First published Mon Dec 1, 1997; substantive revision Thu Oct 11, 2012

Colors are of philosophical interest for a number of reasons. One of the most important reasons is that color raises serious metaphysical issues, concerning the nature both of physical reality and of the mind. Among these issues are questions concerning whether color is part of a mind-independent reality, and what account we can give of experiences of color. These issues have been, and continue to be, inextricably linked with important epistemological and semantic issues.

1. The Philosophy of Color

In this section, we consider some central puzzles that arise from trying to fit colors into scientific accounts of the world.

1.1 A Problem with Color

The visual world, the world as we see it, is a world populated by colored objects. Typically, we see the world as having a rich tapestry of colors or colored forms—fields, mountains, oceans, hairstyles, clothing, fruit, plants, animals, buildings, and so on. Colors are important in both identifying objects, i.e., in locating them in space, and in re-identifying them. So much of our perception of physical things involves our identifying objects by their appearance, and colors are typically essential to an object's appearance, that any account of visual perception must contain some account of colors. Since visual perception is one of the most important species of perception and hence of our acquisition of knowledge of the physical world, and of our environment, including our own bodies, a theory of color is doubly important.

One of the major problems with color has to do with fitting what we seem to know about colors into what science, particularly physics, tells us about physical bodies and their qualities. It is this problem that historically has led the major physicists who have thought about color, to hold the view that physical objects do not actually have the colors we ordinarily and naturally take objects to possess. Oceans and skies are not blue in the way that we naively think, nor are apples red, (nor green). Colors of that kind, it is believed, have no place in the physical account of the world that has developed from the 16th Century to this century.

Not only does the scientific mainstream tradition conflict with the common-sense understanding of color in this way, but as well, the scientific tradition contains a very counter-intuitive conception of color. There is, to illustrate, the celebrated remark by David Hume:

Sounds, colors, heat and cold, according to modern philosophy are not qualities in objects, but perceptions in the mind. (Hume 1738/1911, Bk III, part I, Sect. 1, p. 177; Bk I, IV, IV, p. 216)

Physicists who have subscribed to this doctrine include the luminaries: Galileo, Boyle, Descartes, Newton, Young, Maxwell and Helmholtz. Maxwell, for example, wrote:

It seems almost a truism to say that color is a sensation; and yet Young, by honestly recognizing this elementary truth, established the first consistent theory of color. (Maxwell 1890/1970, p. 75)

This combination of eliminativism—the view that physical objects do not have colors, at least in a crucial sense—and subjectivism—the view that color is a subjective quality—is not merely of historical interest. It is held by many contemporary experts and authorities on color. S. K. Palmer, a leading psychologist and cognitive scientist, writes:

People universally believe that objects look colored because they are colored, just as we experience them. The sky looks blue because it is blue, grass looks green because it is green, and blood looks red because it is red. As surprising as it may seem, these beliefs are fundamentally mistaken. Neither objects nor lights are actually ‘colored’ in anything like the way we experience them. Rather, color is a psychological property of our visual experiences when we look at objects and lights, not a physical property of those objects or lights. The colors we see are based on physical properties of objects and lights that cause us to see them as colored, to be sure, but these physical properties are different in important ways from the colors we perceive. (Palmer 1999, p. 95)

Some other examples of experts who say similar things are S. Zeki (1983), E. H. Land (1983), and R. G. Kuehni (1997). We should note that these and other scientists vary between speaking of colors as sensations, psychological properties of visual experiences, mental properties, representations, constructions of the brain, and properties of the brain, so there are different brands of subjectivism.

Not all scientists express eliminativism explicitly, but many of the others tend to accept subjectivism. D. L. MacAdam, for example, is not untypical in writing that physiologists and psychologists use term ‘color’ “to denote sensation in the consciousness of a human observer” (MacAdam 1985, pp. 3–4). Moreover, it is common to find, in authoritative texts, definitions like: “Color attributes are attributes of visual sensations, e.g., hue, saturation and brightness”; “Hue: attribute of colour perception denoted by the terms yellow, red, blue, green and so forth”; “Brightness is the attribute of a visual sensation according to which a given visual stimulus appears to be more or less intense”.

1.2 Resistance to Eliminativism/Subjectivism

There has been a strong resistance among philosophers, both to the Eliminativist tendency within the scientific tradition, and the related subjectivism. One form this resistance takes reflects the fact that each component of this traditional view is very puzzling. A common response is to say that our color terms—red, blue, purple, orange, yellow, green, brown, etc.—are in order: we have paradigms of colors to which the color terms apply: ripe lemons are yellow, tomatoes and rubies are red, and so on. We have no trouble, by and large, in learning these terms and teaching them in ostensive practices to children and others. In the second place, it is hard to make sense of the claim that colors are properties of sensations or are psychological properties: if they are anything they are properties of objects and light sources—of peaches, and emeralds, of skies, of rainbows, of glasses of wine, of headlamps, and so on.

It should be noted, however, that things are more complex than the earlier remarks of Hume and Maxwell suggest. Descartes and Locke, for example, think that there are no colors in the physical world—no colors, as we ordinarily and naively understand them to be. But they are also widely interpreted as holding a secondary quality view of colors, i.e., holding the view that colors are powers or dispositions to cause experiences of a certain type. It is instructive to try to understand this dual position. We find, for example, this passage in Descartes' Principles of Philosophy:

It is clear then that when we say we perceive colors in objects, it is really just the same as saying that we perceived in objects something as to whose nature we are ignorant but which produces in us a very clear and vivid sensation, what we call the sensation of color. (Descartes 1644/1988, para. 70; see also paras 68–70)

The implication of “it is really just the same as saying” is that this is not what it is ordinarily taken to be saying. As Descartes later explains, the ordinary way involves the mistake of “judging that the feature of objects that we call ‘color’ is something ‘just like the color in our sensation’.” However, Descartes is not implying that we should dispense with our ordinary talk. Instead, it is being suggested, we should go on using our ordinary color talk, but give it a novel interpretation: when we say ‘X’, then it is as though we said ‘Y’. That is to say, we should not understand the sentences literally, but rather translate them into other more appropriate sentences. Descartes, here, is following the principle common to many thinkers of the time, the principle of “talking with vulgar, and thinking with the learned.” The justification for this proposal is that it acknowledges that our color language serves very useful purposes: the reconstruction allows the language to continue to serve those purposes, while avoiding metaphysical error. Thus, there is at least a partial response to the common-sense criticism: the reconstruction central to this form of eliminativism embraces a principle of respect for our ordinary language.

There are also complications with respect to the subjectivist component of the traditional view. When philosophers such as Descartes and Locke wrote of sensations of color, or of (sensory) ideas of color, there are different interpretations of what is meant by the terms. The common interpretation is that a sensation of red is a sensory experience in which a certain subjective quality is presented. Expressed in modern terms, the subjective qualities are construed as qualia, or as qualities of sensory individuals such as sensa or sense-data or as sensational properties. There is, however, an alternative interpretation: a sensation of color is a sensory experience, which represents something as having a certain quality (the experience has a certain intentional content). On this second interpretation, Descartes' view would be that the relevant quality our color experience represents objects as having is one that no object possesses. Accordingly, it would not be inappropriate to call the theory fictionalist (rather than subjectivist). This interpretation, we should note, allows for qualia or sensa, but does not mandate them. And some Cartesian scholars deny that Descartes, in particular, was committed to qualia.

Finally, there is yet another complication. It is in fact possible to combine the two versions in a single interpretation. That is to say, the representationalist view does not rule out a version with subjectivist elements. For such a view allows for a type of projectivism, whereby the experience both presents a sensory quality, and represents a physical object as having that quality. The experience is said to ‘project’ the subjective, sensory qualities onto the physical objects. A model for this would be the experience of pain: the supposition is that when one has a toothache, the experience represents the pain as being in the tooth. (This projectivist view seems to suit Hume's thought, but in any case, it fits modern projectivist accounts.)

These considerations suggest a useful way of understanding the definitions offered above, e.g., color attributes are attributes of sensations: to drop the use of ‘sensations’ and to read them instead as saying, for example: color attributes are attributes of visual perception, i.e., attributes perceivers perceive objects as having. (Or if we retain the use of ‘sensations’ we can say that the attributes are properties the sensations represent objects as having.) Accordingly, these attributes are putatively properties of objects in physical and public space. (Qualification: there are some experiences of color that do not fit this schema, e.g., experiences had with one's eyes shut.) This way of understanding the definitions leaves it open whether physical objects actually have the properties or not, and whether the properties (that form part of the content of the experiences) might have subjective components.

1.3 The Problem of Color Realism

These complications allow what I have been calling ‘the traditional scientific view’ to make sense, but it leaves us with the question of what reason is there to accept the view. The quotation above, from Palmer 1999, has the virtue of suggesting an argument for color eliminativism, one that is at least implicit in the scientific tradition. As Palmer states the view, it takes the form: when we see objects as colored, we experience the objects in certain ways, we see them as having certain qualities, but the objects do not have those qualities; the colors we perceive are different from any the physical objects possess. There are two claims implicit here: (i) the colors we perceive objects as having, have a certain distinctive character; (ii) the physical sciences have shown that no qualities with that character play any part in the perception of colors. From this, it is concluded that neither objects nor lights are colored in anything like the way we experience them.

This formulation has the additional merit of fixing the subject matter for the dispute between eliminativists and realists: the debate concerns certain qualities which objects appear to have. It is helpful that there are leading color realists who describe the debate in similar terms. A. Byrne and D. R. Hilbert (2003) say of the problem of color realism, that it “concerns various especially salient properties that objects visually appear to have”. By way of clarification, they say:

If someone with normal color vision looks at a tomato in good light, the tomato will appear to have a distinctive property—a property that strawberries and cherries also appear to have, and which we call ‘red’ in English. The problem of color realism is posed by the following two questions. First, do objects like tomatoes, strawberries and radishes really have the distinctive property that they do appear to have? Second, what is this property? (Byrne and Hilbert 2003, pp. 3–4)

The first question concerns the debate between color realists and eliminativists. The second question concerns the debate among color realists (and eliminativists). For both questions, the suggestion is that we focus on the relevant “salient properties that objects visually appear to have”. These properties, they point out, are sometimes called phenomenal colors, and sometimes colors-as-we-see-them. The point of identifying phenomenal colors in this way is to provide a fixed subject matter for both of the debates about the two questions.

It is important to take note that the formulation, by Byrne and Hilbert, of the problem of color realism has an extra advantage: it spells out two ways of characterising the subject matter, i.e., the colors for our debate. The color red, for example, is identified as:

  1. the property which certain paradigms appear to have;
  2. the property which we call ‘red’ in English.

It is natural to suppose that these are different ways of characterizing the same property (though, as we shall see, there are some philosophers who challenge the assumption). Separating them out has the merit of allowing us to see that different kinds of issues might arise in deciding the answers to such disputes. The second way raises questions about the underlying mechanisms for the linguistic practices whereby color terms name the relevant properties.

1.4 Rival Theories of Color

There are two issues concerning color realism: (1) what sort of properties are colors? (2) do objects really possess those properties? With respect to the first question, there is deep division between color realists (as well as between eliminativists). Setting out the views of major realists and eliminativists, we have the following major rival theories:

  1. Colors are ‘primitive’ properties—simple, sui generis, qualitative properties that physical bodies possess or appear to possess: Primitivism.
  2. Colors are ‘hidden’ properties of bodies—complex, physical properties that dispose bodies to look blue, pink, yellow, etc.: Reductive Physicalism
  3. Colors are perceiver-dependent, dispositional properties—powers to look in distinctive ways to appropriate perceivers, in appropriate circumstances: Dispositionalism
  4. Colors are subjective qualities ‘projected’ onto physical objects and light-sources—qualities which visual experiences represent objects as having: Projectivism.
  5. Colors are subjective qualities—either qualities presented in experience or qualities of experiences: Subjectivism.


  1. Theories in category 3 are relational theories of color. Historically, they have been interpreted in terms of normal/standard observers, and standard viewing conditions. Recently there have developed versions of the theory which relax these requirements.
  2. This taxonomy is a first approximation. Some theorists would hold that there is more than one kind of color: dual referent theorists, e.g., Descartes 1644/1988, D. Brown 2006.

2. The Aim of Philosophical Theories of Color

At the end of the last section, we set out the major rival theories of color, i.e., theories of what sort of properties colors are. In the specific case, the aim is to know, for example, what sort of property is (i) that property which certain paradigms visually appear to have (phenomenal colors, or colors-as-we-see-them); (ii) that property we call ‘red’ in English.

One approach to deciding between these theories, accordingly, aims at giving an account of phenomenal colors. Another approach to the task, however, is to take up the second part of this characterisation, that is, to concentrate on giving an account of what property our color terms name. Given the recent developments of externalist theories of meaning, there are various ways in which one might pursue this task. One way that is still popular is to give a conceptual analysis of our ordinary color concepts, as expressed in our color language. Some of its leading practitioners are David Lewis 1997 and Frank Jackson 1998. Some color theorists, however, reject the approach altogether. After all, we may wonder, why should the thought and talk of ordinary folk inform of us of the right theory of color? The aim of this section is to consider the extent to which this question can be answered.

2.1 The Relevance of the Ordinary Conception

Byrne and Hilbert seem to adopt the point of view that is skeptical of the value of conceptual analysis in this context. In their article, referred to in the first section, where they describe the problem of color as concerning “various especially salient properties that objects visually appear to have,” they take pains to emphasise that

It does not concern, at least in the first instance, color language or color concepts. The problem of color realism, they say, is primarily a problem in ‘the theory of perception’, not a problem in the theory of thought or language.

By way of explanation, they add:

Consider an analogy. From the point of view of the biologist, the word ‘food’ is applied by ordinary people in a somewhat arbitrary way … an investigation of how ordinary people use the word ‘food’ is not particularly relevant to biology. … The problem of color realism is like the investigation of what humans can digest, not the investigation of the folk category of food. The enquiry concerns certain properties that objects visually appear to have, not how ordinary people use color words, or how they conceptualize color categories. (Byrne and Hilbert 2003, p. 4)

These remarks, however, are misleading. There is something else that Byrne and Hilbert say, which undermines their food analogy. It is worth re-quoting the passage that was discussed in Section 1.3, above.

If someone with normal color vision looks at a tomato in good light, the tomato will appear to have a distinctive property—a property that strawberries and cherries also appear to have, and which we call ‘red’ in English. The problem of color realism is posed by the following two questions. First, do objects like tomatoes, strawberries and radishes really have the distinctive property that they do appear to have? Second, what is this property? (pp. 3–4)

So, among other things, the enquiry is directed at uncovering the property which our ordinary color terms, such as ‘red’, express. So it can't entirely avoid issues to do with color language and concepts. We can reinforce the point by referring to the fact that it is common to find color authorities explain a central aspect of color, the property of having a hue, as follows: “Hue: attribute of colour perception denoted by the terms yellow, red, blue, green and so forth” (Kuehni 2005, p. 187; see also Byrne and Hilbert 1997b, p. 447).

This criticism may be effective as an ad hominem response to Byrne and Hilbert, but it is hardly decisive. We can still identify a problem of realism which has to do with phenomenal color, and why think that conceptual analysis is relevant to that? Let us grant that there is such a genuine problem. It is not clear why it deserves to be called ‘the’ problem of color realism. As we have seen, there is a long scientific tradition saying that ‘color is not a physical reality’. And whatever other form of color realism it may deny, most of us still want to know whether it rules out the following form of color realism: one which concerns the properties that our color terms ‘red’, ‘blue’, ‘purple’, ‘dark blue’, etc., name (and our color concepts pick out or express). Let us specify that version as Color Realism (1). Even if Byrne and Hilbert have identified a different form of color realism, call it Color Realism (2), which is important, that wouldn't show that Color Realism (1) is not significant. It is surely worth wondering about, and discussing, the claim that objects do not have colors, colors that are the subject of our ordinary thought and talk.

Moreover, if one leading conceptual analyst, Frank Jackson, is right, then the two problems are intimately related. Jackson describes what he calls “the prime intuition about color”: ‘red’ denotes the property of an object putatively presented in visual experience when that object looks red. This he also calls “a subject-determining platitude for ‘red’.” If he is right, then Color Realism (2) is a sub-problem of Color Realism (1).

Nevertheless, the point of view expressed by Byrne and Hilbert helps clarify a distinction between two issues in this area. It is one thing to accept that our ordinary concepts and language, for color, are important enough to justify our developing an account of them; it is another to accept a special theory of the nature and significance of such an account. There is reason to think that what Byrne and Hilbert wish to reject, in particular, is a certain type of conceptual analysis. In a footnote (6), they refer to the point of view expressed by Lewis and Jackson,

who agree that the problem of color realism concerns properties that objects appear to have, but according to them, the only way to solve it is to analyze our ‘folk concept’ of color.

However, one might have a different understanding, from Jackson and Lewis, of the role of our ordinary color concepts and, as a result, different ways of understanding what ‘conceptual analysis’ consists in. Jackson and Lewis both describe the ordinary concept as a ‘folk concept’, and they explain the folk concept in terms of its being, or incorporating, a folk theory. They take having mastery of the relevant concepts as having certain (well-grounded) beliefs, which they describe as ‘color-platitudes’. Wittgenstein, on the other hand, in his Remarks on Color, explicitly denies that he is looking for a theory of color. He describes his aim as one of “establishing a logic of color concepts”, an activity which he describes elsewhere as “laying bare its grammar” (Wittgenstein 1977, para 188, p 43e). Then, there are other theorists, e.g., those defending a Primitivist account of color, who draw upon an account of our ordinary understanding, which does not take the form of a folk theory (see Section 6.1).

Perhaps there is a third way between the Lewis-Jackson approach, with its emphasis on folk theories, and Wittgenstein's approach, which eschews all theories. What may be important, besides having beliefs, is that there is a set of practices in which color perceivers engage. And the philosophical task is to reflect on those practices, and to develop an account that makes best sense of them. This is not to say that folk beliefs are not relevant. It is to suggest that the study of our conceptual practices involves more than the study of folk beliefs. One thing that may happen upon reflection is that a puzzle might arise. To give one example from Wittgenstein, he makes the following remark:

95. In my room I am surrounded by objects of different colours. It is easy to say what color they are. But if I were asked what colour I am now seeing from here at, say, this place on my table, I couldn't answer; the place is whitish (because the light wall makes the brown table lighter here) at any rate it is much lighter than the rest of the table, but, given a number of colour samples, I wouldn't be able to pick out one which had the same coloration as this area of the table.

Wittgenstein here is not aiming to describe what could be called a ‘folk belief’. He describes a puzzle that arises for someone who has ordinary concepts of color and who, upon reflection, makes a certain observation. It is here, one might reasonably think, that there is room for some theory.

2.2 The Ordinary Conception of Color and Metaphysics

To clarify some of these issues, it is helpful to begin by considering the influential and detailed account that one prominent color theorist, Mark Johnston, gives. Like Lewis and Jackson, he endorses the view that the ordinary color concepts are captured in a set of beliefs that those with mastery of the concept possess. Johnston says that the ordinary concept of color is a ‘cluster concept’, which incorporates a wide set of beliefs. There are, he points out, many beliefs about color to which we are susceptible, beliefs resulting from our visual experience and our tendency to take that visual experience in certain ways. Johnston says that some of these beliefs are ‘core’ beliefs, which we can contrast with the more ‘peripheral’ beliefs. The point about the core beliefs is this: were such beliefs to turn out not to be true, we would then have trouble saying what they were false of, i.e., we would be deprived of a subject matter, rather than having our views changed about a given subject matter. By contrast, the peripheral beliefs are such that “as they change we are simply changing our mind about a stable subject matter” (Johnston 1992/1997, p. 137).

Taking canary yellow as an illustrative example, he writes that beliefs with a legitimate title to be included in a core of beliefs about canary yellow include:

  1. Paradigms. Some of what we take to be paradigms of canary yellow things (e.g., some canaries) are canary yellow.
  2. Explanation. The fact of a surface or volume or radiant source being canary yellow sometimes causally explains our visual experience as of canary yellow things.
  3. Unity. Thanks to its nature and the nature of the other determinate shades, canary yellow has its own unique place in the network of similarity, difference and exclusion relations exhibited by the whole family of shades.
  4. Perceptual Availability. Justified belief about the canary yellowness of external things is available simply on the basis of visual perception. That is, if external things are canary yellow we are justified in believing this just on the basis of visual perception and the beliefs, which typically inform it.
  5. Revelation. The intrinsic nature of canary yellow is fully revealed by a standard visual experience as of a canary yellow thing.

Canary yellow is an example. More generally, for each color property F, beliefs that are legitimately included in the core of beliefs concerning F, will include the relevant instances of the beliefs (1) to (5). Johnston goes on to argue that in fact there are no properties for which all of these beliefs hold true. Accordingly, “speaking ever so inclusively”, the world is not colored. However, he maintains, “speaking more or less inclusively”, the world is colored, for there are properties which make true enough of these beliefs, so as to deserve to be called colors. Johnston then goes on to defend the view that the closest candidates for the various colors are the dispositional properties, dispositions to look yellow, to look blue, etc. The item in the list that provides most trouble is item (5) the doctrine of Revelation. To drop this from the list, he thinks, is a price worth paying, to preserve that claim that there really are colors.

It is of course an important question as to whether the list is accurate or complete. To make progress on that question, however, there is, a prior question to answer: what are the criteria for inclusion in the list? (Whose beliefs are they supposed to be?) On the face of it, they are beliefs of those who have mastery of the concepts of color, i.e., including the many ordinary people who lack detailed scientific knowledge. This is certainly the view of Lewis and Jackson, who use the term ‘folk concept’ in referring to the ordinary concept and who, in addition, see the possession of the concept as involving having a theory, e.g., a folk theory of color: a set of beliefs or platitudes about color.

However, when we look at the items of Johnston's list, it seems difficult to maintain this view about the status of the various items. Take item (5), Revelation. Whatever its status, it doesn't look like a folk belief. It looks more like something a philosopher might come up with. In the second place, it seems to have a peculiar status. Experiences of color, it is claimed, are enough to inform us of the nature of color. If it is true or if it is a folk belief, it is hard to see what need there is of the other items in the list. Perhaps, though, this formulation of the doctrine is misleading, and there is a better formulation available. One possibility is that the doctrine should be interpreted as addressing certain necessary conditions, rather than all necessary conditions, or all necessary and sufficient conditions. This point is important since there is group of philosophers who are sympathetic to Primitivism and/or Naïve Realism, who seem to favor a principle that differs in this way from Johnston's formulation (see section 6.1).

But let us concentrate on item, (3), which Johnston labels ‘Unity’. What it points to is the fact that the various colors can be ordered systematically, in a structured array of all the colors, where that array is based on the system of relations of similarity, difference and exclusion holding among the colors. The color ‘yellow’ is said to have a unique place in this array. Johnston explains the principle in more detail:

Think of the relations exemplified along the axes of hue, saturation and brightness in the co-called color solid. The color solid captures central facts about the colors, e.g., that canary yellow is not as similar to the shades of blue as they are similar among themselves, i.e., that canary yellow is not a shade of blue. (Johnston 1992/1997, p. 138)

There is little doubt that this is an important principle, one which plays a central part in the reasoning of many philosophers who have written on color, e.g., Wittgenstein 1977, Harrison 1973, Hardin 1988, Thompson 1995, Maund 1995. It is regarded as an important factor which physicalist-realist theories of color must explain, and have a problem in explaining. However, whatever the status of this principle, it is not a folk belief (and few of these last-mentioned theorists say that it is). Nor is it plausibly a tacit belief. For example, it does not seem a belief it is necessary to have, in order to have mastery of concepts of color and, in particular, of a concept of yellow. It is surely quite a sophisticated belief, which requires considerable experience with colors. For one thing, the dimensions mentioned by Johnston—hue, saturation and brightness—apply to aperture colors or film colors, which few folk would be aware of, and not to surface colors. Aperture colors are colors perceived under a special mode of viewing: one views the objects or light sources through a small aperture in a screen (of an achromatic color). The appearance of these colors differs from that of colors seen under more usual circumstances. ‘Surface colors’ are the colors of illuminated samples seen under conditions in which it is possible for the viewer to distinguish the color of the surface from that of the ambient light. Indeed, for surface colors, there are two sets of dimensions: hue, chroma, and lightness (the Munsell system) and hue, chromaticness and whiteness/blackness (the Swedish Natural Color system, NCS). Nevertheless, Unity (or a set of Unities) is an important principle and it has something to do with our concepts of color. Wittgenstein, for example, thought it was central to our having the concepts of color that we do, but as we saw above, he says that “we do not want to find a theory of color … but rather the logic of color concepts”.

There is another explanation for why Johnston's principles (1) to (5) are important, besides their being folk beliefs. It is more plausible to see them as items of knowledge: of facts or truths, that are readily accessible to someone who has the relevant concepts. For example, once we are fluent with color names, and are competent in the exercise of color concepts, we are then in a position to come to know that Unity holds with respect to the colors. We won't discover this, however, until we have familiarity with a wide range of colors and can see the various colors ordered in suitable arrays. Likewise, with the other items in Johnston's list, e.g., (5), the doctrine of Revelation. Indeed, if we look at item (1), in Johnston's list, the item he labels ‘Paradigms’, it explicitly states one such sort of fact: it states that there are paradigms of canary yellow, things that are canary yellow.

These considerations are not trivial, for when we examine the examples that Lewis and Jackson give of the relevant constraints on color, we find that they function as items of knowledge, than as mere beliefs. Indeed Lewis often refers to the folk beliefs as ‘common knowledge and known to be common knowledge’. In Jackson's case, consider the quote, cited in the previous section 2.1, concerning what he calls ‘the prime intuition about color’: ‘red’ denotes the property of an object putatively presented in visual experience when that object looks red. This he also calls “a subject-determining platitude for ‘red’.” What is particularly interesting is what Jackson does with this ‘prime intuition’. He says that it seems trivial, but its significance is that it tells us

something important about the metaphysics of color, when we combine it with plausible views about what is required for an experience to be the presentation of a property: a necessary condition for experience E to be the presentation of property P is that there be a causal connection in normal cases. (Jackson 1998, p. 89)

That is to say, in arguing to a substantive metaphysical conclusion—namely, that color is a certain microphysical property—Jackson is combining the result of his intuitions (which he claims to share with the ‘folk’) with a certain piece of knowledge.

It would seem that the terms ‘folk beliefs’ and ‘folk theories’ are not the most appropriate terms to capture the theories set out by Jackson, Lewis and Johnston, and would be better replaced by reference, say, to common-sense. It is worth noting that the same problem comes up in discussions of the relative importance of ‘folk psychology’ in the Philosophy of Mind. Because of this problem, some theorists prefer to use the term ‘common-sense psychology’ (see, for example, Crane 2003).

These considerations give us a different way of thinking of how the ordinary conception of color is relevant to metaphysics, than in terms of folk beliefs/theories. The important thing about our color concepts is that we apply them in a wide a range of situations and practices. The point of a theory of color is not so much to capture our folk beliefs, but to make sense of those situations and practices. In part, this means recognising a wide range of color facts. Central among them are the facts that we have paradigms of color: lemons are yellow, skies (in Perth) are blue, tomatoes are red. Another is the fact that ostensive teaching situations play a central role in the learning of color terms. Indeed, it seems that there is a vast range of truths—‘color truths’, let us call them—which are expressed through our ordinary color concepts. According to this way of looking at things, we philosophers want to make sense of these conceptual practices, and at least part of what that involves is giving an account of what sort of properties colors are: what are the properties that make the relevant color truths true.

2.3 Conclusion

The issues raised in this section involve complex issues of philosophical methodology, about which there is much contemporary dispute. No short discussion of such issues can hope to be comprehensive. Different philosophers hold sharply differing views about both the nature of conceptual analysis and its significance. Part of the aim of this section was to bring out that the practice of different groups of philosophers is closer than one would expect from their official views.

3. A Framework for a Theory of Color

The discussion in the previous section was aimed at issues related to the general question of what counts as an adequate theory of color, i.e., to determining the constraints upon such a theory. There are a number of factors that theorists take to provide such constraints: some will be almost universally accepted; others will have different rates of acceptance. In various discussions, one or more of these factors will be paramount. One constraint, widely accepted, is that the theory should give an adequate account of the ordinary understanding of color. There, however, two ways to take that constraint. One way is to take it that the account must be consistent with the ordinary understanding; a weaker way is to say that the theory must ‘respect’ that understanding. Respecting it involves taking it seriously, which is compatible with thinking that it is faulty and stands in need of modification. It may involve explaining how it came about.

There is another complication. While it seems plausible to understand “giving an account of the ordinary understanding of color” as addressing the set of beliefs held by those who have mastery of the concept, it turns out, in practice, that there is a set of other factors that are important: the putative truths expressible and knowable with this concept, and factors important in the operations of the concepts and use of color vocabulary, e.g., factors involved in the learning of color terms, in the perceptual recognition of colors, in the ordering of colors, and so on. Johnston gives a useful set of such factors, at least to begin with.

Many of these factors are important even for those who do not profess to be interested in questions of language and concepts. Such theorists usually focus on certain truths concerning color and attempt to give an account of what sort of properties colors need to be to satisfy or explain such truths. One such factor is that of providing an adequate account of experiences of colour. This will include giving an adequate account of the phenomenology of color experiences, and in giving an account of the role of the experiences in the acquisition, both of colour concepts, and of colour knowledge. A number of issues arise: for example, (1) what phenomenological character do experiences have? (2) whether experiences have representational content and, if so, of what type, e.g., whether the content is conceptual or non-conceptual; (3) do the experiences contain subjective, non-intentional qualities? (4) what role do the experiences play in the acquisition of colour concepts, and in their exercise? (5) what is it for something to look blue, or look yellow, or look red, etc. (6) does the theory have an adequate fit with scientific facts, e.g., about the mechanisms of color vision, about the types of color appearances, about the individual differences among color perceivers, and so on.

4. Color Science: Some Complexities

Color science is a flourishing field of science, with a long history that goes back to Newton, and includes such famous figures as Young, Maxwell, Helmholtz, and Hering. While there has been widespread doubt about the existence of color as a physical reality, this has not stopped the growth of an enormous amount of research into color: into the mechanisms underlying color vision, into ways of specifying the ways colors appear, and into constructing systems to order colors. While much of this research has been directed at human color vision, there has been a growing amount addressing animal color vision. In other words, no one doubts that there is such a thing as color vision.

One line of research focuses on the chemistry and physics of color. This includes the study of how the material properties of physical bodies alter the composition of the light it transmits or reflects or emits or scatters, and of the character, and composition of the light involved. These causes, as Kurt Nassau points out, are many and varied. He refers to an “informal classification [that] … has some 14 category of causes” (Nassau 1983, p. 3). Much of the research in color science, however, is devoted, directly or indirectly, to color perception, i.e., to the psychology of color, and to psychophysics, and to studying the complex physiological and neurological mechanisms underlying color vision.

One important area of study has to deal with the construction of color spaces, which are spaces for ordering the colors systematically. There are different spaces constructed for different purposes (see Kuehni 2003, 2010). One type of color space is dealt with in the field of colorimetry, which is a branch of color science concerned with ‘measuring’ color, which means specifying numerically the color of visual stimulus (either a light or an object). We do this, in the simplest case, by specifying the mixture of three reference lights that match the stimulus (i.e., appear the same), under specific viewing conditions, and illumination.

Central types of color space are psychological color systems, i.e., of ways of ordering, in a systematic fashion, the range of colors—colors as perceived—in a three-dimensional coordinate system, within which each possible perceived color can be represented as a single point with a unique position. It is important to note that there are different systems that have been constructed. For one thing, different dimensions are used, depending on the way in which color appears. Colors as properties of surfaces, in general, have a different mode of appearance from colors as properties of volumes such as wine, and yet again from that for film color or aperture color (the color of an object or light source viewed through an aperture in a reduction screen). These different modes of appearance suit different dimensions of color. For aperture or film colors, and light sources, the dimensions are hue, saturation and brightness; for surfaces, the dimensions are hue, chroma and value (lightness)—Munsell—and hue, chromaticness and whiteness/blackness—Swedish Natural Color System (NCS).

A wide range of psychological phenomena related to color perception has been studied. Many concern the conditions of perception, e.g., the field in which color-constancy, simultaneous contrast, the effects of various backgrounds on color perceptions, and so on, are examined, and competing explanations debated. One striking phenomenon is that there are certain surface colors—contrast colors—that seem to depend on being perceived against a certain background, e.g., black, white, brown. Another important discovery has been the extent of the variation there is, among normal color perceivers, in the perception of specific shades of color.

One of the most vigorous areas of research, especially more recently, is the study of color vision, i.e., of the mechanisms involved in the perception of color. Helmholtz and Hering were pioneers in the physiology of this area, the former contributing to the Trichromatic theory, and the latter to the development of the Opponent Process Theory. Originally these theories were seen as rivals, but much of the research in the second part of the 20th century has pointed to them explaining complementary parts of the visual processes.

According to the Trichromatic theory, there are in the retinas of the eyes (for normal perceivers) three types of cones, which contain different visual pigments, maximally sensitive, respectively, to different wavelength of light: long, medium and short. The cones are commonly referred to as the L, M and S cones, respectively. The stimulation of these pigments does not correspond in any simple way to the experiences of color. The Opponent-Process theory postulates computational mechanisms in the visual system to explain how the outputs of these cones lead to the experiences. According to this theory, the outputs of the three cone-types are transformed into two opponent chromatic signals and one non-opponent achromatic signal. It is thought that there are pairs of opponent information channels, where the activity in one channel inhibits activity in an opponent channel. The pairs of channels are supposed to be linked to ‘red/green responses’, and to ‘blue/yellow responses’ respectively. Letting the cone outputs for the long, medium and short wave cones be L, M and S, the red-green signal is LM, the yellow-blue signal is (L + M) − S, and the achromatic signal is L + M. Concentrating on the two chromatic signals, if L − M > 0 then the red-green signal produces a ‘red response’, and a ‘green response’, if L − M < 0. Similarly, the yellow-blue signal produces a ‘yellow response’, if (L + M) − S > 0, and a ‘blue response’ if (L + M) − S < 0. With such a theory, we seem to have a natural explanation for how we have say experiences of unique red, unique green, unique blue, unique yellow. (To have the color of unique red is to have a color that has no blue or yellow component.) It also explains why we have experiences of bluish-reds, and yellowish-reds, but not greenish-reds.

It should be borne in mind that the theory described above has the status of a simplified model. Finding solid neurophysiological evidence confirming the theory is proving difficult. For accounts of the complexities, see Abramov 1997 and MacLeod 2010. Some experimental data go against the model. As Hardin points out, certain color-blind dichromats, with only two functioning cones, and supposedly bereft of experiences of red and green, nevertheless seem to have some such experiences (Hardin 2008, pp. 145–146; for an even more dissenting view, see Jameson 2010). For an introductory accessible overview of color vision, the reader is referred to Palmer 1999, Ch.3. For a more general reference on color science, one should consult Kuehni 2005 and 2010.

5. Color Experiences: Phenomenal Character and Intentional Content

One of the most important issues for the philosophy of color to address concerns the phenomenal character of color experiences. This issue, in turn, raises general questions of whether the experiences have representational content and if so, of what type, and questions about whether there are non-intentional aspects to the phenomenal character. The question of phenomenal character is related to what account one's theory can give (or require) of what it is for something to look a certain colour: to look blue, to look yellow, look red, and so on. This notion plays a central role in most accounts, either in giving an account of what colour is, or for raising problems that the theory needs to resolve.

The most notable example is the most common version of the dispositional account: for something to be yellow is to be such as to look yellow—to normal observers, in standard conditions (McGinn 1983; Johnston 1992/1997; Levin 2000). Another example is the relational view of Jonathan Cohen 2009 and Edward Averill 1992, the view that implies that colours are relational properties, defined in terms of the object's capacity to look a certain way, in contextually defined circumstances, to contextually defined observers.

But the notion also plays a central role in theories of physicalist objectivists such as McLaughlin 2003 and Jackson 1998. According to McLaughlin, colours are the “occupants of a certain functional role-description”, where the functional role is specified in terms of the ways things look, that are peculiar to colours. Jackson, as we saw, makes crucial use of what he calls “the prime intuition about colour”: The prime intuition is simply that red is the property objects look to have when they look red (Jackson 1998, p. 89). Finally, both Byrne and Hilbert 2003 and Boghossian and Velleman 1991/1997 characterize the dispute between realists and non-realists on color, to concern “certain properties that objects visually appear [i.e., look] to have.” As Boghossian and Velleman put it,

What philosophers want to know is whether the properties that objects thus appear to have are among the ones that they are generally agreed to have in reality. (Boghossian and Velleman 1991/1997, p. 106)

The centrality of this notion raises the question of what exactly is it for something to look blue. Unfortunately, this question is not easily settled. It is usual for theorists to rely upon what is called ‘the phenomenological use’ of ‘looks F’, where this use can be distinguished from the perceptual-epistemic (and epistemic) and the comparative uses of the same phrase. However, different theorists take the phenomenological use in different ways. For some, it is connected with the idea that the experience or state carries representational content, while others take it to refer to non-intentional aspects of experience. And of those who connect it with representational content, there are some who hold that the content is conceptual, and others who think it is non-conceptual. Finally, it is not at all unusual for some theorists to hold that experiences have two aspects, i.e., non-intentional and intentional characteristics, and/or conceptual and non-conceptual aspects, and that ‘looks yellow’, say, can be used, on different occasions to refer to these different aspects.

The commonest way to think of ‘looks blue’ is to think of the phrase as having a semantic structure, with ‘blue’ having its usual sense. This use, which is found in common practice, can be contrasted with an unstructured sense of ‘looks-blue’, in which the term ‘blue’ does not make the same contribution. For X to look-blue in this sense is usually taken to mean that X causes a certain type of experience (or type of visual state), a type that is not defined by reference to the property of being blue, and whose occurrence does not require the subject to have the concept of being blue. (It is often thought of in these terms: for X to look-blue to S is for X to induce in S a blue-ish-appearance—or appearing.) This use of ‘looks’ is usually introduced by philosophers for theoretical purposes, though some argue that it is implicit in the ordinary use of ‘looks blue, ‘looks square’, etc.

Unfortunately, there is more than one way different philosophers understand the innocuous-looking structured use. Many philosophers take it as obvious that for something to look blue is for it to be represented as being blue, and that, given that this is so, it is perfectly understandable that it could look blue to me without my believing, or even being inclined to believe, that it is blue, e.g., Jackson 2000, 2007. The claim is that for X to look blue is for it to cause a visual experience or visual state that represents the object as blue. Furthermore, thinking in these representational terms explains why it is that some perceivings are veridical, and others non-veridical. In veridical cases, the representation is accurate _ things are as they are represented as being—in the other case, they are not accurate.

In recent times, however, there has emerged a growing minority position that challenges this view. M. G. F. Martin 2002 has been the most influential, but there has been a large group of philosophers: Paul Snowdon 1980, P. M. S. Hacker 1987, John McDowell 1994, Charles Travis 2004. As Martin points out, both the view known as naïve realism, and the disjunctivist account of perceptual experiences, offer a different way of understanding ‘looks F’. On these views we do not have to take veridical experiences and non-veridical ones as being of a uniform type. In the case of veridical perceiving we do not have an experience which represents an object as having colours, shape, size, etc. Instead we should think of these qualities being presented to the perceiver in having the experience. On the naïve realist view, ‘looks blue’ is still structured: the property of being blue is presented in the experience. This issue is particularly important for a theory of colour, for one way of explaining the primitivist theory is to connect it with a naïve realist view of colour (see section 6.1). One might defend the primitivist view and also claim that the primitive properties are part of the representational content.

There is an added complication. Of those philosophers who assume that visual experiences have representational content, some, like Jackson, do so within a framework in which the content is conceptual, while others such as M. Tye and Byrne and Hilbert, take it to be non-conceptual. Furthermore, there are yet others, such as Peacocke 1992/1997, who hold that there are two distinct aspects to color experiences, one non-conceptual, the other conceptual. Peacocke defends a theory in which ‘looks blue’ is confined to the conceptual, representing sense. On this account, we must distinguish between two aspects to the visual experience had, when S sees a red object, and where it looks red to her; (1) a sensational property red* is presented to S, in a region of her visual field; (2) S is in (or has) a state which represents, conceptually, to S that X (or at least something) is red.

6. Theories of Color

In an earlier section, 1.4, the major rival theories of color were set out. They comprise varieties of color realism and color eliminativism/fictionalism. In this section, we will examine specific versions of these theories. Many of the general issues that have been touched upon will come up for discussion.

6.1 Two Forms of Objectivism About Colors

One of the most prominent views of color is Color Objectivism, i.e., the view that color is an objective, i.e., mind-independent, intrinsic property, one possessed by many material objects (of different kinds) and light sources. This view, however takes different forms. One form it takes is that colors are simple qualities, which show their natures on their face: they are sui generis, simple, qualitative, intrinsic, irreducible properties. This view is sometimes called ‘the simple view’ and sometimes ‘Primitivism’. Another form is that colors are objective (mind-independent), properties of material bodies and light sources, whose natures are ‘hidden’ from us, and require empirical investigation to discover.

Perhaps the earliest defender of this second form of Color Objectivism was Thomas Reid, the 18th Century Scottish philosopher. Reid thought that the folk did not think as philosophers such as Hume and Descartes and others said that they did. Reid wrote that:

All people who have not been tutored by modern philosophy understand by color, not a sensation of the mind, which can have no existence when it is not perceived, but a quality or modification of bodies, which continues to be the same whether it is seen or not. (Reid 1822/1970, p. 99)

It would seem that, so far, Reid is simply displaying the common sense for which he is famous. More controversially, however, he goes on to say that when we perceive the color of body,

The idea, which we have called the appearance of color, suggests the conception and belief of some unknown quality in the body which occasions the idea, and it is to this quality and not the idea, that we give the name of color. [my emphasis] (Reid 1822/1970, p. 100.)

On the face of it, this view of Reid seems counter-intuitive. Many of ‘those untutored by modern philosophy’, have a lot to say about colors, and would be surprised to be told that colors are unknown qualities. Red, for example, is the color used by many revolutionary parties, good for annoying bulls, my favorite color, the color of my true love's lips, and so on. We can give paradigms of blue, red, yellow, turquoise, mauve, etc. We often say things such as ‘that is a better blue that this’. One suspects that they (the untutored) would be puzzled by the remark that red is some unknown quality (for more on this, see Hacker 1987, p. 186).

Reid's view may be extreme but it helps us appreciate the significance of the view of a contemporary color physicalist, B. McLaughlin, who singles Reid out as anticipating his account of color. McLaughlin explicitly endorses this view of Reid though, in fact, his position is subtly different. He defends a functionalist analysis of color, according to which a color, say redness, is the occupant of a certain functional role:

Redness is that property which disposes its bearers to look red, to standard visual perceivers in standard conditions of visual observation, and which must (as a matter of nomological necessity) be held by everything so disposed. (McLaughlin 2003, p. 479)

McLaughlin adds that this proposal is intended as providing a conceptual analysis:

The proposal is intended as a functional or topic neutral analysis of the concept of redness. The role description ‘that property which …’ is intended not only to fix the referent of the concept, but also to express a condition that is necessary and sufficient for satisfying it. Thus, if the proposal is correct, then all it takes for a property to be redness is for it to fill the redness role.

McLaughlin's proposal is different, in a crucial respect, from Reid's. It does not explicitly state that the property, which is the occupant of the functional role, is a property ‘unknown’ to the observer. His proposal is designed to be ‘topic-neutral’. This means that colors could either be some complex physical properties, that could only be discovered by scientific investigation, or they could be the sort of properties described by Primitivists: sui generis, simple, intrinsic, qualitative, non-relational, non-reducible properties of physical bodies (McGinn 1996; Campbell 1994, 2005; Gert 2006, 2008). McLaughlin argues that scientific investigation makes it highly plausible that the occupant of the role is some complex physical property—that is, that Color Physicalism is true—and that no good reason favors the Primitivist option.

McLaughlin's topic-neutral proposal is a proposal about our ordinary understanding of color. Most Primitivists would accept this condition as capturing, at best, only one element of that understanding. (Some would say that the proposal expresses a truth that we can recognize, but it is not part of the ordinary understanding.) Other elements, they would contend, rule out the complex physical properties that McLaughlin indicates. A plausible candidate for one of these elements is the doctrine of Revelation, item (5) of the list that, as we saw, Johnston provides, in his ‘cluster’ of core color beliefs.

  1. Revelation. The intrinsic nature of canary yellow is fully revealed by a standard visual experience as of a canary yellow thing.

This would explain the Primitivist account of the character of the colors, as being revealed in our perceptual experience. McLaughlin addresses the status of Revelation in his argument. He thinks that this doctrine, once we reflect on it, has little to recommend it. What appeal it has depends on the fact that it is easily confused with another principle, which has some intuitive appeal (though it too is false). He does not have an explicit argument against the doctrine, although he draws a consequence that he thinks we would all find unwelcome:

All we have learned, and indeed, all we can ever hope to learn by scientific investigation will contribute not one whit to our knowledge of the nature of colors themselves. For Revelation entails that there is nothing more that we can learn about the nature of colors than what visual experience teaches us. (McLaughlin 2003, p. 477.)

He thinks that there is a basic mistake behind the commitment to the doctrine of Revelation: the failure to distinguish colors from what it is like to see them. Revelation, he concedes, is more plausible with respect to the phenomenal character of color experiences—the what-it-is-like aspect—though, here, too, it is false.

There are a number of responses Primitivists can make to this criticism. One is to say that insofar as the thesis needs to appeal to some version of Revelation, it only needs a much weaker version. Gert 2008, for example, defends a weaker form of Revelation in his defense of an ‘unmysterious’ version of Color Primitivism. Indeed, the doctrine as stated above is very strong indeed. Most of us would find that, in order to be plausible at all, the doctrine would need to refer to a series of experiences rather than a single one. A second plausible restriction would be to say that our visual experiences reveal some of the necessary elements to the nature of colors, i.e., part of their nature, rather than all of it. This would allow for the possibility that further empirical investigation uncovers other elements, e.g., that colors satisfy the Principle of Unity.

A second possible response is to say that Primitivism requires a different version of Revelation altogether, or even some other plausible doctrine, which is being conflated with the strong one described above. Something that indicates that this might be so is the fact that though McLaughlin and Johnston illustrate the doctrine with quotes from Bertrand Russell and Galen Strawson, they fail to notice the authors offer us different interpretations of the doctrine.

[Strawson] Color words are words for properties which are of such a kind that their whole and essential nature as properties can be and is fully revealed in sensory-quality experience given only the qualitative character that experience has. (Strawson 1989, p. 224)

[Russell] The particular shade of color that I am seeing … may have many things to be said about it … But such statements, though they make me know truths about the color do not make me know the color itself better than I did before: so far as concerns knowledge of the color itself, as opposed to knowledge of truths about it, I know the color perfectly and completely when I see it and no further knowledge of it itself is even theoretically possible. (Russell 1912, p. 47)

Russell says nothing about experiences; he talks about seeing colors. More to the point, he emphasizes knowledge-by-acquaintance, which he explicitly contrasts with knowledge of truths. McLaughlin and Johnston, by contrast, interpret knowledge of the color as knowledge of necessary truths. Campbell 2005 takes up Russell's understanding of the doctrine. In this paper, his main aim, he says, is to contrast the idea that experience makes the colors transparent to us, with the idea that color experience provides us with knowledge of truths relating to the essences of the colors (Campbell 2005, p. 105). Color experience is said to provide knowledge of the aspect to the world that is being acted on when we, or some external force, act on the color of an object and thus make a difference to the experiences of people looking at it.

It is in this sense that the nature of the colors is transparent to us. For there to be colors is for there to be the qualitative categorical properties that we encounter in perception, action on which affects the color experiences of observers. (Campbell 2005, p. 105)

This line of thought, Campbell writes, contrasts with the idea that color experience reveals the colors to us, in the sense that it provides knowledge of number of necessary truths about the colors.

The second important feature of the Russell quote is that it speaks of seeing colors not of having visual experiences. This is important for two reasons. One is that McLaughlin says, in his criticism of the doctrine of Revelation, that he is employing ‘see’ in a narrow sense: the sense ‘common in vision science’. He explains this remark as follows: “By ‘seeing red’, I mean ‘having a visual experience as of something red’.” This remark is instructive. It overlooks the possibility that ‘see’ might be used in the normal ordinary sense, used outside of vision science, and that this possibility might lead to a different interpretation of the doctrine of Revelation. The second reason is that this distinction between seeing colors and having color experiences is crucial to theories of Naïve Realism, which defenders of primitivism could appeal to. The crucial claim is that there are certain qualities, including colors, that are presented in veridical perception to the subject who has these experiences. The point is that the qualities make themselves manifest in perception, not that knowledge of necessary truths about colors reveal themselves to those having the experiences (see Martin 2002 and Kalderon 2007). We should add that it seems to matter little to the Primitivist whether we think of this view as a different version of Revelation or as a different thesis altogether.

Even if the Primitivist draws upon this account of perception, so as to say that what is important about perceptual experience is that it makes qualities manifest to us, rather than revealing necessary truths, that does not stop it from being the case that once these qualities are manifest, we can go on to discover truths, that are plausibly necessary truths, about them, e.g., those truths captured by the Principle of Unity.

6.2 Primitivism: The Simple Objectivist View of Colors

Primitivism or as it is sometimes known as ‘The Simple Objectivist View of Color’ is the view that there are in nature colors, as ordinarily understood, i.e., colors are simple intrinsic, non-relational, non-reducible, qualitative properties. (By ‘objective’ here, I mean ‘ontologically objective’, i.e., mind-independent. This sense should be distinguished from ‘epistemologically objective’, which implies appeal to epistemological standards of objectivity.) They are qualitative features of the sort that stand in the characteristic relations of similarity and differences that mark the colors; they are not micro-structural properties or reflectances, or anything of the sort. There is no radical illusion, error or mistake in color perception (only commonplace illusions): we perceive objects to have the colors that they really have. Such a view has been presented by Hacker 1987 and by J. Campbell 1994, 2005, and has become increasingly popular: McGinn 1996; Watkins 2005; Gert 2006, 2008. (For a comprehensive range of criticisms, see Byrne and Hilbert 2007.)

This view has come to be known as ‘Primitivism’, though a more accurate label would be ‘Primitivist Color Realism’, since it is possible to believe that Primitivism expresses our ordinary color concepts, while holding that the concepts are not actualized. Primitivist Color realism contains a conceptual (and semantic) thesis about our ordinary understanding of color, and a metaphysical thesis, namely, that physical bodies actually have colors of this sort. It is possible to accept the conceptual thesis but deny the metaphysical thesis (e.g., those who hold a version of color fictionalism or a projectivist theory or the Illusory theory).

One major criticism with Primitivism concerns whether the arguments for it depends on a questionable form of the doctrine of Revelation. In the previous section, we considered this criticism and possible responses. (See Byrne and Hilbert 2007 for a defence of this criticism, among a set of other criticisms; see also Campbell 2005 for a counter-defence.)

Another problem concerns whether it is possible to reconcile the putative character of the intrinsic color features with such features having a causal role in our experiences of colors. The properties that do the causing of these experiences seem to be complex, micro-structural properties of surfaces of bodies (and similar properties for seeing volume colors, diffraction colors, scattering colors, etc). This problem is addressed by Hacker in his defense of the claim that colors are intrinsic features of physical bodies. He insists that colors are properties that are used to provide causal explanations. There is no more reason to deny this, he says, than there is to deny the parallel claim for solidity and liquidity. The explanation is not vitiated by the discovery that microstructural processes are involved, any more than explanations concerning solidity and liquidity are rendered otiose by the discovery of the microstructural base for these properties. A possible criticism of this analogy would be that, in the case of solidity and liquidity, it is plausible to analyse these properties functionally: to be solid is to have some structure that is the causal basis for such and such ways of behaving. This is not the sort of analysis that the Primitivist requires.

Hacker's solution amounts to making the claim that colors are supervenient on their microstructural bases. Another primitivist, McGinn 1996 proposes a variation on this theme. Colors, he says, are supervenient on the dispositions to look to have the colors. The plausibility of such solutions will depend on whether the theorist can provide some account of how the supervenience relation is meant to operate (a requirement which functionalists can typically satisfy, as in the solidity case). It is puzzling, for example, that colors, construed as mind-independent properties of objects, could be supervenient on the way objects look to perceivers. (For a nuanced defence of the supervenient relation's holding for Primitivism, see Watkins 2005.)

Another major problem is one that Hardin 2004, 2008 and Cohen 2009 have especially stressed. They draw attention to a vast range of facts concerning the variety of conditions under which objects appear to have the colors they do, and the variety of classes of observers for whom the colors appear. Given this variety, the color realist has to specify which conditions are ‘normal’ and which observers are ‘standard’. If he cannot, then there is no way to specify the ‘real’ color of a body. Cohen and Hardin argue that there is no non-arbitrary way to pick out normal conditions and observers. Averill 1992 presents a pair of arguments that also depend on difficulties that stem from trying to give a non-arbitrary account of normal observers and standard viewing conditions. We can easily suppose changes in either our eyes (and hence in normal observers) or in standard viewing conditions, such that some objects that previously were yellow would look red, and others would still look yellow—while remaining otherwise physically unchanged. If primitive colors are supposed to be supervenient on physical microstructures, then it is difficult to see how we could accommodate this sort of change. A possible, but radical, response to this problem is to modify the Realist position and to hold that objects can have more than one color (indeed have many colors). See Mark Kalderon 2007 and Vivian Mizrahi 2006 for a defence of this view.

Finally, any defence of Primitivist Realism will require an account of perceptual experiences—of how veridical and illusory experiences differ, and of how there can be experiences partly veridical and partly illusory. This account will need to cohere with what s known of the neurological mechanisms of color vision. Naïve Realism and Disjunctivism seem promising for the Primitivist Realist, but although these theories have strong support, they are controversial.

6.3 Physicalist Color Realism

The more common form of objectivism is that colors are objective (mind-independent), properties of material bodies and light sources, whose natures are ‘hidden’ from us, and require empirical investigation to discover. This theory is known as Physicalist Color Realism (and sometimes as Reductive Color Physicalism). Reid 1822/1970 was probably the earliest advocate of this theory. More recent examples are D. M. Armstrong 1969, Hilbert 1987, M. Matthen 1988, Jackson 1996, 1998, 2007, Tye 2000, A. Byrne & D. Hilbert 2003, and McLaughlin 2003.

An initial problem is ‘the problem of multiple realizations’. As was discussed in section 4 above, there is a wide range of different types of bodies that have colors—light sources, illuminants, surfaces (e.g., of apples, cars, cloths, paintings, …), volumes (e.g., wine, glass, atmospheres, …), bodies that scatter light, bodies that diffract light, films, and luminescent bodies. The causes of the colors objects appear to have, are many and varied. For most theorists, however, the most plausible physicalist candidates for the colors are light-related properties, e.g., capacities to emit, reflect, absorb, transmit or scatter light to varying degrees. For physical surfaces, the color is taken to be related to the object's reflectance profile, i.e., the capacity to differentially reflect wavelengths from different regions of the incident illumination. It turns out, however, that, for each surface color, there is no single reflectance curve associated with that color, but many. The situation is similar, in the case of film colors or aperture colors. That is to say, for each color, there is a set of metamers. (Two stimuli—bodies, sources of light, etc.—that differ in their physical characteristics, but are matched in appearance under a certain illumination, by the same observer, are metamers for that observer, in that illumination. Two bodies that are metamers in one illumination need not be metamers under a different illumination, or for a different observer.)

The favored response to this problem is to say, for example, that a given color, red, say, is not a specific color reflectance, but a type of reflectance, i.e., one that is a member of a certain group. However, there are still problems. Averill 1992, 2005, for example, presents some interesting arguments, which are based on plausible conjectures about how normal observers and standard conditions might easily enough change, with consequent metameric change. The color physicalist seems to be committed to a very arbitrary grouping of reflectances into the various types.

This problem is related to one that Hardin 1988, 2004 and Cohen 2009 have drawn attention to. It has to do with the problem of identifying, in a non-arbitrary way, normal conditions, and standard observers. The objectivist account requires that we identify the ‘real’ color for object X as a certain causal basis (e.g., the reflectance profile) for the way it appears, to normal observers and in standard conditions. The problem is that, as Hardin has persuasively pointed out, particularly, in Hardin 2004, this cannot be done except in a highly arbitrary way. Not only is there a minority of color perceivers who are anomalous (only slightly, but appreciably so) with respect to normal observers, but there is a considerable statistical spread even within the group of normal observers. For example, the reflectance profile for unique green will differ for different members of the ‘normal group’. One can decide, of course, on a standard and fix one reflectance profile as green, but the procedure is highly arbitrary. As we have seen, there are few interesting causal powers associated with colors apart from the way objects affect perceivers. (This argument has led to a vigorous debate in the pages of Analysis, see Byrne and Hilbert 2006; Cohen, Hardin and McLaughlin 2006a,b; and Tye 2006a,b, 2007.)

To counter this problem, McLaughlin suggests that we extend a proposal, which Jackson and Pargetter 1987 made, originally to overcome the problem of multiple realizations. They proposed relativising the concept of color, to kinds of objects and circumstances. McLaughlin's suggestion is that we could extend the objectivist concept of color, by relativising it to individual observers.

Another major objection to the physicalist (reductive) account concerns whether the properties can satisfy the principle of ‘Unity’, as described by M. Johnston, (see section 2.2). This principle points to the fact that the various colors, it would seem, are the kinds of properties that fit together in characteristic ways to form structured color arrays, with a distinctive 3-dimensional character, built on attributes such as hue/saturation/brightness (or hue, chroma, lightness). The principle of Unity would seem to pose a serious problem for the Color Physicalist (see Hardin 1988; Thompson 1995; Maund 1995, 2011).

As McLaughlin concedes, the problem is

that no physical properties that are even remotely plausible candidates for being the properties essentially participate in these patterns of relationships.

His solution to the problem is that the comparative claims, e.g., about red, orange and blue—orange is more similar to red than to blue—are true in virtue of a comparative fact about the visual experiences in question.

Colors themselves participate in the similarity and difference relationships derivatively—in virtue of the participation of the visual experiences that they dispose their bearers to produce. (McLaughlin 2003, p. 487)

The claim, here, is that what it is like to for something to look red is more similar to what it is like for something to look orange than it is to what it is like for something to look blue.

This solution, however, raises the question of what features of the experience are relevant ones, i.e., are the features which stand in the relations of similarity and difference. There seem to be two possibilities: (i) they are features of the experiences themselves; (ii) they are features presented in experience or represented in them, i.e., they are features of regions of visual fields, or of sensa, or of material objects. There are some prima facie problems which ensue. Assuming the former possibility, then our color experiences involve massive error. The judgments of similarity and difference are applied to the colors and not to our experiences.

If the second possibility is adopted, i.e., it is held that there are certain features, presented in, or represented in, experience, then they stand in the relations of similarities and differences. These features are different from reflectances, so the color physicalist needs to say what they are. McLaughlin hasn't told us what they are.

Tye and Byrne and Hilbert have proposed a solution to this last problem, one that depends on exploiting the opponent-processing model of color vision (see section 4, above). It is to specify the relevant groups of spectral reflectances, associated with each color, in terms of their capacity to produce suitable responses of the visual system. The argument, by Byrne and Hilbert, proceeds in two steps: (1) it is argued that color experience are characterised as having a certain representational content: they represent objects as having what Byrne and Hilbert call ‘hue’ magnitudes; (2) the hue-magnitudes are explained in terms of being certain physical properties. As they argue, if we can give the right account of how the magnitudes contribute to the representational content, then we can explain the similarity relations among the hues and the binary/unique distinction, in terms of the content of color experience.

The opponent processing model, when applied to light with a fixed spectral power distribution (SPD), links three quantities/properties: (1) the degree of stimulation of the long, medium and short wave cones (L, M, and S) in the retina; (2) the signals (red-green, yellow-blue and black-white) based on comparison of the cone outputs, and (3) the ‘red responses’, ‘green responses’, etc., induced by the signals (see section 4). As a result, we can define three types of light-intensities, associated with the three types of cones, for that SPD: the light's L-intensity is the degree to which it stimulates the L-cones; analogously, for the M-intensity and S-intensity. Accordingly, it is proposed, we can specify the hue-magnitudes (which are represented in the experiences) in terms of a combination of relevant light-intensities. Taking unique red, as an illustrative example, the proposal is that an object is unique red if and only if, under an equal energy illuminant, it would reflect light with a greater L-intensity than M-intensity and with a S-intensity equal to the sum of its L- and M-intensities.

More generally, we get the result:

an object has some value of R iff, under an equal energy illuminant, it would reflect light with greater L-intensity than M—intensity—the greater the difference, the higher the value of R. And similarly for the other magnitudes. [p. 20]

Accordingly, Byrne and Hilbert argue, we can specify physical properties that will explain the unique hues, and will stand in the right relations of similarity and difference that hold between the hues.

A measure of the discussion this argument has inspired can be found in the extent and range of entries in the Commentary, which is published with Byrne and Hilbert's article in Behavioral and Brain Sciences (2003). One of the important issues concerns the fact that the proposal depends on there being a viable naturalistic account of how visual experiences carry representational content and, as Byrne and Hilbert concede, no satisfactory account as been provided.

6.4 Color Eliminativism/Irrealism/Fictionalism

There is a group of views about color, which come under one or all of the labels, Color Irrealism, Color Eliminativism, Color Fictionalism. These all share the view that, there are no colours in the external world, or more precisely, that physical bodies do not have the colors that we ordinarily and unreflectingly take the bodies to have. These views are usually committed to an ‘Error theory’ of visual color experience. Indeed the theories are often referred to as ‘Error theories’ of color. Prominent contemporary defenders of variants of this view are Hardin 1988, Boghossian and Velleman 1989/1997, Averill 2005, and Maund 1995, 2006, 2011. Earlier defenders were Galileo, Descartes, Locke and others.

The most general argument for Color Irrealism/Eliminativism is addressed to the ordinary conception of color (and the use of ordinary color terms.) The argument, in brief is that these colors are properties of such a character, that there is good reason to think, are not actualized. No physical body has the colors (or, at a minimum, there is no reason to think that they have such properties). The most straightforward view of colors, it is argued, is that they are what they seem. Colors are properties that make themselves manifest in perception. In other words, the ordinary concept of color is captured by that philosophical view known as ‘Color Primitivism’. However, it is argued, there are no such qualities possessed by the objects perceived. The reason is that there are certain other items of knowledge that, it would seem, these properties need to satisfy: colors are properties with certain kinds of causal powers, vis a vis the presentation of color in the perception, recognition and identification of colors. Crucially, colors are the kinds of properties that fit together in characteristic ways to form structured color arrays, with a distinctive 3-dimensional character, built on attributes such as hue/saturation/brightness (or hue, chroma, lightness). It turns out, so the argument runs, that there are in fact no such colors in nature. There simply are no properties that both have the causal powers in question and which collectively have the right character. Objects are presented in experience as having colors which they do not have.

Neither the properties posited by the Primitivist, nor those posited by the Color Physicalist, it is argued, can satisfy all the required constraints, for being colors. As we saw in the last two sections, both sorts of theorists have a response to this objection. The debate between the Color Eliminativists and their opponents will thus depend on the plausibility of such responses, and counter-responses (see the earlier sections 6.2, 6.3). As far as Primitivist Realism is concerned, one central issue is this. The defense of this position, it seems, would need to appeal to some version of Naïve Realism, and/or Disjunctivism, and there are strong arguments against these accounts. For example it is not clear how these accounts can handle the fact that many of our experiences have both veridical and illusory elements: the Muller-Lyer lines look unequal, when they are not; but they also look thin, and look to be in front of me, and look black. Another important issue is the one Hardin 2004, 2008 and Cohen 2009 raise: that it depends on some non-arbitrary identification of standard conditions, and normal observers, one that cannot be satisfied.

Most versions of Color Eliminativism/Irrealism commit one to an error theory of visual experience. As Boghossian and Velleman put it: “visual experience is ordinarily naively realistic, in the sense that the qualities presented in it are represented as qualities of the external world” (1989/1997, p.93; see also Averill 2005; Maund 2011). This leads them to explain how this happens by adopting a Projectivist account of color experience:

The projection posited by this account has the result that the intentional content of visual experience represents external objects as possessing qualities that belong, in fact, only to regions of the visual field. By ‘gilding or staining all natural objects with the colors borrowed from internal sentiments’, as Hume puts it, the mind ‘raises in a manner a new creation’. (Boghossian and Velleman 1989/1997, p. 95)

In ordinary color experience, it is implied, physical objects are represented (or presented) as having a certain qualities that are illusory, and accordingly, that experience involve errors. It is important to keep in mind that such claims are not simply negative. Illusions and errors can serve positive functions. The claim that experiences represent objects as having qualities with a certain character, can explain why we form the concepts we do, why we identify and recognize objects, and so on. This means that it is still the case that there are important reasons for retaining our ordinary color concepts, even though they are not actualized.

This fact is a reflection of the fact that Eliminativism or Irrealism, on any topic, comes in different forms. The most extreme is one that involves the claim not only that there are no X's, but also which dispenses with the need either to retain a concept of X, or a system of concepts built around claims about X's, or to retain the language and vocabulary, with which those concepts were originally expressed. There are other forms of Eliminativism/Irrealism, however. Two stand out. With one form, we conclude that there are no X's, but either recommend, or at least allow, that there is a legitimate place for thought about X's or other intentional attitudes, i.e., for concepts of X, and/or the use of linguistic terms with their original meanings. This form can be thought of as variety of Fictionalism. With the second form, we argue that we can retain the original linguistic terms, but we give them novel meanings. That is to say, we use them to express different concepts. That is to say, we are providing rational reconstructions. As we saw in section 1, this seems to be what Descartes was proposing.

Thus it is possible to consistently hold that there are, in the world, certain qualities that deserve to be called ‘colors’, though, of course, they are not colors, as understood in the traditional sense. The reason why we can adopt both theses is that there may be different purposes served by having different concepts. Given that this is so, there may be reason for maintaining an existing concept, for one set of purposes, while revising the concepts for another set of purposes. Accordingly, a Color Fictionalist might very well hold that there is a place, in certain contexts, for adopting a reconstructed concept, e.g., a concept of colors as dispositional properties, or alternatively, as relational properties. Maund 2011 presents just such a theory.

The illusory theory, and other error theories, of colors may be thought to leave us with a problem. If there are no properties that satisfy the requirements for being colors: how did the ordinary concept develop? A plausible solution to this problem is found in the fact that the way that the concepts of color operate, to serve their various functions and roles, is through the way colors appear. For these purposes and roles, objects do not need the actual colors. It will be sufficient if they appear to have colors. For these purposes, it is sufficient that “it is as if they have the colors”.

6.5 Color Dispositionalism

Color-Dispositionalism is the view that colors are dispositional properties: powers to appear in distinctive ways to perceivers (of the right kind), in the right kind of circumstances; i.e., to cause experiences of an appropriate kind in those circumstances. Because they involve responses on the part of color-perceivers, such theories are often called ‘subjectivist’.

This theory takes different forms. One form it takes is that associated with people in the scientific tradition, e.g., Descartes, Boyle, Newton and Locke. This is the view that colors are secondary qualities. However, as we saw earlier, in Section 1.2, this form of the dispositionalist view was part of a complex package, related to the emerging scientific world-view. For our current purposes, there are two crucial components tot his package. The first is the idea that we should distinguish between two notions of color: color as a property of physical bodies, and color as it is in sensation (or, as it is sometimes described, ‘color-as-we-see-it’). The second is that the secondary quality view is not thought of as capturing the common-sense, or ‘vulgar’, way of thinking of color. Rather, it is thought of as a revision or reconstruction of the ordinary concept.

There is a different form the dispositionalist view of colors has more recently taken, and which has many philosophical defenders, e.g., Bennett 1971, Dummett 1979, McDowell 1985, McGinn 1983, Peacocke 1984/1997, Johnston 1992/1997, and Levin 2000. These philosophers reject the claim that the dispositionalist view is in conflict with any commonsense view of color. It is held by some that dispositionalism can be defended as an analytic thesis, concerning the meaning of color terms; it is held, or implied, by others that possession of the concept of color is neutral on the precise nature of the colors, a nature which consists in being dispositional. One virtue of this account is that, if correct, there is no need to agree that science is in conflict with our intuitive notions of color, or that it shows that ordinary color talk is mistaken, or in need of reconstruction. Another virtue would be that it would explain what seems to be an important feature of color concepts, as opposed to primary quality concepts: that in order to grasp, fully, color concepts, it is necessary to have color experiences.

A prominent defender of dispositionalism is Johnston, whose account of the major constraints upon a theory of color we examined in an earlier section. As we saw, he concedes that dispositionalism has difficulty handling the constraint imposed by commitment to the doctrine of Revelation but, he thinks, giving this up is a small price to pay. He maintains that, nevertheless, the theory can handle all the other constraints, and in so doing has major advantage over rival accounts. One of the theory's merits is that it can account for the Principle of Unity, item (3) in his list, although as we have seen, this principle needs to be extended. Another merit of Johnston's version of dispositionalism is that it handles what seems to be a difficulty for other versions, the problem of explaining the causal role of color in the perception of colors, that is to say, the problem of meeting constraint (2) on his list:

  1. Explanation. The fact of a surface or volume or radiant source being canary yellow sometimes causally explains our visual experience as of canary yellow things.

It has been argued that dispositionalist accounts of color cannot handle this causal requirement, e.g., Jackson (1998). Johnston's reply to this objection is that the dispositions do not have to be thought of as bare dispositions. We can, instead, think of them as ‘constituted dispositions’, which are thought of as follows:

A constituted disposition is a higher-order property of having some intrinsic properties which, oddities aside, would cause the manifestation of the disposition in the circumstances of manifestation. (Johnston 1992/1997, p. 147)

Thus it is part of what it is to have a constituted disposition to have some property, which is the causal ground of the manifestation of the disposition.

There have been two major objections to dispositionalism. These were forcefully presented by Colin McGinn 1996 in a paper in which he renounces his earlier advocacy of the dispositionalist view (McGinn 1983). One objection is that the dispositionalist theory cannot give a satisfactory account of the phenomenology of visual color experiences. Let us come back to this objection. The second major problem, he claims, is that it cannot dissolve what many think is the central problem of dispositionalism, the problem of characterizing just what the colors of objects are supposed to be, “without vacuity, circularity, regress or any other such damaging vice” (McGinn 1996, p. 162). The circularity problem reflects the way the dispositionalist thesis is usually formulated:

X is red = X has the disposition to look red _ to normal perceivers, in standard conditions.

If we understand the phrase ‘to look red’, on the right hand side, to mean ‘to look to be red’, then it would seem we have troubles. As McGinn puts it:

If an object is red iff it's disposed to look red (under appropriate conditions), then an object must be disposed to look red iff it's disposed to look to be disposed to look red … and so on, ad infinitum.

One way to avoid this problem is to take ‘red’ on the right hand side as having a different sense from ‘red’ on the left hand side. For example, one might take it to have the sense that primitivists describe, though, in contrast to those theorists, hold that physical objects do not have colors in this sense. In other words, one adopts an error theory, with respect to perceptual experience. A different way to avoid the circularity problem is to take ‘to look red to A’, on the right hand side to involve a special unstructured sense, which is different from its normal sense. That is to say, the phrase should be interpreted as ‘to look-redly to A’, or as it is sometimes put, ‘for A to be visually-appeared-to-redly’. The choice between these two ways of avoiding circularity is likely to depend on how well each can handle the phenomenological problem that we have temporarily set aside.

A different solution to the circularity problem is that provided by Peacocke's distinctive version of dispositionalism. Peacocke defends what he calls an ‘experientialist's version’ of the theory, one which requires the introduction of a third property, besides those of being red, and looking red—a sensational property, that of being red*. According to this account, the property red is explained not in terms of looking red, but in terms of causing the perceiver to have presented to him, sensational properties in a visual field. The theory is as follows:

The experientialist can say that when a normal human sees a red object in daylight, there is a certain property possessed by a region of his visual field in which that object is presented to him. This property we can label ‘red*’: the canonical form is that region r of the visual field is red* in token experience e. (Peacocke 1984/1997, p. 58)

Importantly, according to this account, the person who has mastered the predicate ‘red’ is someone who is disposed to apply it to an object when the region of one's visual field is red*, and circumstances are apparently normal. The person does not need to have a concept of being red*: all that is required is that she is sensitive to the presence of red* and she can be that without having the concept being red*.

This position escapes the problem of circularity, which threatens those dispositionalist accounts that define being red in terms of looking red. However, it still faces the question of whether it can give an adequate account of the phenomenology of perceptual experience. Boghossian and Velleman 1989/1997 argue that it cannot. They think he is right to posit a visual field with intrinsic sensational properties (and give supporting arguments). What they question, however, is his insistence that the colours of external objects are still seen as dispositions. The reason, they say, is that visual experience does not ordinarily distinguish between qualities of field representing objects and qualities of the objects represented. Visual experience is ordinarily naively realistic, in the sense that the qualities presented in it are represented as qualities of the external world (Boghossian and Velleman 1989/1997, p. 93).

This phenomenological problem is similar to the other major objection that McGinn levels at dispositionalist theories, more generally. As he expresses the point, color properties do not look much like dispositions to produce color experiences, so that an error theory of color perception comes to seem inescapable. Colors turn out not to look the way they are said dispositionally to be, “which is to say that ordinary color perception is intrinsically and massively misleading” (McGinn 1996, p. 537). Rather than adopting a dispositionalism with that consequence, McGinn falls back on a Primitivist view of color, a view that resists both criticisms leveled at dispositonalism.

Levin 2000 has provided a powerful reply, on behalf of the dispositionalist, to McGinn's argument. Her challenge is complex, highlighting the assumptions that underpin McGinn's criticism (and has a detailed discussion of the relevance of the doctrine of Revelation). An important question seems to remain, however. In McGinn's formulation of the phenomenological problem, there are two distinct claims, each of which is crucial:

Colors do not look like the sorts of dispositional properties they would have to be if the dispositional thesis were correct; “Colors turn out not to look the way they are said dispositionally to be”.
colors look like non-dispositional properties: when we see an object as red we see it as having a simple, monadic, local property of the object's surface.

The second claim is expanded as follows:

When we see an object as red … [the] color is perceived as intrinsic to the object, in much the same way that shape and size are perceived as intrinsic. No relation to perceivers enters into how the color appears; the color is perceived as wholly on the object, not as somehow straddling the gap between it and the perceiver. (McGinn 1996, pp. 541–542)

One possibility that this claim raises is that even if it is true, as Levin argues, that our visual experiences are such that objects look to have dispositional properties of the sort the colour-dispositionalist is committed to, it will also be the case (often at least) that the colored objects look to be manifesting that disposition. McGinn's claim (2) may then apply to the manifestation of the disposition. If so, the dispositionalism would seem to be allied to an error theory, as he suggests.

Finally, another difficulty with dispositionalism, as it is standardly expressed, is the one that Hardin 1998, 2004 has stressed. As our knowledge of color vision has grown, it has become increasingly more difficult to specify normal observers, and standard viewing conditions in any but an arbitrary way, arbitrary from the point of view of metaphysics. To be sure, there are conventional reasons for picking out some observers and some viewing conditions as special, but we can, without too much trouble, imagine these changing. And with respect to normal observers, we have found that in fact, as things stand, there is a wide range of variation among competent color perceivers. As we shall see in the following section, these considerations have led Cohen to modify the standard dispositionalist account in favor of a ‘more ecumenical’ color relationalist theory, one that relativises the dispositions to groups of perceivers, and types of viewing conditions.

6.6 Color Relationalism

One of the most important developments in recent philosophy of color has been the emergence of a radical relationalist view of colors. Averill 1992 proposed a relational view of color, one that can be thought of as a radical modification of the standard dispositional position. He presents two arguments against both physicalist and dispositionalist accounts, which depend on raising difficult questions for their dependence on normal observers and standard viewing conditions. In their place, he offers an account according to which colors of bodies are relational properties. In explanation, he asks us to:

Suppose that ‘yellow’ is regarded as a relational term having two suppressed argument places, one argument takes populations as values and ties any instance of being yellow to the normal observers of a population, the other takes environments as values and ties any instance of being yellow to the optimal viewing conditions of an environment. (Averill 1992, p. 555)

Cohen 2004, 2009 holds a similar position, though he has produced a more general argument. For Cohen, Color Relationalism is the metaphysical thesis that colors are relational properties of a certain sort—relational with respect to perceivers and circumstances of viewing. According to Color Relationalism, there are no such properties as blue, red, yellow, orange, etc. To be more precise, there are no such properties as blue simpliciter, red simpliciter, and so on. What there are, instead, are relational properties: blue-for-perceiver A-in-circumstances C1, red-for-perceiver B-in-circumstances C2, yellow-for-perceiver D-in-circumstances C3, and so on.

At the heart of Cohen's account is a certain argument, which he calls his ‘Master Argument’. This argument depends on pointing out the extent to which the colors things look to have, vary with different viewing conditions, different classes of perceivers, and different types of animals. In short, it is built upon the premise that there is a vast range of situations in which there are variations in the way something looks, either to the same subject under different viewing conditions, or to different subjects under the same conditions.

Then follows the crucial question: Can we select one amongst these perceptual variants that should be regarded as veridically representing the color of the object (where this would mean that the other variants are representing the object's color erroneously)? It is just this question, Cohen suggests, to which it is difficult to imagine a well-motivated, principled, and non-question-begging answer, and thus leads to the formulation of the Master Argument. Given that there is no well-motivated reason for singling out any single variant (at the expense of the others), he argues, an ecumenical reconciliation of the variants is preferable to an unmotivated stipulation in favor of just one of them. He concludes: the best way to implement such an ecumenical reconciliation between apparently incompatible variants is to view them as the result of relativizing colors to different values of different parameters (Cohen 2009, p. 24).

The thrust of the Master Argument, powerful as it is, is largely negative. It seems to rebut all objectivist theories of color, whether the objectivist theory is one of the standard forms of color realism—physicalist realism or primitivist realism—or whether it is framed in terms of a disposition to appear, in characteristic ways, to normal perceivers in standard circumstances. On the face of it, only two candidates remain: Color Relationalism and Color Irrealism. Cohen holds that Color Relationalism provides the best solution to the problem outlined, but he concedes that Color Irrealism also offers a solution. He thinks that that view ought to be rejected, on independent grounds. The argument against Color Irrealism is that it is a ‘theory of last resort’, one that we should accept only after all other candidates have been rejected, when no other alternative remains.

6.7 Action-Based Theories of Color

There are other forms of color relationalism which have links to action-based theories of perception, as developed principally by the psychologist, J. J. Gibson. A leading example is the theory defended by Evan Thompson, the Ecological View of Colors. On this account, colors are taken to be dependent, in part, on the perceiver and so are not intrinsic properties of a perceiver-independent world. Being colored, instead, is construed as a relational property of the environment, connecting the environment with the perceiving animal. In the case of the color of physical surfaces, “being colored corresponds to the surface spectral reflectance as visually perceived by the animal” (Thompson 1995, Ch. 5, pp. 242–50).

In more detail this account is spelled out in the following way: “being colored a particular determinate color or shade is equivalent to having a particular spectral reflectance, illuminance, or emittance that looks that color to a particular perceiver in specific viewing conditions” (p. 245). Thompson insists that this account is to be distinguished from both a Lockean dispositionalist account and an error theory of colors. Whether it is or not will depend on how what account he can give of “as visually perceived by the animal”.

One of the most important recent contributions to the philosophy of color is the book by Matthen 2005. In this work, Matthen articulates a theory of sense-perception in which color plays a prominent role. The work is significant for the theory of color that he presents, one that draws heavily on comparative studies of color vision among different species. Matthen replaces his earlier objectivist views on color by an account that has more in common with the ecological theory favored by Thompson. Matthen agrees with Hardin, Thompson and others that the phenomenology of color is not captured, or accounted for, by any of the standard objectivist accounts. Nevertheless, he claims to be defending a realist theory of color and to be rejecting standard irrealist theories, including Hardin's. Matthen's account is complex. The idea is that the senses (the visual sensory system) do categorize objects as ‘blue’, ‘yellow’, etc., but these qualities are related to actions that perceivers can perform, and in particular, to ‘epistemic affordances’.

The sensory systems are held to be devices that are in the business of classifying distal stimuli (physical objects) as having certain properties, which stand in similarity and difference relations with each other. These categories are constructed by the system and do not, at least in the case of color, correspond to any objective properties that are independent of perceivers. When one has an experience of blue, then this state is a visual signal that system provides—a signal that it has classified the object as blue. In such a circumstance the object looks blue. This leaves us with the problem of saying what exactly it is for something to be blue. Matthen explains what it is, through his theory of ‘primary content’ of visual experiences, that is, in terms of the actions the perceiver is prepared to make on the basis of having the visual state. Where Matthen's account is distinctive is that for him, these actions are epistemic actions. As he says: x and y resemble each other in color if there is a color based epistemic practice E such that the color looks presented by x and y signal that x and y are to be treated as equivalent with regard to E. The crucial question is whether what Matthen means by ‘color’ is the same as what others mean, especially the main opponents. He defines color-vision in a functional way, so that it covers comparative studies, i.e., so that it applies to honey bees, humans, pigeons, and so on. Accordingly, color is defined in a functional way:

A color classification is one that is generated from the processing of difference of wavelength reaching the eye, and available to normal color perceivers by such processing. (p. 167)

On this account, there is no set of properties that color vision is always characterizing (as color) and there is no class of types of experience that any color perceiver must possess.


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