuitions can provide evidence. The first argument sounds circular because it starts with examples like Sheep and claims that it is intuitively obvious that the intuition that the person does not know there are sheep in the field is evidence that he does not know. Here a second-order intuition about the evidential weight of first-order intuitions is invoked. This approach goes on to defend the appeal to intuitions on the grounds that according to our standard justificatory practice intuitions as well as experiences (visual, tactile, auditory, olfactory, taste) provide evidence. It then challenges those who want to eliminate intuitions as a basic source of evidence to say why this is legitimate but, say, eliminating all but visual experiences as basic sources of evidence is not (Bealer 1996a,b, 1998, 1999).

The second sort of argument rests on the idea of concept possession (Bealer 1999: 255–65). The basic idea is that if a person possesses a concept (or, perhaps, possesses it under certain ideal conditions and in a certain “determinate” way (Bealer 1999: 256)), then her intuitive judgments of actual, or hypothetical, cases where the concept is in play will be reliable, that is, for the most part will be true. For instance, if a person adequately grasps the concept “knowledge”, then, for the most part, her intuitive judgments about whether a person knows, or does not know, in various scenarios will be correct. Concept possession guarantees the reliability of concrete case intuitions. A person would not possess the concept of a square if he often applied the term to circles and ovals or did not apply it to squares whose sides were over three hundred feet long. In general, to have the concept of an X, a person must be reliable (though not infallible) in his application of the term X to, and only to, things that are X. (Bealer 1996b: 7, 11–12, 18 and 1999: 246 and Peacocke 2000 both appeal to concept possession to justify the evidential force of rational intuitions).

However, even if concept possession requires reliability, this does not show that concept possession guarantees justification since reliability does not. There are lots of cases where, intuitively, reliability is not sufficient for justification. Keith Lehrer's famous Truetemp case is one of them (Lehrer 1990: 163–64; 1996: 32–33), as is BonJour's case of Norman (BonJour 1985: 41–45) who has reliable clairvoyant powers but no confirmation of their reliability. On the basis of his first clairvoyant experience, Norman finds that he cannot help believing something (say, that the President is in New York), but, intuitively, he is not justified, and does not know, what he can't help believing. This example shows that reliability by itself is not sufficient for either justification or knowledge. So there is no reason to think that even if concept possession guarantees reliability, it guarantees justification. George Bealer thinks that a certain sort of concept possession (what he calls determinate possession) guarantees necessary reliability, and that, in turn, does guarantee justification. (Hence his view is called “modal reliabilism”.) Bealer thinks that the following is false: necessarily, if your belief is the result of a reliable belief producing mechanism (or process), you are justified in holding it. However, he thinks the following is true: if your belief is the result of a necessarily reliable mechanism (or process), you are justified in holding it. In addition, he thinks that a certain sort of concept possession necessarily makes our judgments about the applicability of concepts to concrete cases reliable.

A third attempt to show that intuitions provide evidence relies on what we might call an outside source of evidence. We might rely on the standard five senses to confirm the reliability of some sixth sense (say, echo-location), and then later rely on that sixth sense alone to provide justification. Similarly, suppose the best explanation of my failures, and the failures of others, to find counterexamples to propositions that seem intuitively obvious is that those propositions are necessary truths. That could give me reason to believe that having an intuition that P is good evidence that P is necessarily true. In turn, that could justify me in later relying on intuition alone to provide justification for the proposition that is its object.

A fourth approach offers ideal conditions under which rational insights, or intellectual intuitions, provide evidence (requiring ideal conditions is not unique to this approach as Bealer 1996b and 1999 and Peacocke 2000 also require them in their defense of intuition based on concept possession). BonJour argues that a priori justification that rests on rational intuitions, or insights, does not require what he calls a metajustification for those intuitions to provide justification, that is, does not require reasons, or an argument, to show that beliefs based on those intuitions are likely to be true. In this respect, intuition is like introspection and unlike perception, premonitions about the future, and clairvoyance (if it exists). BonJour seems to think that a principle something like the following is true: (J) if S has a rational intuition, or insight, that necessarily p after (i) considering p with a reasonable degree of care (which includes a clear and careful understanding of p), (ii) having at least “an approximate understanding of the concept of logical or metaphysical necessity” (BonJour 1998: 127 and 114), and (iii) S is neither dogmatic nor biased regarding p (BonJour 1998: sec. 5.3, 133–37), then S's rational insight that p makes p likely to be true. Here (though not elsewhere) he seems to assume that beliefs that are likely to be true are justified, so (J) implies that subjects that meet the conditions specified in its antecedent are justified in believing p. Given BonJour's objections to reliability as being sufficient for justification, he probably means that a belief that satisfies conditions (i)–(iii) is epistemically likely to be true, where that sort of likelihood does not imply objective likelihood and can be present even in demon and Matrix worlds.

However, BonJour does not believe that a person must be justified in believing (J) (or some similar principle) in order to be justified in believing some proposition on the basis of an intuition that, as a matter of fact, satisfies conditions (i)–(iii). He seems to think that if (J) could be justified, it would be either by empirical evidence or by intuition. If empirically justified, he thinks that rational intuition would not then provide a priori evidence. On the other hand, justification by intuition would be circular since (J) is supposed to give the conditions for intuitive justification. So it seems that there is no way to justify a principle that states the conditions sufficient for a priori justification: an attempt at empirical justification would turn rational intuitions into empirical evidence and an attempt at intuitive justification would be circular. So if justification via rational intuitions is possible, it cannot require a metajustification of some principle like (J). Still, according to BonJour, if (J) is in fact true and rational intuitions satisfy the antecedent conditions of it, they will provide a priori justification.

Given the above discussion of the “outside source” approach, BonJour seems mistaken in thinking that an empirical justification of (J) would mean that intuitions at most provide empirical evidence. After all, (J)'s truth is not affected by any sort of justification, and it is a statement of when intuitions provide a priori justification. All that an empirical justification will provide are reasons to think (J) true, not reason to think intuitions do not provide a priori justification. Of course, if you thought that empirical justification presupposes a priori justification, and that that sort of justification presupposes (J), there could be no non-circular justification of (J).

8. Should we doubt the evidential force of intellectual intuitions?

8.1 What is an intuition?

If by “intuition” we mean “the mental state in which some proposition seems true to someone but not on the basis of any inference”, then there will be no reason to think that an intuition always provides evidence for the proposition that is its object. It might seem obviously true to me that I am going to win the next lottery or that there are more females than males on Gliese 581d, where that seeming is not the result of some inference. That “intuition” would provide no evidence that I am going to win or that what I believe about Gliese 581d is true. But the best way to understand “intuition”, if we are looking for a meaning that implies that intuitions always provide some evidence for the propositions that are their objects, is to mean by “intuition”: the mental state in which some proposition seems true to someone, not on the basis of any inference, but solely on the basis of his understanding that proposition. (Several philosophers appeal to the understanding in their accounts of a priori justification: Bealer in all his essays; BonJour 1998; Jackson 2000; Peacocke 2000.)

But suppose there were someone with an unusual psychology such that whenever he understood a certain contingent proposition, such as “there are more females than males on Gliese 581d”, it would immediately seem true to him. Then he would have a non-inferential belief in that proposition based solely on his understanding it, and so on this account would have an intuition, and be justified in believing, that it is true. To meet this objection we might have to return to Bealer's and BonJour's idea that the objects of intuitions must be modal propositions, but modify it to say that they must either be propositions of the form possibly P, necessarily, P, or P itself, provided that person would have the intuition that necessarily, P if she fully understood P, possessed the concept of necessity and carefully considered whether “necessarily P” is true. So there can be an intuition in Sheep that the observer does not know that there are sheep in the field, provided the person who has that intuition would have an intuition regarding the corresponding modal proposition, “necessarily, in the circumstances the observer does not know that there are sheep in the field”, if she fully understood the non-modal part of that proposition, possessed the concept of necessity, and carefully considered whether the relevant modal proposition is true. However, a person who possessed the concept of necessity could not have an intuition regarding the corresponding modal proposition about Gliesians, “necessarily, there are more females than males on Gliese 581d” simply on the basis of fully understanding the non-modal part of that proposition and the modal proposition itself.

An alternative defense of the evidential force of intellectual intuitions would say that when a person is a priori justified in believing some proposition it is because she possesses the relevant concepts expressed in that proposition. Possessing those concepts, and understanding the proposition that contains them, explains why the person is justified in accepting that proposition even if it does not cause them to hold it. The concept possession, or understanding, of the person with the odd psychology who believes contingent propositions once he understands what they are asserting may cause him to believe those propositions, but it does not explain why he is justified in believing them. Strictly speaking, a person's acceptance of some proposition is based solely on her understanding it only if that understanding both causes and justifies her accepting that proposition. Hence, strictly speaking, the beliefs or acceptances of the person with the odd psychology would not be based solely on his understanding.

8.2 Experimental philosophy

A new branch of philosophy called experimental philosophy (X-phi for short) has studied the intuitive judgments of people (often students) when presented with well-known examples in epistemology and ethics. They ask these people (often from different ethnic, cultural, economic, and educational backgrounds) whether someone in a hypothetical scenario knows, or only believes, that some proposition is true, say, in Sheep whether the person knows, or only believes, that there are sheep in the field. In ethics they may present the subjects with a case and ask them if it is wrong, or not wrong, to do what is described. In a case often called Transplant, five innocent people are desperately in need of certain vital organs, and the only way to save them is to cut up some innocent person and distribute his organs to the five (transplant surgery has been perfected and our potential donor is a perfect match to all five). Experimental philosophers will ask their subjects whether it is wrong, or not wrong, to cut up the one to save the five, and then record their intuitive judgments. In another case often called Trolley, a runaway trolley is on track A and headed for five innocent people who are trapped on that track. All person S can do to avoid this is to turn the trolley down track B where one innocent person is trapped. If S does nothing, five will die; if he throws the switch via a remote device, the one on track B will be killed. Experimental philosophers ask whether it would be wrong, or not wrong, for S to throw the switch. They record the data, which they take to be intuitive judgments on the cases, and note differences in the responses, say, between different ethnic or economic groups.

There is a danger that what the experimenters mean by “intuition” and “an intuitive judgment” appeals to the broad, commonsense understanding of the term “intuition” given above (sec. 8.1, first sentence), not to the narrower sense which requires that intuitions be based solely on understanding the proposition at issue (cf., Bealer 1998: 213 for this objection). If that is true, then people who draw conclusions about the evidential force of “intuitions” on the basis of these experiments may be guilty of talking past the epistemologists. Maybe the intuitions that are studied by experimental philosophers do not provide evidence but intuitions understood as being based solely on the understanding do (see sec. 5 and 8.1, above).

Some of the experiments seem to show that there are differences in “intuitions” (in some sense) for cases in both epistemology and ethics that depend on differences in a person's ethnic, cultural, economic, or educational background. So how could intuition be a source of evidence given that there is so much disagreement in intuitions and no way to discount some and privilege others? Suppose we had the ability to see clouds in the sky but nothing else, nothing on earth and nothing solid in the sky. Suppose, also, that people reported “seeing” different shapes in the clouds. Wouldn't we then have reason to think that “skysight” does not provide evidence of the shapes of clouds? Of course, the answer to that question depends on what is the best explanation of the disagreement. Perhaps different people are looking at the clouds from different angles, some have impaired “skyvision” while others do not, some have a stake in the clouds looking a certain way while others have no stake or a stake in their looking a different way, and so on. Similar sorts of consideration need to be looked at when it comes to the differing intuitions observed by experimental philosophers. We need to know what the best explanation of the disagreements is before concluding anything about the evidential status of intuitions.

Suppose we grant for the sake of argument that experimental philosophers have observed disagreement in intuitions in the relevant sense, that is, where an intuition is understood to be an intellectual seeming founded solely on the understanding of concepts. Before concluding that intuitions cannot provide evidence, we must ask why they disagree. In so-called Truetemp cases, a person is able to correctly tell the ambient temperature because, unbeknownst to him, his brain has been affected by a blow to the head. More Westerners than East Asians (Korean, Japanese, Chinese) judge that the person knows what the temperature is. But do they make different background assumptions? Do more Westerners than East Asians assume that the person has confirmed his ability to correctly tell the temperature? If so, there may not be a fundamental difference in their intuitions because the members of the two groups of subjects will not be considering precisely the same case. Until we investigate further into whether different background assumptions are being made, we should suspend judgment about what to conclude from the different responses.

Or perhaps when the intuitions of different groups differ, they may be appealing to different concepts even though the same word (say, “knows”) is being read by the different groups when they read the experimental scenarios. Further, insofar as “intuitions” are understood to rest solely on the understanding of the relevant epistemic proposition, the depth, or degree, of understanding can vary across individuals and cultures, and this could account for differing intuitions. This difference can remain even when subjects are first screened to make sure that they have at least minimal competence with the relevant concept (say, of knowledge). Until there is some reason to think that the differences in intuition are not the result of people employing different concepts and are not due to different levels of understanding of the concepts, the experimental philosophers should suspend judgment on whether intuitions, properly understood, can provide evidence.

The crucial role of the understanding in grounding intuitions, when properly understood, might make one think that the only relevant data regarding different intuitions are different intuitions among professional philosophers who probably share equally high levels of understanding of the concepts. Of course, if differences were found here it might be because some of these philosophers have a vested interest in defending a view that to others has counterintuitive implications. On the other hand, if few differences were found, this might be due to the education of graduate students and the culture of professional philosophy. Perhaps graduate students are taught that certain Gettier cases defeat the justified true belief account of knowledge and, for the most part, students with contrary intuitions do not make it through graduate school! Perhaps a person's colleagues look down upon, or dismiss, someone who does not share intuitions that are widespread in the discipline. Insofar as there are several competing explanations for disagreement in intuitions (properly understood), and one is not obviously better than the others, we should suspend judgment about the evidential weight of intuitions, just as we should suspend judgment on whether a coyote or a dog has left certain paw prints in an area where it is not known whether it's more likely to be dog than coyote paw prints or vice versa. Kornblith (2010, 2013) has argued that we should suspend judgment on most philosophical questions given the widespread disagreement among “epistemic peers” on these questions. Goldberg (2013) agrees but has argued that a philosopher who knows there are “epistemic peers” on the opposite side of an issue can still appropriately adopt an attitude of regarding her own view as defensible because that attitude does not imply that the person believes her view is correct.

Some initial differences in intuitions (e.g., due to differences in economic class) have not been replicated in later experiments. Other differences have been found to obtain only when two or more cases are considered together but not when considered separately. Some experiments have been criticized because they were poorly designed, not allowing researchers to determine whether it was one factor (the possibility of error) or another (the practical benefits or harms = the stakes) that accounted for different judgments. Different results have been observed depending on whether the subjects were asked, “Does the person know or does he not know” rather than, “Does the person really know or only believe?” But even if experimental design is improved, and results that show difference in judgments between different groups are replicated, it will not follow that intuitions are not evidence. Whether the data support the view that intuitions provide evidence, or support the opposite, depends on what the best explanation of those differences is. (I am indebted to Beebe (2012) for updating me on the current state of experimental philosophy. His essay also raises some of the same objections and problems that I discuss here.)

And if the data collected only concerns intuitions understood in a loose, commonsensical way, then the conclusions reached will not be relevant to the epistemic claim that intuitions, properly understood, have evidential weight, at least when they are the intuitions of people with a deep understanding of the relevant concepts where those people are not influenced by bias and prejudice (that is, where the intuitions are produced under ideal conditions).

8.3 Naturalized epistemology

There are other objections to the reliance on intuitions in philosophy that do not call into question their reliability. They call into question their relevance. We have seen that Casullo proposes to treat “experience” as a natural kind term, and Hilary Kornblith and Philip Kitcher propose to treat epistemic terms such as “knowledge” and “justification” in that way. Kornblith thinks that intuitions can help direct us to the appropriate objects, or phenomena, of investigation but not much more. For instance, we have an intuition that knowledge is not a type of furniture so we should not start our empirical investigation into the essential nature of knowledge by looking at furniture (Kornblith 1998, 2005, 2006). Kitcher relies heavily on the example, “Acids contain oxygen”, to conclude that we cannot have any a priori knowledge since we cannot have a priori knowledge of that proposition (Kitcher 1983: 82–85). Of course, “acid” is a natural kind term, and we cannot have a priori knowledge of the essential nature of that to which a natural kind term refers. So the fact that we cannot have a priori knowledge of propositions that contain natural kind terms is no reason to think that we cannot have a priori knowledge, period.

The problem with this empirical approach to philosophy is that the terms that philosophy is interested in do not seem to be natural kind terms (Feldman 1999: 176–80). What I called The Problem of Possible and Unwelcome Big Surprises (the PUBS problem, sec. 3, above) applies here, too, where the concepts to be investigated include those of justification, evidence, and knowledge. With a natural kind term like “water”, the properties commonly associated with it (clear, odorless, colorless, thirst-quenching, etc.) fix the reference of “water” but are not essential properties of it. However, the properties relevant to knowledge are part of the essence of knowledge (e.g., being justified, believed, and true). Similar remarks apply to other terms that have been of interest to philosophers: “causality”, “personal identity”, “justice”, “being morally responsible”, “acting freely”, etc.

8.4 Pragmatism

Another approach that discounts the role of intuitions in philosophy, especially in epistemology, is pragmatic. The idea is to first determine what epistemic goals we want principles to serve, and then to discover empirically which epistemic principles, if adhered to, will best serve those goals (Weinberg 2006). For instance, your goal might be to have lots of true beliefs or, alternatively, to have few false ones. Or your goal might be to have beliefs that make you happy. Probably the best set of rules to follow to obtain lots of true beliefs will be different from, and more lenient than, the best set of rules to follow to avoid having false beliefs, and it is probable that those sets of rules will be different from the set of rules you should adopt if you are interested in having beliefs that make you happy. It's reasonable to think that intuitions will have to be appealed to in determining what the appropriate epistemic goal is, and it is probably different from any of the three just considered. For instance, Lehrer (1986: 6–7) holds that the appropriate epistemic goal for any proposition, P, a person is considering is to believe P, if and only if, it is true. Intuition must be relied on to determine that the goal of making a person happy is epistemically irrelevant, that is, that a belief cannot be epistemically justified simply because a person's holding it makes him happy. It also seems counterintuitive to think that the appropriate epistemic goal is to have few false beliefs, for that goal could be satisfied by believing only obvious and trivial truths such as 1 + 1 = 2; that you exist; that your name is such-and-such; and so on. It's just as counterintuitive to think that the appropriate epistemic goal is to have many true beliefs, for that goal could be satisfied by memorizing all the phone numbers of people in the phone book. The pragmatic approach that I have sketched seems doomed at the outset: it cannot avoid appealing to intuitions in order to determine what the appropriate epistemic goal is.

Another problem that faces the pragmatic approach is that whether we are empirically justified in believing some epistemic principle, P1, (say, that you should believe a proposition for which you have the most confirming instances) serves the relevant epistemic goal, G1, (say, having many true beliefs) depends on whether some other epistemic principle, Q1, implies that we are (say, a principle that says that adherence to the epistemic principles you accept, like P1, are more likely to lead to truth if you have consulted a crystal ball and the crystal ball says that adherence to them is more likely to lead to truth). But what justifies us in believing that these other principles like Q1 are true? On the pragmatic approach, it must depend on whether adherence to them serves relevant epistemic goals (G1 or some other goals, G2, G3, etc.). Well, they either do or do not, but we want to know whether we arejustified in thinking they serve the relevant goals. That must be determined by some third set of epistemic principles, R1 (maybe R1 says that whether adherence to Q1 is likely to lead to truth depends on whether the reading of tea leaves says it will). At each step we must presuppose certain epistemic principles in order to assess whether we are justified in believing that certain lower level principles serve the relevant epistemic goals. We could bring this regress to a halt if we could appeal to epistemic intuitions to assess the presupposed principles, but the pragmatic approach disallows such an appeal.

8.5 Can intuitions be checked for accuracy?

A different sort of objection to intuitions as a source of a priori evidence assumes that a source of justification must be capable of being calibrated to determine whether it is accurate (Cummins 1998: 116–18). What we see through a telescope justifies us in believing that the moon has mountains because we have looked through telescopes at distant mountains on earth and then gone to them and discovered that the telescopes presented an accurate picture of the mountains. But what, the objection goes, can intuitions be checked against? Other intuitions? But that is like checking a crystal ball against itself.

BonJour has argued that many errors involving apparent rational insights (intuitions) can be corrected internally by further reflection, or by appealing to coherence (BonJour 1998: 116–19). Others have replied that neither perception nor memory (Goldman 2007: 5) can be checked either, except against themselves, but that does not prevent these sources from providing justification in certain circumstances.

In reply to this sort of response, critics of intuition-based views of a priori justification have said that at least different types of perception can be checked against each other, say, vision against touch (Weatherson 2003: 4). The critics of intuition add that while we can distinguish circumstances where, say, vision is unreliable (say, where the lighting conditions, or the person's eyesight, are bad; when we are in a desert where optical illusions occur; when we are hallucinating, etc.) from circumstances where it is not, nothing similar can be done when it is a matter of intuitions.

However, the latter does not seem true. I can tell when I do not have a very firm grasp of some concept (say, of poignancy), and sometimes I know that someone has thought about some concept as long and as hard as I have (is my epistemic peer), has intuitions opposed to mine, and I cannot explain his intuitions away. In those circumstances, the evidential weight of my intuitions is at least diminished and may be reduced to zero.

Someone might respond that this only shows that we can know under what conditions intuitions are not reliable, but we do not know under what conditions they are reliable. Sometimes we can check one sense modality against another. But suppose we could check a Ouija board against a crystal ball, and they always agreed. That need not give us reason to believe that either is a reliable source of truth. Perhaps some agent or force is causing the two sources to agree even though what they agree on is false; perhaps there is a common cause that explains the relevant agreement. Suppose, for instance, over a good stretch of time both sources agreed on what the weather has been like on Gliese 581d. I think we should suspend judgment about whether they are accurate in their weather reports if we do not have any sensory input that bears on the issue. So agreement between, say, vision and touch may not justify us in believing what they agree upon. Again, it depends on what the best explanation of agreement is whether it be agreement between the Ouija board and the crystal ball, sight and touch, or between the intuitions of different people.

Further, why should we accept the claim that a source of justification must be capable of being tested for its reliability? Even if we cannot test whether we are in The Matrix or some Cartesian demon world, it does not seem to matter as regards justification. Perhaps that is because justification is a matter of being epistemically responsible to the evidence (empirical or a priori), not a matter of reliability, though just what epistemic responsibility amounts to is a difficult question. Someone could even be epistemically responsible in believing what a Ouija board says if it had “a good track record”, that is, if in the past the beliefs it prescribed mostly turned out to be confirmed by perception and the best explanation of all that was that our five senses and the Ouija board enabled us to grasp the relevant truths.

Finally, it may be true that intuitions do not have as much evidential weight as perceptions. It seems that coherence considerations can override intuitions more easily than they can override perceptions. A person who initially has the intuition that someone who holds a losing ticket in a large lottery does not know that he does may justifiably give up that intuition on the basis of some theory of knowledge that implies that the person does know that he holds a losing ticket. However, someone who sees a humming bird or bumblebee fly should not give up his belief that he saw them fly just because some physical theory he accepts implies that these creatures cannot fly and so he could not have seen what he thinks he saw.

9. If intuitions can justify, can they justify propositions about the world?

Suppose, for the sake of argument, we grant that intuitions properly understood and had under ideal conditions by people with a deep understanding of the relevant concepts can justify certain propositions. But can they justify propositions that are about the world? Carrie Jenkins has argued that they can insofar as the concepts that play a role in a priori justification have been shaped by experience. She thinks that for knowledge (not justification) our concepts must be grounded. By this she means that they must accurately and non-accidentally represent the world. So the concept table can be grounded for a person in a world where there are tables but not for a brain-in-a-vat (BIV) (Jenkins 2008a: 128–29). For a concept to be justified for Jenkins is for it to be respectable for us to rely on it (by which, I believe, she means that we would be epistemically blameless in relying on it) as “a relevantly accurate guide to the world” (Jenkins 2008a: 129). So a BIV can have a justified, though not a grounded concept, about things existing in the external world.

Jenkins's argument for thinking our concepts are grounded is that our basic concepts are useful, but if they did not fit the world (weren't grounded) even though they are founded on sensory input, their usefulness would be a miracle. But since we should not believe in miracles, those concepts must fit the world. The best explanation of the usefulness of our concepts is that they accurately represent features of the world that produce our sensory inputs that allow us to navigate successfully in the world. She thinks that this No-Miracles Argument shows that it is reasonable to think that our concepts (or groups of concepts) mirror the world's structure (Jenkins 2008a: 139). If we have justified concepts, we can examine them to see what they involve and then have a priori justification for believing that certain propositions that involve them are true of the world. So, on her view, we (and BIVs) could be a priori justified in thinking, merely on the basis of examining our concepts, that all vixens are female and that there are (or at least were) vixens, and that all bachelors are unmarried and that there are (or at least were) bachelors. If we have grounded concepts, we (but not BIVs) can have a priori knowledge that all of these propositions are true.

Jenkins often appeals to an analogy with maps when discussing the accuracy of concepts. Accurate maps accurately represent the location of various things in the world and their location relative to each other (how they fit together). Accurate concepts represent how things are in the world and how they relate to each other (how they fit together). But maps do not represent how things are in every possible world (in some possible world San Francisco is not south of Seattle: think how the geological plates on which these cities rest might shift radically over time), but certain relationships between concepts represent how things are in every possible world (in every possible world bachelors are unmarried). Let's grant that “all crows are birds” contains concepts (all, crow, bird) that are grounded in our world. But how does such non-accidental accuracy in this world give us reason to think that “all crows are birds” is true in every possible world?

This-worldly grounding does not seem able to explain how we can have a priori justification and knowledge, and Jenkins's account of a priori justification and knowledge that is built on her notion of grounded concepts has the counterintuitive result that we can be a priori justified in believing, and can even know, things about the world (say, that vixens and bachelors exist or existed) simply on the basis of examining our concepts. It's more plausible to think that we have a priori justification for believing that if someone is a bachelor, he is unmarried (and if some animal is a vixen, it is female) and a posteriori (empirical) justification for thinking there are bachelors and vixens. Together these two propositions imply that all bachelors are unmarried (all vixens are female) and that there are bachelors (vixens). But since the justification of that conjunction rests in part on an empirical premise, its justification is empirical, not a priori. Further, we could know the relevant conditionals a priori even if we were BIVs, provided we adequately understood the concepts involved. We do not need to have accurate concepts, ones that fit how the world actually is, in order to have knowledge of the relevant conditionals. We could have conceptual knowledge founded on the relation of concepts regardless of whether the concepts were implanted in us by some scientists or supercomputers (as in the film The Matrix) or God, which shows that not even enabling experience is necessary for a priori knowledge (though it is compatible with it), let alone having grounded concepts (which require sensory inputs caused by things in the real world).

Further, there seem to be actual examples of propositions that are not founded on justified or grounded concepts that we can be a priori justified in believing and even know. Contrary to what Jenkins's view seems to imply, we can be a priori justified in believing, and even know, that “Ghosts are disembodied spiritual beings” even if we have no relevant sensory experience that would ground the concepts (namely, ghosts, disembodied, spiritual) involved in that proposition. She allows that some concepts can be grounded, even if they are not directly grounded, provided they are constituted by grounded concepts, but it is hard to see how “spiritual” could be so constituted.

A priori justification and knowledge of propositions of the form “All As are Bs” seem to be justification and knowledge of conditionals that have no existential import and are of the form, “If something is an A, then it's a B”. A priori justification and knowledge of propositions such as, “In Sheep, you don't know that there are sheep in the field”, don't imply that there are sheep, fields, etc. They might be best understood as claiming, “If there were a situation like the one described, you would not know that there are sheep in the field”.

If the propositions that are supposed to be the objects of a priori justification and knowledge are really counterfactual conditionals, then our justification for believing them could rest on empirical evidence (Williamson 2007b). We can be justified in believing, and even know, that if the earth stopped spinning half of it would be boiling hot and half freezing cold on the basis of knowing about what makes objects hot and cold, that the sun is hot, that the earth does not produce its own heat, etc., that is, on empirical grounds. On the view we are considering, we know that if someone is a bachelor, he is unmarried on similar empirical grounds because that conditional should really be understood as a counterfactual conditional of the form: if X were the case, then Y would be the case. That counterfactual conditional is true if, and only if, in the nearest possible world where the antecedent is true, so is the consequent. So we will be justified in believing “all bachelors are unmarried” just in case we are justified on empirical grounds in believing that in the nearest possible world where someone is a bachelor he is also unmarried.

The problem with this view is that, intuitively, “bachelors are unmarried” seems to be true only if it is true in every possible world, not just in nearby worlds, and the same goes for, “if we are in a situation like the one described in Sheep, we do not know that there are sheep in the field”.

10. What is a priori knowledge?

It is widely, though not universally, held that knowledge requires justified true belief. If so, it is plausible to understand a priori knowledge as knowledge founded on a priori justification, that is, as a priori justified true belief, plus some anti-luck conditions to handle Gettier cases. Whatever is the correct account of a priori justification could then be used to fill out the details of the account of a priori knowledge.

The chief rival to accounts of a priori knowledge that require a priori justification is knowledge reliabilism that holds that someone knows something if, and only if, they have a true belief that has been reliably produced, that is, produced by a cognitive mechanism, faculty, or process that, for the most part, yields true beliefs, and (some would add) that knowledge is not ultimately defeated by other considerations (there are no undefeated defeaters). Presumably, knowledge reliabilists would say that a person knows some proposition a priori insofar as he has a true belief, his belief that it is true has been produced solely by his understanding of the relevant concepts involved, that understanding is a reliable source of true beliefs, and that knowledge is not defeated by any undefeated defeaters. If there are problems with this reliabilist conception of knowledge, they are similar to the problems faced by reliabilist conceptions of justification.

One of those problems is that a person's beliefs can be formed by a reliable cognitive mechanism without that person's having any confirmation, or evidence, that that mechanism is reliable. Let Truenorth be a person who knows what direction is north, what south, what east, and what west even after being spun around several times with his eyes closed. Perhaps Truenorth has some internal compass like the ones found in migratory birds. However, assume that Truenorth has no reason to think that his beliefs about compass directions are accurate; he has never received confirmation of their accuracy, neither from the testimony of others or by checking things out himself. Nevertheless, he is confident that his beliefs about what is north, etc., are correct. Assume, also, that he has no reason to think that others in his society have, nor that they lack, his directional ability. In general, assume that there are no undefeated defeaters of Truenorth's beliefs about what is north, etc. Intuitively, it seems that if he believes that some direction he points to is north, he is not justified in believing, nor does he know, that it is north, even if what he believes is true. If this is a problem for reliabilists about empirical justification and knowledge, it is also a problem for reliabilists when it comes to a priori justification and knowledge.


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Other Internet Resources


I am indebted to my colleagues, Eric Hiddleston and Michael McKinsey, for their comments on my 2007 entry, and to my friends, Mylan Engel and Matthias Steup, for their extensive comments on this essay. I am also indebted to an anonymous referee who made many comments, suggestions, and corrections on an earlier draft of this essay. The input from all these people has improved this, and the previous entry, considerably.

Copyright © 2014 by
Bruce Russell <Bruce.Russell@wayne.edu>

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