Determinables and Determinates

First published Tue Feb 7, 2017

Determinables and determinates are in the first instance type-level properties that stand in a distinctive specification relation: the ‘determinable-determinate’ relation (for short, ‘determination’). For example, color is a determinable having red, blue, and other specific shades of color as determinates; shape is a determinable having rectangular, oval, and other specific (including many irregular) shapes as determinates; mass is a determinable having specific mass values as determinates. Reflecting that determinables admit of different degrees or levels of specification, characterization of a property as determinable or determinate is typically relative; for example, red is a determinate of color and a determinable of scarlet.

The determination relation appears to differ from other specification relations. In contrast with the genus-species and conjunct-conjunction relations, where the more specific property can be understood as a conjunction of the less specific property and some independent property or properties, a determinate is not naturally treated in conjunctive terms (red is not a conjunctive property having color and some other property or properties as conjuncts); and in contrast with the disjunction-disjunct relation, where disjuncts may be dissimilar and compatible (as with red or round), determinates of a determinable (at a given level of specificity) are both similar and incompatible (red and blue are similar in both being colors; nothing can be simultaneously and uniformly both red and blue). Supporting this latter contrast is that our thoughts about determinables do not appear to be about (potentially infinite) disjunctions of determinates, and our perceptions of properties such as color and shape do not appear to be of maximal determinates, as would be the case if determinables were disjunctions of determinates (since every instance of a disjunction is an instance of a disjunct).

Of course, appearances can be deceiving, and there are strategies for treating determinables and their mode of specification in deflationary terms. Whether these strategies succeed or fail is no small issue. For the seemingly distinctive character of determinables and determination may enter into the best case for the claim that there are genuine features of reality that are less than maximally specific—a claim which, if true, has profound implications for a wide range of philosophical issues.

What follows is organized into five sections. In §1, we trace key points of the historical trajectory whereby determination came to be seen as a distinctive form of specification. In §2, we present the commonly advanced features of determinables, determinates, and their relation; here also we discuss extensions of the (realistically construed) relation to ontological categories beyond properties. In §3, we sketch the main anti-realist, reductionist, and non-reductionist accounts of determinables and determinates, saying how these aim to accommodate the seeming features of determinables and determinates, and flagging key concerns and responses; here also we discuss certain accounts of the structure or logic of determination. In §4 we consider reasons for and against thinking that determinates are metaphysically prior to determinables. In §5 we present three applications of these notions, on which the distinctive features of determinables and/or determinates are seen as key to understanding physical laws of nature, mental/higher-level causation, and metaphysical indeterminacy.

1. Historical treatments

The following historical trajectory motivates the characteristic features and certain treatments of determinables and determinates; those interested in cutting to the contemporary chase can skip to §2 with little loss of continuity.

The terminology of determinables and determinates stems from ancient and scholastic treatment of the definition of a species, as analyzable into two parts: a genus, or generic part of an essence—the pars determinabilis essentiae, and the differentia, or differentiating part of an essence—the pars determinans essentiae. As we’ll see, the terminology and its original application eventually went separate ways, with the genus-species relation standardly being treated in conjunctive terms (with a given species being identified with the conjunction of a genus and one or more differentia), and determination being treated as a distinctive non-conjunctive specification relation.[1]

1.1 Aristotle

Some recent commentators have suggested that the notion of determination has a precursor in ancient times. For example, one commentator has proposed that Aristotle’s preferred treatment of the relation between kinds and forms (a.k.a. genus and species) involves key features of determination (Granger 1984). Granger suggests that Aristotle’s conception of a form/species evolves from a conjunctive conception (as in Topics VI.3. 140a27–29) to one on which differentia entail their associated kind/genus rather than conjunctively supplementing it. Granger motivates the non-conjunctive conception on grounds that “Aristotle clearly maintains that [...] the genus does not exist apart from its species, or exists merely as matter” (1984: 15); in turn, he takes this conception to indicate that

genus and differentia are best viewed in terms of determinable and determinate. […] A determinate […] is not a conjunction of its determinable and something else logically distinct from its determinable. (1984: 19)

Salmieri (2008) offers further support for this interpretation, citing another important feature of determination—namely, that determinates differ specifically in respect of their determinable. As Salmieri puts it,

Certain things are not merely other than one another—as blue is other to both loud and inflation—but are different from or “opponent to” one another, as blue is different from red. (2008: 78)

And he sees this distinction as operative in Aristotle’s (Metaphysics I.3-4) remarks:

But difference (διαφορὰ) and otherness (ἐτερότης) are distinct (ἄλλο). For, while the other and that which it is other than are not necessarily other in something (for everything that is some being is either other or the same), the different differs from something in something, so that it’s necessary for there to be something the same in which they differ. This same thing is a kind or form; for every different thing differs either {i} in kind or {ii} in form [...]. (1054b22–31 cf. 1018a9–15; translation quoted from Salmieri 2008, 79)

The previous features—non-conjunctive entailment of the less by the more specific, the specification’s being somehow “in respect of” the less specific, and the more specific features’ being opponent to one other—are indeed characteristic features of determination, contrasting with the conjunct-conjunction and disjunction-disjunct relations (modulo deflationary strategies; we won’t always carry this qualification forward). As such, there is at least a case here for Salmieri’s claim that “we ought to recognise Aristotle as the originator of this distinction” (2008: 79).

1.2 The Moderns

Throughout the scholastic and modern periods the genus-species and genus-differentia relations are often treated in what Prior (1949) calls “a confused blending” of the conjunct-conjunction and determination relations. In the modern period motivations for distinguishing the latter relations become increasingly salient.

One motivation stems from Leibniz’s observation that a conjunctive treatment of the genus-species relation does not fix a direction of specification, since one can as easily take the differentia to be the genus, as vice versa (see Nouveaux Essais, III, iii, 10, Langley’s translation, 313). Johnson (1924) interprets Descartes and Spinoza as attempting to ensure asymmetry by means of attributes and modes (see Descartes, Principles of Philosophy I.53; Spinoza, Ethics 1p8s1 and Ep. 50), which Johnson suggests are “almost equivalent” to the notions of determinable and determinate:

What I call a determinable is almost equivalent to what they call an attribute, and my determinate almost equivalent to their mode of an attribute. (1924: III, v. 1)

Prior (1949) similarly sees Spinoza as aiming to ensure asymmetry by means of something like determination:

If Leibniz brought consistency into the medieval view of the distinctness of genus and differentia by making the relation between them symmetrical, Spinoza brought consistency into the medieval view of the asymmetry of the relation between them by denying their distinctness. Spinoza’s “modes” are not new qualities added to his “attributes”, or qualities formed by the addition of something else to them, but determinations of them. (1949: 7)

Prior also sees Locke as relying on the distinctive incompatibility of same-level determinates as making sense of why “any subject may have of each sort of primary qualities but one particular at once”, and similarly for “all sensible ideas peculiar to each sense” (Locke, Essay, IV iii 5).

In the work of Locke and other empiricists, we also see precursors of certain contemporary anti-realist or reductivist accounts on which determinable attributions either indeterminately refer to determinate properties (as Berkeley [1710] suggests, more generally, for ‘abstract’ terms), or on which determinable attributions are (merely) ways of classifying determinates. Prior’s description of Locke’s view might be seen as compatible with either approach:

Though we speak of an object as colored, what is there being referred to is not really a quality of the object but a quality of one of its qualities; what is meant is that one of its qualities belongs to the class “colors”. (Prior 1949: 8–9)

1.3 Johnson

The terminology of ‘determinables’ and ‘determinates’ as indicative of a distinctive relation is first found in Volume I, Chapter XI—‘The Determinable’—of W. E. Johnson’s Logic (1921):

I propose to call such terms as color and shape determinables in relation to such terms as red and circular which will be called determinates; and, in introducing this new terminology, to examine the distinction between the relation of red to color and the relation of Plato to man …. (1921: I, xi, 1)

Johnson’s discussion is also the first systematic attempt to characterize the key features of determinables, determinates, and their relation (see esp. 1921: 173–185), though as below, he is not always clear about whether these features apply to properties or rather to predicates. See Prior (1949) and Poli (2004) for detailed discussion of Johnson’s views and his influence on later authors.

Some of these features are familiar, including that determination is a specification relation:

To predicate color or shape of an object obviously characterises it less determinately than to predicate of it red or circular; (Johnson 1921: I, xi, 1)

that this specification is non-conjunctive:

there is a genuine difference between that process of increased determination which conjunctivally introduces foreign adjectives, and that other process by which without increasing, so to speak, the number of adjectives, we define them more determinately;[2] (Johnson 1921: I, xi, 3)

that same-level determinates are incompatible:

if any determinate adjective characterises a given substantive, then it is impossible that any other determinate under the same determinable should characterise the same substantive; (Johnson 1921: I, xi, 4)

and that same-level determinates are moreover “opponent”:

the unique and peculiar kind of difference that subsists between the several determinates under the same determinable […] does not subsist between any one of them and an adjective under some other determinable. (Johnson 1921: I, xi, 1)

Johnson moreover develops these features, suggesting, for example, that opponent differences often reflect that determinates are comparable:

many determinates under the same determinable [are such] that the differences between different pairs of determinates can be compared with one another […]; e.g. the difference between red and yellow is greater than that between red and orange. (Johnson 1921: I, xi, 4)

Attention to determinate comparability leads Johnson to suggest that determinables may be determined along multiple “dimensions”:

[A] color may vary according to its hue, brightness and saturation; so that the precise determination of a color requires us to define three variables which are more or less independent of one another in their capacity of co-variation; but in one important sense they are not independent of one another, since they could not be manifested in separation. The determinate color is therefore single, though complex …. (1921: I, xi, 4)

That determinables may have multiple determination dimensions is an important observation, which plays a foundational role in Funkhouser’s (2006) model of determination (see §3.6.1).

Two other aspects of Johnson’s discussion are worth noting. First, he denies that determinables are in any sense shared by determinates: “the ground for grouping determinates under one and the same determinable is not any partial agreement between them” but rather “the special kind of difference” (1921: I, xi, 1) distinguishing opposing determinates.[3] As we’ll see, this is a choice point for contemporary accounts. Second, Johnson assumes that while limits in our perceptual or instrumental capabilities require that we characterize objects in determinable terms, it is nonetheless a

universally adopted postulate that the characters of things which we can only characterise more or less indeterminately, are, in actual fact, absolutely determinate. (1921: I, xi, 5)

The assumption that determinable characterization reflects (mere) epistemic, perceptual, or representational limits remains common, and pushes towards giving one or other deflationary account of determinables. This is another choice point: on some contemporary accounts determinables are both real and irreducible to determinates.

1.4 Contemporary additions and refinements

In this sub-section, we discuss certain comparatively recent contributions which influentially shaped the present understanding of determination.

Prior’s (1949) two-part discussion of determinables and determinates is historically rich and philosophically subtle. Interestingly, he suggests that the difference between determinates is brute, admitting no explanation:

we can say that the red and the blue agree in being colored, but of their difference we can only say either that their color is different, or that one is red and the other blue. (1949: 5–6)

Some have seen this sort of statement as broadly contradictory, in suggesting that what makes determinates similar (e.g., color) is also that in virtue of which they are different (“of their difference we can only say … that their color is different”); see §3.2.

Prior also considers and rejects Johnson’s assumption that determinates are similar only in respect to their unique form of difference, rather suggesting (c.f. Salmieri’s discussion of Aristotle, above) that determinates are similar “in respect of” that determinable:

[I]t seems to me that determinates under the same determinable have a class unity […]. Determinates under the same determinable have the common relational property […] of characterising whatever they do characterise in a certain respect. Redness, blueness, etc., all characterise objects, as we say, “in respect of their color”; triangularity, squareness, etc., “in respect of their shape”. And this is surely quite fundamental to the notion of being a determinate under a determinable. (1949: 13)

That determinates characterize objects in respect of their determinables is indeed a key feature of determination, though there remains disagreement about how best to metaphysically articulate this feature (e.g., as involving shared determinables or not).

Prior takes this feature to push against deflationary approaches on which determinables exist, at best, merely to classify the having of determinate properties. On the contrary, he maintains, if determinates are unified by characterizing objects in a certain respect, then

the “respects in which objects are to be characterised”, to which determinable adjectives refer, are related to the objects not less but more intimately than the determinate qualities which “characterise” them. (1949: 13)

Moving on, Searle (1959) usefully highlights that determination appears to contrast not just with the conjunct-conjunction relation, but also with the disjunction-disjunct relation:

[C]learly not any two terms which stand in the relation of greater to less specific ipso stand in the relation of determinate to determinable: “yellow” is in some sense more specific than “yellow or angry” but it is not a determinate of “yellow or angry” in the sense in which it is a determinate of “color”. (1959: 141–2)

Searle also offers an explicit criterion of determination:

For any two terms \(A\) and \(B\), \(A\) is a determinate of \(B\) if and only if \(A\) is a non-conjunctive specifier of \(B\), and \(A\) is logically related to all other non-conjunctive specifiers of \(B\) [where] any two terms are logically [i.e., conceptually] related if either entails the other or either entails the negation of the other. (1959: 148)

Interestingly, this criterion doesn’t rule out that \(B\) is a disjunction of its determinates (‘non-conjunctive specifiers’), so long as the determinates stand in the requisite conceptual entailment relations. Note also that Searle moves fluidly between talk of determinable properties and talk of determinable ‘terms’; until recently, this sort of slide was common.

Searle notes, as well, that the structure of determinables and determinates in the same family may give rise to “levels” of determinates ordered by degree of specificity; as he says, “we would like some way of showing that e.g., “red” and “yellow” are on the same level as determinates of “color” whereas “scarlet” is on a different and lower level” (1959: 145). Here too he offers a criterion:

Two terms \(A\) and \(B\) are same level determinates of \(C\) if and only if they are both determinates of \(C\) and neither is a specifier of the other. (1959: 149)

Next, Armstrong's investigations into the metaphysics of properties (in, e.g., his 1978a,b, 1989, 1997, and 2010) are notable, first, in treating determination as an explicitly metaphysical relation, and second, in raising to salience the important question of whether determinables are ontologically reducible to determinates, asked against the commonly accepted background assumption that reality itself is maximally determinate. As we’ll see, Armstrong’s own position on this score swings from reductionism (1987) to non-reductionism (1997), and back again (2010).

Finally, Yablo’s (1992) is notable in offering a modal account of determination as a relation of asymmetric dependence, and in extending determination to particulars (events) as well as properties. Since asymmetrical necessitation now serves as a common minimal characterization of determination, it’s worth seeing how Yablo motivates this approach. He starts by observing a parallel between intuitive characterizations of identity and of determination, as holding between properties:

\(P\) is identical to \(Q\) iff: for a thing to be \(P\) is for it to be \(Q\).

\(P\) determines \(Q\) iff: for a thing to be \(P\) is for it to be \(Q\), not simpliciter, but in a specific way.

The parallel is useful in suggesting that determination is, like identity, a particularly intimate relation, in that determinables and determinates types and/or tokens may not be wholly distinct, and also in suggesting a modal treatment of determination. Hence just as the characterization of identity is illuminated by the following modal condition (stemming from the principle of the indiscernibility of identicals):

  • (I) \(P\) is identical to \(Q\) only if: necessarily, for all \(x\), \(x\) has \(P\) iff \(x\) has \(Q\).

so too is the characterization of determination illuminated by the following modal condition:

  • (D)\(P\) determines \(Q\) (\(P > Q\)) only if: (i) necessarily, for all \(x\), if \(x\) has \(P\) then \(x\) has \(Q\); and (ii) possibly, for some \(x\), \(x\) has \(Q\) but lacks \(P\).

The parallel also suggests that an account of determination needn’t impose conditions on conceptual entailment relations (as Searle’s did): just as Kripke’s (1980) results undermine the need for a conceptual entailment requirement on identity (e.g., water might be identical with H\(_2\)O even if ‘water’ and ‘H\(_2\)O’ don’t conceptually entail each other), “we should discount the traditional doctrine’s conceptual component and reconceive determination in wholly metaphysical terms” (Yablo 1992: 253). That said, as Yablo admits, asymmetric necessitation alone is insufficient to characterize determination (since, e.g., allowing conjunctions to determine their conjuncts). We will later consider various ways of filling in the modal conditions, including Yablo’s own essence-based approach (§3.5.1).

Yablo’s discussion is also notable in highlighting an important seeming feature of determinables and determinates, according to which they do not causally compete:

[No causal exclusion principle can] apply to determinates and their determinables—for we know that they are not causal rivals. […] any credible reconstruction of the exclusion principle must respect the truism that determinates do not contend with their determinables for causal influence. (1992: 259)

This feature is key to a recently popular strategy for solving the problem of mental causation—an intriguing application which raised to salience the potential usefulness of determination for metaphysical and other philosophical purposes (see §5.2).

2. Features and ontological categories

2.1 Features

We are now in position to list the features commonly taken to characterize determinables, determinates, and their relation;[4] the presentation is in terms of properties, and may require adjustment to apply to entities of other categories (see §2.2). This is not a minimal or axiomatic set: some features follow from others; moreover, there are cases to be made that some of these features do not hold in full generality. In addition, how to metaphysically understand these features varies, in ways we will discuss down the line.

  1. Increased specificity: If \(P\) is a determinate of (‘determines’) \(Q\), then to be \(P\) is to be \(Q\), in a specific way.

    Determination relates properties that are more or less specific, relative to each other. For example, red is a determinate of color; scarlet is a determinate of red.

  2. Irreflexivity, Asymmetry, Transitivity: For no \(P\) does \(P\) determine \(P\); If \(P\) determines \(Q\), then \(Q\) does not determine \(P\); if \(R\) determines \(P\), and \(P\) determines \(Q\), then \(R\) determines \(Q\).

    These features, characteristic of strict partial orderings, follow just from Increased specificity. For example, scarlet does not determine itself, since no property can be more specific than itself. If scarlet determines red, then red does not determine scarlet, since red cannot be both less and more specific than scarlet. And if to be scarlet is to be red, in a specific way, and to be red is to be colored, in a specific way, then to be scarlet is to be a yet more specific way of being colored, such that scarlet determines color.

  3. Relative, leveled determination: Except for minimally specific determinables and maximally specific determinates, a property’s characterization as determinable or determinate is relative. Relatedly, determinables can be determined at different ‘levels’ of specificity.

    For example, red is a determinate of color, but a determinable of scarlet; red, blue, and yellow determine color at one level of specification; scarlet, navy, and buttercup determine color at another (more finely grained) level of specification.

  4. Determination ‘in respect of’ determinables: If \(P\) determines \(Q\), \(P\) is more specific than \(Q\) in respect of \(Q\).

    The increase in specificity associated with determinates is, more specifically, ‘in respect of’ the determinable.[5] For example, if red determines color, red is more specific than color in respect of color. Determination in respect of a determinable is sometimes further explicated as involving specification along one or more ‘determination dimensions’ of the determinable—for example, the determination dimensions of color are commonly supposed to be hue, saturation, and brightness.

  5. Determinate similarity/comparability: If \(P\) and \(R\) are different same-level determinates of a determinable \(Q\), then \(P\) and \(R\) are similar, and moreover comparable, in respect of \(Q\).

    That determination is ‘in respect of’ determinables gives rise to similarity and systematic comparability relations among determinates. For example, determinates of colorred, blue, orange, etc.—are all similar in being colors, and any two colors are comparable in this respect: red is more similar to orange than to blue in respect of color, and so on.

  6. Non-conjunctive specification: if \(P\) determines \(Q\), then \(P\) is not identical with any conjunctive property conjoining \(Q\) with any property or properties independent of \(Q\).

    The increase in specificity associated with determinates does not involve conjoining or otherwise combining the determinable with another property independent of the determinable. For example, red is not appropriately understood as the conjunction of color and another property independent of color.

  7. Non-disjunctive specification: if \(P\) determines \(Q\), then \(Q\) is not identical with any disjunctive property disjoining \(P\) with any property or properties independent of \(P\).

    The increase in specificity associated with determinates does not involve disjunctive elimination. For example, color is not a disjunction of red and some other property or properties independent of red.

  8. Determinable inheritance: For every determinable \(Q\) of a determinate \(P\): if \(x\) has \(P\) at a time \(t\) then \(x\) must have \(Q\) at \(t\).

    Objects must have every determinable of any determinates they have. For example, if something is scarlet, then it must also be both red and colored.

  9. Requisite determination: If \(x\) has \(Q\) at a time \(t\), then for every level \(L\) of determination of \(Q\): \(x\) must have some \(L\)-level determinate \(P\) of \(Q\) at \(t\).

    Objects must have a determinate of every determinable they have. For example, if something is colored, then it must be some specific color (e.g., red).

  10. Multiple determinates: For every determinate \(P\) of a determinable \(Q\), there is a determinate \(R\) of \(Q\) that is distinct from, but at the same level of specificity as, \(P\).

    With determinate specificity comes multiplicity or diversity. For example, color has multiple determinates (red, blue, yellow, and so on); red has multiple determinates (scarlet, crimson, burgundy, and so on).

  11. Determinate incompatibility: If \(x\) has determinate \(P\) of determinable \(Q\) at time \(t\), then \(x\) cannot have, at \(t\), any other determinate \(R\) of \(Q\) at the same level of specificity as \(P\).

    For example, an object cannot be both red and blue all over, at a time.[6] Determinate incompatibility is moreover ‘opponent’ in that same-level determinates are exclusive alternatives.[7]

  12. Unique determination: If \(x\) has a determinable \(Q\) at a time, then \(x\) has a unique—one and only one—determinate \(P\) at any given level of specification at that time.

    Unique determination is entailed by Requisite determination and Determinate incompatibility.

  13. Asymmetric modal dependence: if \(P\) is a determinate of \(Q\), then if \(x\) has \(P\) then \(x\) must have \(Q\), but for some \(y\), \(y\) might have \(Q\) without having \(P\).

    For example, anything that is scarlet must be red, but something might be red without being scarlet (it might rather be, e.g., burgundy). Asymmetric dependence is entailed by Determinable inheritance, Requisite determination, and Multiple determinates.

  14. Causal compatibility: Determinables and determinates do not causally compete.

    For example, if a given patch is both red and scarlet, there is no in-principle difficulty with both red and scarlet being causally efficacious vis-á-vis the pecking of a pigeon trained to peck at any red patch.

Motivated as they are by a limited range of paradigm cases, not all of these features may be characteristic of determination in the strong sense of being required for the holding of that relation, as opposed to being typically or generally true of some or most instances of the relation (or its relata).

For example, Johansson (2004) observes that if property is an determinable of color, then Determinate incompatibility (hence Unique determination) will fail, noting that on this score “Johnson […] generalized too quickly” (2004: 117); what is rather true is that “for some ontological determinables […] two determinates cannot possibly exist in the same space-time region” (2004: 118). Armstrong offers other cases of purportedly compatible determinates, involving odors, tastes, or sounds: “a sauce may be both sour and sweet. A bell may have a tone which is composed of both a fundamental and a number of higher overtones” (1978b: 113; see also Fales 1990, Sanford 2014, and Massin 2013).

It may also be questioned whether all determinates of determinables can be systematically compared, as per Determinate similarity/comparability. It is unclear, for example, whether being pentagonal is more or less similar in respect of shape to being square or being sextagonal. It is also unclear whether all determinates of smell admit of systematic comparability (is the smell of pine more similar to the smell of rose or of violet?), though recent empirical work identifying the dimensions of “smell space” (see, e.g., Mamlouk & Martinetz 2004) may reveal an underlying structure of the sort (appealing to hue, saturation, and brightness) that serves as an underlying basis for ordering determinate colors (which work might also serve as a basis for responding to Armstrong, above). The question of whether all determinables may be systematically ordered with respect to their determinables, either explicitly or implicitly, matters to whether determinate/determinable relations can be modeled in spatial terms along lines proposed by Funkhouser (2006) (see §3.6.1).

Unique determination and Requisite determination may also admit of exceptions. Wilson (2013) argues that even for paradigmatic determinables such as color, Unique determination is not generally correct, since the case of an iridescent feather is reasonably interpreted as one in which the feather is (a) colored, (b) red from one perspective, and (c) blue from another perspective, such that no one determinate shade is non-arbitrarily identified as “the” unique determinate determining the determinable color had by the feather (rather, she suggests, the determinates are had, at best, in relativized fashion).[8] More generally, she argues that there can be failures of Unique determination due either to there being too many candidate determinates (as in the feather case) or to there being too few or none, contra Requisite determination (as might be the case for certain quantum phenomena; see below). Fales observes that Requisite determination

appears to admit of exceptions in the case of certain objects of mental acts: for example, as regards the number of spots on an imagined or a hallucinated speckled hen. (1990: 167)

Similarly, Rosen and Smith (2004) suggest that considerations of vagueness indicate that an object may have a determinable without determinately having any corresponding determinate, and Bokulich (2014) and Wolff (2015) suggest that cases of value indeterminacy in quantum mechanics are promisingly seen as involving undetermined determinables (see §5.3).

Finally, as we will see in §3.4, a reductive approach to determinables, along lines of, e.g., Bigelow and Pargetter (1990), Clapp (2001), Rodriguez-Pereyra (2002), Antony (2003), and Massin (2013), takes these to be disjunctive properties having associated determinates as disjuncts; disjunctive reductionists uniformly reject Non-disjunctive specification as ever true of determination or its relata.

2.2 Ontological categories

Though paradigm cases of determination (involving color, shape, mass, and so on) appear to hold between monadic property types, it is straightforward to extend the notion to relations—e.g., distance. Hence Johansson says that while the restriction to monadic types is ‘traditional’,

I do not think there are any good reasons for the restriction. […] Relational concepts, just like property concepts, can be fitted into determinable-determinate trees. (2000: 117)

More controversially, determination has been taken to hold between entities of ontological (including representational) categories going beyond properties and relations.

To start, as above, historical discussion of determinables and determinates (in, e.g., Johnson 1921) moves fairly freely between talk of these as representational (linguistic/conceptual) and as metaphysical. In some such cases, the target is plausibly a properly metaphysical distinction.[9] In other cases—e.g., in empiricist treatments—the characterization of determination in representational terms is clearly intended to be metaphysically deflationary. We will later revisit reasons for and against taking determinables or determination at metaphysical face value (§3.1, §3.2).

Modulo deflationary concerns, there does not appear to be any in-principle barrier to allowing that determination can hold between entities of other categories.[10] Determination has been extended to actions or episodes (see, e.g., Mulligan 1992 and Cruse 1995: chap. 6), events (Yablo 1992), fields (von Wachter 2000), tropes (Funkhouser 2006), states (Fine 2011), and substances (Massin 2013). That said, one might maintain that some such entities can be related by determination since falling under or in part constituted by determinable and determinate properties. Whatever one’s position on what ontological categories the relata of determination can fall under, there are (as per metaphysical usual) different available understandings of the categories at issue.[11]

Another question pertaining to ontological categories concerns whether some or all specification relations are themselves determinates of a more general relation determinable; Johansson (2000: sec. 8) endorses such a view.

3. Contemporary accounts of determinables and determinates

We turn now to canvassing contemporary accounts of determinables, determinates, and their relation. The main varieties of contemporary ontological accounts are anti-realist accounts, on which determinables do not exist; reductive accounts, on which determinables exist but are metaphysically reducible to (that is, identical with) some or other construction of determinates; and non-reductive accounts, on which determinables exist and are not metaphysically reducible to any construction of determinates. Non-reductive accounts furthermore split into versions on which determinables are (always) less fundamental than associated vis-á-vis determinates, and accounts on which determinables can be as fundamental as, or even more fundamental than, determinates; we reserve treatment of this further issue for §4. A different sort of contemporary account is directed not so much at the ontological question(s) as at elucidating certain structural or broadly logical aspects of determination or associated relata.

As background for the ontological accounts to come, we start with a number of considerations commonly taken to provide prima facie support for taking determinables to exist, and to moreover be ontologically irreducible (again: not identical to any construction of) to determinates. We then consider some preliminary motivations for deflationary (anti-realist or reductive) treatments of determinables. One might wonder whether the motivations for taking determinables to exist might be presented independently of the motivations for taking determinables to be irreducible; but this proves difficult, for there simply isn’t enough daylight between the initial motivations for existence and for irreducibility to prise them apart. The presentation thus reflects that the motivations for reducibility (or for anti-realism) come later, as pushing against taking the prima facie appearances of irreducible determinables at face value.

3.1 Preliminary motivations for the existence and irreducibility of determinables

There are perceptual, scientific, causal, semantic, and metaphysical considerations weighing in prima facie favor of determinables’ existing and moreover being metaphysically irreducible to determinates. Again, these motivations are preliminary; as we’ll see down the line, anti-realists and reductionists take there to be good reasons to resist taking the seeming appearances of existence and/or irreducibility at face value (see §3.2).

3.1.1 Determinables as perceived

Perception provides one source of support for there being determinables, which on the face of it are not appropriately taken to be reducible to determinates. The best motivations here are indirect, since bare claims that we can perceive determinables as distinct from determinates are disputable.[12] One such motivation appeals to Sorites phenomena as indicating that we fail to perceive fully determinate instances of many properties, including colors, tones, and textures. As Fales puts it, this

is a conclusion which seems forced upon us by the fact that each member of a series of colors, etc., may be perceptually indistinguishable from its immediate neighbors but easily distinguishable from more distant members of the series. (1990: 172)[13]

A second indirect perceptual motivation for existing and irreducible determinables reflects that our perception of macro-objects typically fails to register microdeterminate details. For example, shape is a paradigmatic determinable, but we do not perceive the shapes of trees, tables, and the like, in microscopic detail. In re this and the Sorites motivation, it is worth noting that even if perceived objects are themselves maximally determinate, perceptual experience may still motivate irreducible determinables; as Wilson notes,

Perhaps the (instances of) properties perceived are really maximally determinate, and only perceptual features or modes of presentation are determinable; but features of perceptual experience are also aspects of reality, so the larger point remains. (2012: 5)

A third indirect perceptual motivation for irreducible determinables is that these best explain our being able to perceive that different determinates are similar in the relevant determinable respect. Hence Fales suggests that since we are able “to notice or be aware of” the similarity between different shades of red,

it seems clear that red is observable every time we observe an instance of a shade of red, even though it is not separable from that shade, but is in the shade. (1990: 172)

3.1.2 Determinables as scientific posits

Both fundamental physical and special-scientific posits and laws appear to be characterized, at least in part, in determinable terms. As Armstrong (1997) and French (2014) observe, it is natural to see fundamental physical laws as relating determinables, such as mass and charge, or to themselves be determinable relations.[14] And in the special sciences, for example, the features of molecules relevant to chemical interactions abstract from the precise details of atomic position and momentum, and features of thermodynamic systems near critical points abstract from compositional and other micro-level details (see Batterman 1998). More generally, the posit of existing and irreducible determinables in both fundamental and special sciences is in line with a principle of explanation pervasive in the sciences, according to which good explanations do not cite unnecessary details (see, e.g., Strevens 2004).[15]

3.1.3 Determinables as causally unspecific

Determinables appear to be causally unspecific, in having fewer powers—in being able to contribute to causing fewer effects, in the circumstances—than their associated determinates. For example, red has the power to get Sophie the pigeon, who pecks at any red thing, to peck; but red doesn’t have the power to get Sophie’s picky cousin Alice, who pecks only at scarlet patches, to peck—for a red patch might be not scarlet, but burgundy (see Yablo 1992, Wilson 1999, and Shoemaker 2001). Such a lack of causal specificity, combined with a principle of individuation of scientific properties according to which they are (perhaps only contingently) distinguished by different sets of powers, has been taken to support not just the existence but the irreducibility of determinable features.

3.1.4 Determinables as semantic referents

On a simple and in some sense default semantics, a sentence of the form ‘\(a\) is \(F\)’ is true just in case the entity picked out by \(a\) has the property picked out by \(F\). Hence if ‘This ruby is red’ is true then on the default semantics the predicate ‘red’ refers to the determinable red.

3.1.5 Determinables as a basis for determinate resemblance

As previously, Johansson (2000) posits determinables as providing a metaphysical basis for perceived similarity among determinates. Wilson (2012) argues, more generally, that determinables may be considered ‘natural’ in the ‘joint-carving’ sense of Lewis (1983) in virtue of providing a non-gerrymandered basis for objective similarity among determinates.

Again, each of the motivations in (3.1.1) – (3.1.5) is preliminary. If the seeming appearance of there being irreducible determinables can be defended against objections, however, the philosophical work these can do in encoding distinctively unspecific aspects of reality (as per the applications in §5) would constitute additional positive support for their posit.

3.2 Preliminary motivations against the existence or irreducibility of determinables

The main preliminary motivations against determinables existing or being metaphysically irreducible to determinates reflect concerns that such determinables would be unparsimonious, give rise to causal overdetermination, and/or violate the supposition that reality is ultimately or fundamentally maximally determinate. These concerns and associated support for anti-realist (‘eliminativist’) or realist reductionist accounts are similar to those sometimes brought to bear against irreducible higher-level (e.g., special scientific) goings-on.

  1. Reality as maximally determinate. One objection to irreducible determinables appeals to the supposition that reality itself is maximally determinate, such that there are no irreducible determinable properties; as Armstrong maintains, “[a]ll universals must be determinate” (1978b: 117). Relatedly, many suppose that there is no “vagueness” in the world; as Lewis maintains, “[t]he only intelligible account of vagueness locates it in our thought and language” (1986: 212).[16]

  2. Determinables as failing to track exact similarity. Armstrong takes “the powerful truism that universals are strictly identical in their distinct instantiations” to support the claim that “properties that are lowest determinates […] are good candidates for being universals” (1997: 49). More weakly, one might maintain that the best reason for positing properties, however understood, is as explaining exact similarity (in a given respect) between objects. Supposing so, one might moreover maintain that only determinates exist, on grounds that particulars having determinable properties might fail to exactly resemble in determinate respects (e.g., red objects might be different shades of red).[17]

  3. Determinables as ontologically or causally redundant. Irreducible determinables have been taken to be ontologically and causally redundant, since determinates which we have independent reason to posit can explain or do anything that determinables purportedly explain or do. Hence Massin (2013) maintains against Johansson (2000) that perceived inexact resemblances between determinates can explain the “seen unity of the determinate colors”, and Gillett and Rives maintain that determinables are causally unnecessary:

    [P]ositing instances of determinate properties offers the best explanation for the causal relations we observe in the world […] Should we also accept that there are instances of determinable properties corresponding to predicates such as ‘is colored’ or ‘is charged’? […] There is a clear concern that it is ontologically profligate to take two properties to be contributing causal powers, a determinable and its determinate, where one, the determinate, would apparently suffice. (2005: 487)

    Heil (2003) levels similar complaints.

  4. Determinables as inducing causal overdetermination. Related to the concern about casual redundancy is the concern, again pressed by Gillett and Rives (2005), that irreducible broadly scientific determinables induce problematic causal overdetermination. To start, if such determinables exist, they need to earn their causal keep.[18] But following the concern about causal redundancy, determinables simply reproduce the powers of their determinates, allowing instances of distinct properties to give rise to the same effect on a given occasion. And while such overdetermination sometimes occurs, as in firing squad or double-rock-throw cases, this is not the right model for determinables and determinates.[19]

  5. Determinables as incoherent. Armstrong (1978a: 106–7, 117–18) argues that determinables are incoherent, in constituting the respect in which associated determinates are both similar and dissimilar (see Elder 1996: 151 for discussion).[20] Fales (1990: 174) sees the concern as incorrectly presupposing that determinables are second-order properties of or relations between determinates. Massin (2013) thinks the concern depends on whether the similarity at issue is exact or inexact; if inexact, there is no problem (“[t]wo things that are imperfectly similar in their colour can be imperfectly dissimilar in their colour”) but if exact—in virtue, e.g., of determinables being exactly similar constituents of determinates—then incoherence follows, since differences between determinates must be explained by what “remains” once the shared determinable is removed, but we cannot make sense of such removal.

3.3 Anti-realist accounts

While motivated by the previous concerns, anti-realists about determinables also aim to explain or explain away (or “debunk”) at least some seeming motivations for determinables. A common debunking strategy appeals to something like Berkeley’s (1710) claim that it is a mistake to suppose that general terms denote abstract ideas.[21] For example, Heil (2003) echoes Berkeley’s claim, taking seeming semantic reasons for positing determinables to reflect an uncritical tendency to suppose that “we can ‘read off’ features of reality from our ways of speaking about it” (207), such that even if, e.g., the predicate ‘is red’ truly applies to some objects (tomatoes, apples, rubies) we should not take this to be in virtue of their possessing the “very same property”.

Different positive anti-realist accounts of determinate terms or concepts and their function are available. Berkeley endorses a schematic account, on which general terms/concepts indeterminately refer to determinate features—here, generality is placed in language or mind, rather than world.[22] Heil (2003) also endorses a schematic approach, offering a pragmatic account of the function of determinable terms, as reflecting that we happen to have perceptual systems suited for tracking certain inexact similarities between objects having (ultimately highly complex) determinate properties. That the ‘work’ determinable terms do consists in tracking inexact similarities between objects or determinates is a common theme in three alternative anti-realist accounts. First is Searle’s (1959) account, on which determinable terms are higher-order predicates of determinate predicates.[23] Second is Mill’s account of determinable predicates as

names not of one single and definite attribute, but of a class of attributes. Such is the word color, which is a name common to whiteness, redness, etc. (1843/1973: I.ii.5)

Third is Armstrong’s account, first offered in his 1978a and developed in his 1997, according to which

For a particular to “instantiate” a determinable is […] for it to instantiate just one of a class of universals’ […] having the determinable property entails no more than having one of the determinate properties. (1997: 53)

One concern with anti-realist accounts has to do with the source of classification of determinates under a determinable term or concept. As above, this is usually taken to involve inexact resemblance, but if inexact resemblance is primitive, then objections of the sort leveled against resemblance nominalist treatments of inexact resemblance may arise, mutatis mutandis (see Fales [1990: 117–20] for discussion, and Rodriguez-Pereyra [2002] for a recent response). An alternative means of classification of determinates appeals to “naturalness” (as per Lewis 1983) as a primitive property binding determinates into classes, but this approach incurs ontological commitment and, it might be complained, is not clearly explanatory. Perhaps the most developed approach to determinate classification is Armstrong’s, on which “the resemblance of determinate universals is constituted by partial identity, where the greater the resemblance the greater degree of identity” (1997: 51), such that, for example, determinate lengths resemble in virtue of sharing unit length universals.[24] Armstrong argues that his account makes sense of various features of determination: Determinate opponent incompatibility is accommodated since, e.g., an object’s length cannot be identical to different sums of unit lengths; Determinate similarity/comparability is accommodated since different determinate lengths share some but not all unit lengths; Asymmetric dependence is accommodated since specific sums of unit lengths entail the having of length, but not vice versa. It has been complained, however, that his account cannot handle the full range of cases.[25]

A second concern is that the presupposition that all properties are ultimately maximally determinate violates certain possible and potentially actual conceptions of natural reality. For example, if objects fill space, and space is both continuous and gunky (i.e., such that every entity has proper parts), then the shapes and locations of objects will be indefinitely subject to further determination (see Salmieri 2008: 78, n47).[26] And certain interpretations of quantum mechanics (see §5.3 for further discussion) and certain field-theoretic understandings of fundamental particles as having infinitely extensible boundaries (reflecting these particles’ being constituted by long-range interactions) suggest that natural reality is to some extent irreducibly determinable.

A third, related concern is that it is unclear how the eliminativist can accommodate (or debunk) all the motivations for determinables. It remains unclear, for example, how to explain Sorites phenomena if all properties—including perceptual modes of presentation—are maximally determinate.

3.4 Reductionist accounts

Reductionists take determinables to exist but to be reducible to determinates—that is, to be identical to classes or broadly logical constructions of (ultimately maximal) determinates.

3.4.1 Disjunctive reductionism

The most common reductionist strategy takes determinables to be identical to disjunctions of (ultimately maximal) determinates (see, e.g., Bigelow and Pargetter 1990; Clapp 2001; Rodriguez-Pereyra 2002; Antony 2003;[27] and Massin 2013). On this view, for example, color is identical to a disjunctive property having every maximally specific color shade as a disjunct.

Disjunctivism explains several features of determination: Requisite determination is accommodated since the instancing of a disjunction requires the instancing of a disjunct; Determinable inheritance is accommodated since the instancing of a disjunct entails the instancing of any associated disjunctions (see Rodriguez-Pereyra 2002, Massin 2013); Causal compatibility is accommodated via the identity of determinable (disjunctive) and determinate (disjunct) instances. And while disjunctivism violates Non-disjunctive specification, disjunctivists preserve some contrast by stipulating that determinables are a special sub-class of the class of disjunctive properties—ones having resembling determinates as disjuncts. Other stipulations may be required to accommodate Determinate incompatibility, Determination ‘in respect of’ determinables, and Unique determination.

Three concerns face disjunctivist accounts, besides concerns that the required stipulations are unexplanatory, and that reality may not be (ultimately, entirely) maximally determinate. The first reflects reasons for rejecting disjunctive properties. One such reason—namely, Armstrong’s concern that “disjunctive properties offend against the principle that a genuine property is identical in its different particulars” (1978a: 20)—may be put aside if the disjuncts at issue are genuinely resembling, as proponents of disjunctivism suppose. This response will not, however, satisfy those taking disjunctions to be mere logical constructions, with no metaphysical import.

The second concern is that taking the disjuncts identified with determinates to be genuinely resembling, as is needed in order to answer Armstrong’s concern and to provide an alternative basis for the contrast flagged in Non-disjunctive specification, will open the door to looking for a source of the supposed commonality, which source might well end up being an irreducible determinable. Here again the question of how best to treat the inexact resemblance between determinates is pressing.

The third concern is that a disjunctive account cannot accommodate all the prima facie motivations for determinables. Again, our perceptions of and thoughts about determinables do not appear to be perceptions of or thoughts about disjunctions of maximal determinates. Rosen (2010) presses this point, noting that a “suggestive line of thought weighs against” disjunctivism, as per a case in which someone familiar with many shades of blue has no conception of cerulean (indeed, is perhaps even incapable of thinking of this shade), but where this deficit “would not prevent him from being competent with the word ‘blue’, or from knowing a great deal about the color blue” (2010: 128).

3.4.2 Relational accounts

Bigelow and Pargetter’s (1990) relational account aims to explain both why determinates are similar and why they differ. They see irreducible determinables as insufficient unto this task, on grounds, first, that taking determinables to be irreducibly distinct from but necessarily accompanied by determinates introduces unexplained necessary connections (1990: 118), and second, that determinables alone don’t explain differences between determinates (1990: 54, 58; see also Armstrong 1978b: 113). Bigelow and Pargetter rather suggest that what it is for determinates to “fall under a common determinable” is for the determinates to instantiate second-degree relations of difference from one another, and for pairs of these differences to in turn instantiate third-degree proportions (1990: 58–62).

Besides the usual concerns with reductive accounts, two concerns attach to a relational approach. The first is that attention to the way in which determinates differ doesn’t in itself serve to characterize the way in which determinates resemble. As Elder puts it,

although properties such as being blue or rich or stabbingly painful do come in different degrees or intensities, there is more that is common to the various precise “values” of these properties than just that they differ from one another in graduated ways. (1996: 155)

The second is that, as Elder also observes, from the metaphysical irreducibility of determinables to determinates, it doesn’t follow that their necessary connection is mysterious: if

the various determinates […] each embodies the same property as the others […] it is hard to see any great mystery in the fact that possession of any one of these determinate shades necessarily goes with possession of the relevant determinable. (1996: 157)

Also worth noting is that concerns about necessary connections typically arise from acceptance of Hume’s Dictum, according to which there are no metaphysically necessary connections between distinct existences; but post-empiricist motivations for believing this principle are unclear (see MacBride 2005 and Wilson 2010).

3.5 Non-reductive accounts

We turn now to accounts on which determinables are taken to irreducibly exist. These accounts are typically implemented under the assumption that determinables are less fundamental than—are metaphysically posterior to—determinates. In §4 I’ll consider whether determinables may be as fundamental as determinates, and whether certain of the non-reductive accounts to follow are compatible with fundamental as well as non-fundamental determinables.

3.5.1 Essence-based accounts

Yablo (1992) takes asymmetrical necessitation (i.e., Asymmetrical dependence) as a neutral modal basis for theorizing about determination:

\(P\) determines \(Q\) just in case the traditional relation’s first, metaphysical component is in place, where this consists primarily in the fact that \(P\) necessitates \(Q\) asymmetrically. (1992: 253, note 23)

Since reductionists also accept Asymmetric dependence, a modal account requires supplementation if it is to be non-reductive.

Yablo does go beyond asymmetric necessitation in considering how (token, particular) events—the assumed relata of the causal relation—might stand in the determination relation; his approach appeals to the notion of essence of an event, and to the idea that the essence of one such event might be included in or subsumed by the essence of another:

Determination involves the idea that the requirements associated with one thing include the requirements associated with another; and although properties are requiremental on their face, particulars are not. Hence the need for a notion of individual essence, where essential properties of a thing are those it cannot exist without. [T]he essence of a thing is supposed to be a measure of what is required in order to be that thing. Thus if more is required to be \(y\) than to be \(x\), this should be reflected in an inclusion relation between their essences:

When \(q\)’s essence is a subset of \(p\)’s essence, \(p\) is said to subsume \(q\) (\(p \geq q\)); and \(p\) determines \(q\) (\(p > q\)) when the inclusion is strict. (1992: 261)

Given the role essences play in individuation, this approach promises to characterize determinable events in properly non-reductive terms, at both the type and token levels, and might be extended to a more general non-reductive account of determinables, capable of accommodating the range of motivations for irreducible determinables. Taking determinables to have essences contained within determinate essences would also clearly explain various features of determination, including (besides Asymmetric dependence, which is presumably still in force), Determinable inheritance and Determination ‘in respect of’ determinables. More needs to be said, however if an appeal to essences is to explain certain other features of determination, including Non-conjunctive specification, Requisite determination, Determinate opponent incompatibility, and—importantly for Yablo’s intended application of determination to the problem of mental causation; see §5.2—Causal compatibility.

3.5.2 Causal and powers-based accounts

Causal and powers-based accounts of determination are typically motivated by the problem of mental/higher-level causation, expressed by the question: How can higher-level properties bring about effects, as they seem to do, given that the physical properties upon which these higher-level properties depend are sufficient to cause these effects? As we’ll see in §5.2, different causal accounts provide different answers to this question. An important choice point, which I’ll track here, concerns whether determinable and determinate instances are taken to be token-identical.

Though MacDonald and MacDonald (1986) don’t officially offer an account of determination, they were the first to see determination as useful for addressing the threat of causal overdetermination. Effectively, they suggest that the relation between mental and physical properties is analogous to determination: in both cases the properties at issue are, they maintain, type-distinct but token-identical, thus avoiding problematic overdetermination while preserving type-level causal relevance. Here and elsewhere, token-identity accounts of determinables and determinates do not clearly accommodate certain of the (e.g., perceptual) motivations for irreducible determinables; token-identity accounts are also subject to an extension of Horgan’s (1989) concerns with reductive accounts of mental states, according to which, insofar as the causal relata are ultimately located particulars (events, objects, property instances), the efficacy of determinables qua determinable—that is, qua distinctively unspecific—requires that determinable and determinate tokens as well as types be distinct.

The first explicitly causal theory of determination is Fale’s (1990) account of ‘determinable or generic’ and ‘specific’ universals, on which the former have a proper subset of the ‘causal relations’ of the latter:

If \(S\) and \(S'\) are specific universals and \(G\) is a determinable or generic universal under which they both fall, then the causal relations between \(G\) and other universals are a subset of the causal relations between \(S\) and other universals; and also a subset of the causal relations between \(S'\) and other universals. For \(S\) and \(S'\) to be species of a common genus is for them to share some subset of causal relations, which subset can itself constitute the causal essence of a universal, such as \(G\). For \(S\) and \(S'\) to be distinct species is for this subset to be a proper subset of the causal relations which characterize \(S\), and also of the causal relations which characterize \(S'\): there must be some causal relation which \(S\) has, but not \(S'\), and some causal relation which \(S'\) has, but not \(S\). (1990: 175)

A subset-of-causal-relations account of generic/determinable universals promisingly accommodates many features of determination, for reasons similar to those attaching to powers-based accounts, below. It also ensures the metaphysical irreducibility of a generic/determinable type to any specific/determinate type, by the principle of the indiscernibility of identicals (if \(G\) has only a proper subset of causal relations of \(S\), \(G\) cannot be identified with \(S\)); and if this proper subset relation is preserved at the level of tokens, it will also block token-identity. More needs to be said, however, if this account is to ensure accommodation of Non-disjunctive specification (and more generally, if it is to block the metaphysical reducibility of determinable types to certain constructions of determinate types), since one might suggest (as a variation of the theme of Antony 2003) that disjunctive types, like Fales’s generic types, also have the causal relations in the intersections of their disjunctions. More problematic is that Fales’s account does not provide a clear basis for accommodating Non-conjunctive specification, since as stated it is compatible with a given determinate/species’ being conjunctively analyzable into (for example) a genus and differentia, each associated with a proper subset of the powers of the species. Even so, Fales’ account of determination is a clear precursor of Yablo’s (1992) essence-based account[28] and the powers-based account, to be next discussed.

The first explicitly powers-based account of determination is offered by Wilson (1999), as an application of a powers-based approach to the metaphysical dependence (a.k.a. ‘realization’) at issue in physicalism. She first motivates attention to powers (rather than supervenience or epistemic notions, in particular) as a properly metaphysical basis for characterizing realization; she then argues that a variety of seemingly diverse non-reductive physicalist accounts, including Yablo’s determinable-based account, are similar in aiming to ensure that the powers of a realized property are a proper subset of those of its realizing property (properties), in particular. Hence:

One way to make [Yablo’s] conjecture more plausible is to put the point in terms of the causal powers of the properties involved. […] the reason why “determinables and their determinates are not causal rivals” is because it is plausible, in the case of determinables and determinates, that each causal power of the determinable is identical to a causal power of its determinate. [Moreover, and for example,] the property of being scarlet, which is a determinate of the property of being red, evidently has more causal powers than the property of being red. (1999: 47)

These considerations suggest the following first-pass powers-based account of determination:

Powers-based determination (first pass): Property \(P\) determines property \(Q\) iff \(Q\) is associated with a [non-empty] proper subset of the token powers associated with \(P\).

On this approach, a determinate is more specific than its determinable (as per Increased specificity) in being associated with a more specific set of powers. Clarke (1999), Shoemaker (2001, 2007), and Clapp (2001) also maintain that determination is a case-in-point of a non-reductive realization relation satisfying the proper subset condition on powers, where the powers associated with a given determinable property are those in the intersection of the sets of powers associated with its determinates.

Wilson (2012) moreover argues, contra MacDonald and MacDonald (1986), Ehring (1996), and others, that determinables and determinates are token-distinct, since if they were token-identical, then determinable instances would be associated with more powers than are associated with their type—but that would be reason for denying that the instance was of the determinable type. This consideration also pushes against taking determinable types to be metaphysically reducible to (identified with) disjunctive or other constructions from determinates, since such reductive strategies entail that instances of determinables and determinates are token-identical. As such, and in particular, a powers-based approach accommodates Non-disjunctive specification.

Proponents of powers-based accounts have different ways of accommodating Non-conjunctive specification.

On Shoemaker’s version of a powers-based account of realization/determination, Non-conjunctive determination is stipulated:

Property \(X\) realizes property \(Y\) just in case the conditional powers bestowed by \(Y\) are a subset of the conditional powers bestowed by \(X\) (and \(X\) is not a conjunctive property having \(Y\) as a conjunct). (2001: 78).

Wilson (2009) rather accommodates Non-conjunctive specification by requiring that the powers in the complement of the sets associated with a determinate and any of its determinates, respectively, do not constitute a set associated with any property, as per her second-pass formulation:

Powers-based determination (second pass): Property \(P\) determines property \(Q\) iff \(Q\) is associated with a [non-empty] proper subset of the powers associated with \(P\), and the set of powers had by \(P\) but not by \(Q\) is not (uniquely) associated with any property.

In addition to Non-conjunctive specification and Non-disjunctive specification, a powers-based account of determination neatly accommodates most standard features of determination. Causal compatibility is accommodated, since every power of a determinable instance is token-identical with a power of an associated determinate. A powers-based account also satisfies Asymmetry, Irreflexivity, and Transitivity, which are inherited as features of the proper subset relation between powers. Determinable inheritance is accommodated in that in having a determinate property with an associated set of powers, an object will thereby have the determinables associated with proper subsets of the determinate’s powers (assuming that properties are at least contingently individuated by associated powers; see below for further discussion). Determination ‘in respect of’ determinables and Determinate similarity/comparability are accommodated by determinates’ sharing the powers of their associated determinable but having further powers, where the powers of the determinable constitute the respect in which determinables are similar, and powers had by determinates but not the determinable serve as a basis for ordering the determinates by degree of similarity (i.e., determinates sharing more powers will be more similar). That said, more could be said about how the sharing of determinable powers makes sense of how these additional powers count as being ‘in respect of’ the determinable and its powers, and as providing a basis for ordering by similarity.[29] Accommodation of Determinable similarity/orderability also provides a basis for responding to concerns that irreducible determinables make no sense, since we cannot ‘get a grip’ on the difference-makers of determinates (see §3.2): on a powers-based view, the difference-makers are, comprehensibly, the powers in the complement of determinate and determinable sets. A powers-based account does not itself ensure the accommodation of either Requisite determination or Unique determination,[30] but these omissions may ultimately be a virtue (see §5.3).

A powers-based approach to determination faces two main concerns. One is that the view requires endorsement of a controversial “causal theory” of properties, on which these are (following, e.g., Shoemaker 1980) essentially and exhaustively constituted by their powers; for if properties have non-causal quiddities (primitive identities, which float modally free of powers), satisfaction of the proper subset condition on powers won’t guarantee that determinables are ‘nothing over and above’ determinates (see, e.g., Melnyk 2006: 141–43 and McLaughlin 2007), since the status of the determinable’s ‘quiddity’ is not thereby treated; nor will it explain Determinable inheritance, since satisfaction of the condition on powers is compatible with the absence of the determinable quiddities. Here it is worth noting that while certain proponents (e.g., Clarke, Shoemaker, Clapp) presuppose a causal theory of properties, such a commitment may be dispensable: since non-causal quiddities are scientifically inaccessible and besides the point of solving the problem of higher-level causation (see §5.2), their presence or absence is irrelevant to the status of determination (and more generally, realization) as a relation between broadly scientific properties (see Wilson 2011).

A second concern with a powers-based approach is that, in applying only to broadly scientific goings-on, it doesn’t make sense of determination as holding between abstracta or other entities lacking powers. In response, a proponent of a powers-based account might try to extend the approach beyond specifically causal powers to one involving non-causal functional roles associated with, e.g., being a number (determinable), and being a prime number (determinate). This extension remains speculative, however; at present the account is not fully general.

3.5.3 Constitutional accounts

It is natural to think of irreducible determinables as in some sense shared parts or constituents of determinates. Such a view would provide a natural way of accommodating Determinate similarity, Determinable inheritance, and other features. A powers-based view might be seen as taking determinables or associated powers to be constituent parts of determinates; here we consider non-powers-based constitutional accounts.

Johansson (2000, 2004) endorses a constitutive account of determinables—more precisely, of ‘maximal’ determinables (such as color, shape, and smell) located at the top of a determination hierarchy—taking Determinate similarity and Determinate gradability as its starting point. It is, he says, characteristic of determinables and determinates that “two different determinates of the same determinable can always be continuously connected” (2000: 108), in a way providing the basis for the gradeable resemblance of the determinates. Conversely, Johansson maintains, determinates under wholly different determinables are not connected in this fashion: “No color-determinate resembles more closely a shape-determinate or volume-determinate than any other” (2000: 108). This ‘gap’ between determinables acts as a criterion, whereby a determinable is posited if and only if there is such a gap—hence it is that only maximal determinates exist, by lights of Johansson’s criterion. In cases where a determinable is appropriately posited, the determinable is shared by its determinates and explains their similarity; for example, all color-determinates have the determinable property color in common (Johansson 2000: sec. 3). Johansson’s view is a mixed eliminativist/non-reductionist view, since he assumes that any non-maximal determinables do not exist, but are merely “man-made constructions” (2000: 113). Such a view is unmotivated, however, since even in the absence of a ‘comparability gap’ between same-level determinates (e.g., yellow and red, or yellow and scarlet), one might still suppose that the difference between yellow and red (or scarlet) is not a matter of convention. Another concern with Johansson’s account reflects that the mere posit of a shared determinable does not (as Bigelow and Pargetter [1990] and Massin [2013] have observed) in itself make sense of determinable differences, though perhaps the appeal to the ‘continuous connection’ between determinates can do some work here.

Worley (1997) sketches a different sort of a constitution-based account, as a way of supplementing Yablo’s (1992) asymmetrical necessitation account. She illustrates with triangularity, analyzed as involving the constituent features associated with being a closed, three sided plane figure, which features can vary in ways associated with equilateral, isosceles, and scalene triangles, among others. Worley sees this as motivating a model of determination on which “the constituents of each determinable are proper subsets of the constituents of each of their determinates”, such that, e.g., the determinable triangular and the determinate equilateral triangular would share features such as three-sided and closed plane figure, but the latter would be additionally constituted by equilateral. As Worley observes, this account accommodates various features of determination, including Determinable inheritance:

There can be no metaphysically possible world in which an instance of a determinate can fail to be an instance of its determinable, since anything which is an instance of a determinate will be so in virtue of having certain features, which features will also be sufficient to make that object an instance of the determinable. (1997: 290)

The shared constituent features also provide a basis for Determination ‘in respect of’ determinates and Determinate similarity/comparability, and perhaps the additional features of the determinates can provide a basis for Determinate incompatibility. The main concern with Worley’s account is that it doesn’t accommodate Non-conjunctive determination, and in fact seems to require its denial.

3.5.4 Grounding-based accounts

‘Grounding’ is a recently-introduced primitive relation or notion of metaphysical dependence, taken to be operative in any context where such dependence is at issue (either as holding between facts or propositions pertaining to some goings-on, or between worldly goings-on themselves). Proponents of Grounding typically take determination to be a paradigm case of such dependence, with determinables being Grounded in determinates. For example, Correia suggests that “the determinate features of a thing” are the Grounds of “the determinable features of a thing” (2005: 49–50); Schaffer (2016b) takes a case of determination as the primary exemplar of his ‘structural equations’ approach to Grounding; and Rosen (2010) endorses the following principle:

Determinable-Determinate Link: If \(G\) is a determinate of the determinable \(F\) and \(a\) is \(G\), then \([Fa] \leftarrow [Ga]\)

Here, \([Fa] \leftarrow [Ga]\) stands for ‘the fact that \(Fa\) is Grounded in the fact that \(Ga\)’.

Though Grounding is primitive, proponents stipulate that it has various features—most commonly, those of a strict partial order, in which case a Grounding-based account of determination will satisfy Asymmetry, Irreflexivity, and Transitivity.[31] The also-common assumption that Grounding entities metaphysically necessitate Grounded entities accommodates Determinable inheritance. How to accommodate other features (including Non-conjunctive specification, Non-disjunctive specification, Determination ‘in respect of’ determinables, and so on) is less clear, since Grounding doesn’t itself distinguish determination from other dependence relations.

Correspondingly, the overriding concern with a Grounding-based account is that primitive Grounding alone fails to shed any substantive light on determination, instead simply registering the common supposition that determinables metaphysically depend on determinates in a way conforming to certain stipulated formal features. This concern is a case-in-point of the more general concern raised in Wilson (2014), according to which Grounding is too abstract to shed any useful metaphysical light on its own. Some proponents of Grounding attempt to provide more substance to a Grounding-based account of determination by deriving or modeling the claim that determinables are Grounded in determinates, but whether these attempts succeed is unclear; see, e.g., Schaffer’s (2016a,b) suggestion that determination can be modeled using the apparatus of structural equations (à la Pearl 2000 and Spirtes and Scheines 1993), and reasons to resist that suggestion offered by Koslicki (2016) and Wilson (2016).

3.6 Accounts of the structure or logic of determination

We now discuss three accounts which are best seen as elucidating certain structural or broadly logical features of determination or determinates.

3.6.1 Property-space accounts

Funkhouser’s (2006) property-space account (see his 2014 for further exposition) starts by filling in what it is to have a determinable “in a specific way” (Increased specificity) by attention to ‘determination dimensions’—features along which a determinable may be determined, such as, e.g., hue, saturation, and brightness in the case of color. The suggested methodology for identifying determination dimensions of a given determinable is broadly empirical, and involves inquiring after “the ways in which determinates under the determinable \(X\) can differ from one another with regard to their \(X\)-ness” (2006: 551), which suggestion picks up on both Determination ‘in respect of’ determinables and Determinate incompatibility.

Funkhouser then offers a model on which determination dimensions, assumed to have discrete or continuous ranges of values, serve as coordinate axes of a ‘property space’ for a given determinable. The space as a whole corresponds to the determinable; points in the space correspond to maximal determinates, associated with specific assignments of values to each determination dimension; subspaces of the space correspond to less than maximal determinates (which themselves may be determinables relative to contained subspaces or points). For example, color has determination dimensions hue, saturation, and brightness, such that, e.g., red determines color if and only if the property space of red is a proper subspace of the property space of color. More generally:

Property \(B\) determines property \(A\) iff

  1. \(A\) and \(B\) share the same determination dimensions
  2. \(B\) has the non-determinable necessities of \(A\) and
  3. The property space of \(B\) is a proper subset of the property space of \(A\).

‘Non-determinable necessities’ are those features of a determinable not allowing for variation (e.g., being three-sided, in the case of triangularity); condition (2) registers that sharing of non-determinable necessities is also required for determination, in addition to the increase in specificity associated with conditions (1) and (3), registering that determinates differ with respect to the values of one or more determination dimensions associated with the determinable.

Modeling determinates as subspaces of a determinable space accommodates many features of determination, including, to start, Increased specificity, Determination in-respect-of determinables, Asymmetry, Irreflexivity, and Transitivity. Determinate incompatibility follows from subspaces’ being disjoint; Determinate similarity/comparability may be elucidated by reference to metrics on the spaces, whereby subspaces of a determinable space may be nearer or further apart. Funkhouser also aims to accommodate Causal compatibility by taking determinable and determinate instances (tropes) to be identical.

With this latter claim, Funkhouser’s account moves into ontological territory, and might be plausibly seen as a sophisticated variation on a disjunctivist or other reductionist theme—say, one elucidating the internal dimensional structure of determinate disjuncts vis-á-vis associated determinables.[32] In any case, as with reductive accounts, Funkhouser’s assumptions that reality is ultimately maximally determinate and that determinable and determinate instances are token-identical are subject to challenge as either empirically inadequate or such as to not properly accommodate the perceptual and other motivations for determinables. That said, it seems likely that the structural aspects of Funkhouser’s approach could be preserved even if these assumptions are relaxed, such that, e.g., ‘points’ in a property space aren’t taken to correspond to maximal determinates (see note 45).

3.6.2 Metric-space accounts

Denby (2001) presents a metric-space account of “determinables-together-with-their-determinates”, which “identifies abundant determinables and determinates with impure sets and the having relation with a set-theoretical relation” (2001: 316). Determinables are defined as follows:

\(F\) is a determinable iff \(F\) is a pair \(\langle S, f\rangle\) where:

  1. \(S\) is a metric space; and
  2. \(f\) is a function from concrete particulars into the points of this metric space.

Here a determinable is thought of as a “classification” of particulars. The metric space \(S\) is a collection of points together with a “distance” relation on these points; it defines the possible classificatory locations and how they are related. Each point corresponds to a determinate of that determinable, and the distance relation provides a measure of the similarities among them. The function \(f\) maps each concrete particular in its domain to a unique point in the metric space.

Determinates are defined as follows:

\(F\) is a determinate iff \(F\) is a pair \(\langle D, E_i\rangle\) where

  1. \(D\) is a determinable; and
  2. \(E_i\) is the extension of point \(i\) in the metric space encoded by \(D\).

In set-theoretic terms, a determinate is thought of as a “centered” classification of particulars, defined by a determinable and by the determinate’s extension. Denby moreover sees determinables as ultimately categorizing the possession of maximal or “sparse” determinates;[33] as such, he interprets his model along anti-realist or reductionist lines.

This approach to determinables and determinates is attractive, Denby argues, in that sets are ontologically unproblematic and their identity-conditions and relations well-understood (and similarly for functions and metric spaces), and in that the account accommodates “the pre-theoretic intuitions about the logical relations among properties” (2001: 310), including Unique determination,[34] Determinate similarity/comparability,[35] and Determinate incompatibility. The primary concerns here are again those associated with anti-realist or reductive views of determinables, though as with Funkhouser’s account it might be that the broad structure of Darby’s metric conception of determinables is compatible with a non-reductivist reading.

3.6.3 Co-determination accounts

Fine’s aim in his 2011 is to characterize “what it is for the world to possess the kind of structure that it has when the determinate/determinable distinction is in play” (2011: 162), taking as inspiration Wittgenstein’s post-Tractarian view, on which

the atomic propositions might exhibit the kind of dependence that is characteristic of the way in which different determinants of a given determinable are exclusive of one another. (2011: 161)

Fine’s project reflects the usefulness of Determinate incompatibility for his truthmaker semantics (Fine 2012a,b)—most notably, in providing a non-similarity-based account of the worlds entering into counterfactual deliberation, with the general idea being that a counterfactual world will be just like the actual world but for the replacement of some actual state \(s\) with a state \(s'\) that is a determinate under the same determinable as \(s\). As such, Fine’s ultimate aim is to provide a definition of the ‘co-determinable’ relation between states—a task which “avoids the tricky question of saying what exactly a determinable is” (2011: 184), though certain structural characterizations of determinables fall out of his account. Since Fine’s approach to characterizing determinable-determinate structure is rather intricate, we direct the interested reader to the attached footnote.[36]

4. Are determinates metaphysically prior to determinables?

It is commonly assumed that determinables, if they exist, are less fundamental than determinates. Of course, this assumption is true on reductionist accounts;[37] but even those taking determinables to be irreducible to determinates often suppose that the latter are prior to the former. In this section we canvass reasons for and against taking determinates to be metaphysically prior to determinables.

4.1 Asymmetrical necessitation/supervenience

One criterion of priority takes it to be sufficient for some goings-on to be less fundamental than some others that the former are asymmetrically necessitated by (or “metaphysically supervene on”) the latter. As per Asymmetrical dependence, it is characteristic of determinates that they asymmetrically necessitate their associated determinables, thanks to the distinctively unspecific nature of determinables. Hence Armstrong says:

A point to be taken very seriously is that because determinates entail the corresponding determinable, the determinable supervenes on the determinates, and so, apparently, is not something more than the determinates. (1997: 50)

Asymmetric necessitation appears to be insufficient for non-fundamentality, however, as is reflected in standard concerns that supervenience is too weak to guarantee nothing-over-and-aboveness (see, e.g., Horgan 1993 and McLaughlin and Bennett 2005). Nor is asymmetric necessitation necessary for the holding of a priority relation, as Fine’s (1994) case of Socrates and the singleton set of Socrates shows. As such, one can reasonably deny that the asymmetric necessitation of determinables by determinates establishes that determinables are less fundamental than determinates.

Even accepting the criterion, one can question whether it shows that determinates are metaphysically prior to determinables. As French (2014) observes, while determinable instances do not entail any particular determinate instances, there is nevertheless ‘two-way’ entailment: every determinate instance entails determinable instances, and every determinable instance entails some determinate instance. One might respond that the word ‘some’ expresses residual asymmetry in priority as opposed to simply reflecting that determinables are less specific than determinates, but as French notes, “those who exclude determinables from the fundamental base need to show what specificity has to do with fundamentality” (2014: 284).

4.2 Naturalness

Another criterion takes more fundamental properties to be more ‘natural’, in the terminologically inapropos[38] meaning of Lewis (1983), in making for greater objective resemblance between their possessing particulars than do less fundamental properties. This conception appears to deem determinables less fundamental than determinates: since determinables are less specific than their associated determinates, particulars sharing a given determinate property (e.g., scarlet) will be more objectively similar in the relevant respect than will be particulars sharing an associated determinable property (e.g., red). As Wilson (2012) notes, however, objective resemblance can hold between properties as well as particulars; hence even granting that determinates make for more objective resemblance between particulars, one can reasonably maintain that among the perfectly natural joints are those associated with determinables.[39] Such a consideration would support McDaniel's (2010) supposition that the increase in specificity at issue in determination differs from that at issue in the disjunction-disjunct relation, in that determinables, unlike disjunctions, are as natural as their specifications.

4.3 The argument from fixing

Finally, consider a criterion of fundamentality—associated with intuitive “all God had to do” scenarios—according to which fundamental entities fix all the rest. This criterion again seems to support taking determinates to be prior to determinables, for once the specific, or determinate, facts are fixed, then, it seems, more general/determinable facts are thereby fixed, with the latter being at best ontologically real abstractions from the former. By way of contrast, fixing the determinable facts does not fix the determinate facts (as is reflected in Asymmetric dependence).

As Wilson (2012) argues, however, that determinable facts are fixed by determinate facts is undermined by attention to the constitutive modal fact about any given determinable instance—say, that instance of red—that it is of a type that might have been differently determined—say, by scarlet rather than maroon. Here the suggestion is that no determinate fact or complex combination of such facts can provide a non-gerrymandered basis for such a constitutive modal fact.[40]

One response is to maintain that a fundamental base need only ground the contingent non-modal facts at a world, as Schaffer (2004: 90) suggests; if so, then the failure of determinate instances to ground certain modal facts about determinable instances won’t impugn the priority of determinates. Still, one might maintain that a supposed “ground” for some entity which failed to provide a metaphysical basis for modal facts constitutive of the entity would be incomplete, at best. As French puts it,

fixing the non-modal facts and leaving modal flexibility out of the picture would yield an incomplete inventory. And the most obvious way of fixing the modal facts would be to include the determinables themselves in the fundamental base. (2014: 284)

There is a worry that this line of thought will overgenerate, in that many higher-level features and objects (e.g., tables) are to some extent constitutively modally flexible; a possible response is that whether the line of thought applies to a given case will depend on whether the basis for the modal flexibility is itself derivable or otherwise clearly generated by lower-level goings-on.

4.4 Questions and implications

The previous considerations suggest that some determinable features of reality might be fundamental, or as fundamental as determinate features. This result raises several questions, answers to which have implications for our understanding of determinables and determinates, and of the fundamental.

One question pertains to whether the determinates associated with fundamental determinables are also part of the fundamental base. It seems so; for even granting that determinates cannot completely ground determinables, determinates seem also to be needed to be existential witnesses for more specific goings-on. In that case, a further question arises concerning how determinables and determinates jointly participate in a fundamental base. Wilson (2012) suggests that a model for understanding such joint founding may be found in the sciences, and more specifically in how general scientific laws combine with initial or boundary conditions (15–16), an analogy developed by French, who maintains that “scientific determinables and determinates jointly enter into the fundamental base for everything else” (2014: 285)

A further question concerns whether existing non-reductionist accounts of determinables can make sense of these being fundamental. On the face of it, there is no special difficulty with accommodating fundamental determinables on either powers-based or constitution-base accounts of determination, or with such accounts’ making sense of joint determinable/determinate founding. On Johansson’s (2000) account, for example, it might be that determinates depend on determinables in that the latter are constitutive parts of the former (nota bene: not obeying weak supplementation), and determinables depend on determinates in that, modulo gappy quantum indeterminacy (see §5.3), determinable instances must be parts of some determinate whole.

That determinables and determinates may be jointly fundamental has implications for our understandings of fundamentality and metaphysical dependence. Fundamental entities are commonly assumed to be independent, in being wholly distinct, and (relatedly, as per ‘Hume’s Dictum’) in being such that each can either exist together or exist apart. But if determinables and determinates can be equally fundamental, this understanding is incorrect; for given the intimate relationship between determinables and determinates, to say that these are equally fundamental is evidently not to say either that they are wholly distinct or (even granting Hume’s Dictum) modally independent. Moreover, if determinables and determinates can mutually found each other, other stipulated suppositions are called into question—e.g., that the fundamental entities are those that do not depend on any other entities, and that metaphysical dependence is asymmetric.

The possibility of fundamental determinables also bears on various first-order metaphysical topics. For example, Paul (2002, 2012) endorses a one-category ontology (‘mereological bundle theory’), on which properties and relations are fundamental, and property composition is “the fundamental glue” (2012: 242). Paul allows that determinables might be among the fundamental properties and relations (note 22), and moreover suggests that such posits may be required to accommodate theories couched in terms of properties and relations which are “extremely abstractly specified” (2012: 245).

5. Applications

We now canvass three among many topics in metaphysics where attention to determinables and determinates has played a significant role.[41]

5.1 Laws of nature and nomological modality

As mentioned previously, several philosophers have seen determinables and determinates as relevant to our understanding of laws of nature in both physics and the special sciences. Armstrong (1997) argues that irreducible determinables are needed to make sense of functionally specified laws in physics. Consider Newton’s law of gravitation:

\[F = K (M_1 M_2)/D\]

As Armstrong notes (see also Fales 1990: 61 and French 2014), substitution of the determinable quantities \(F\), \(M\), and \(D\) with determinate values gives rise to “a law which stands as determinate to the original, determinable, law” (1997: 63). One might try to provide an anti-realist or reductionist treatment of these seemingly determinable laws. Armstrong (1997) argues, however, that such deflationary treatments cannot make sense of the role of functional laws in sustaining counterfactuals, at least if properties are Aristotelian universals, whose existence depends upon their being instantiated; for then there will typically (and perhaps necessarily, for the case of continuous quantities) be gaps in the actual instantiations of functional laws. As such, the unity of determinates in these cases involves not just partial identities (as discussed in §3.4) but “strictly identical second-order properties”, which are the “real […] determinables” (1997: 247). Functional laws of nature are then taken to be relations between these determinable universals.

French offers a structuralist account of laws of nature as expressing determinable relations. As regards the above law, he says:

If we insert specific values […], we obtain a determinate instance of the law, expressing the relation that holds between determinate properties. So, the law as a whole can be regarded as expressing a determinable relation, which can be made determinate in specific situations. (2014: 300)

Again, French allows that determinable laws/relations may be fundamental. Reflecting that one reason for taking (some) determinables to be fundamental is that these are partly constituted by modal facts pertaining to their possible determinations, French moreover suggests that the determinable nature of laws provides a basis for physical modality:

these determinate instances correspond to solutions that can be represented by (more) specific models of the theory, and it is the shared structure between these models that yields the relevant physical modality. The relationship between the more generic and more specific models can be captured by that between determinables and determinates. (2014: 300)

Another application of determination to the metaphysics of laws concerns whether these are contingent, in having at best a restricted physical or nomological modality, or rather are metaphysically necessary. Kistler (2005) argues that such laws are metaphysically necessary, first arguing that the quantities in ‘laws of association’ such as the ideal gas law are reasonably seen as different determinables of the same determinate states, such that such laws are necessary; then generalizing on the base of systematicity considerations to other kinds of laws.[42]

5.2 The problem of mental/higher-level causation

How can mental goings-on bring about physical effects, as they seem to do, given that the physical realizers of mental goings-on are already sufficient to cause these effects? This question gives rise to the problem of mental (more generally, higher-level) causation, encoding two threats: first, that mental properties, if efficacious, give rise to problematic causal overdetermination; second, that avoiding overdetermination requires that mental properties be causally excluded by their realizers. Overdetermination and exclusion are avoided if mental and physical goings-on are identical, but in that case it seems that mental goings-on are not efficacious qua mental (see Horgan 1989); as Yablo puts it: “Mental events are effective, maybe, but not by way of their mental properties” (1992: 249). Moreover, type identity seems at odds with the multiple realizability of mental properties.

Some, including MacDonald and MacDonald (1986), Yablo (1992), Wilson (1999), and Shoemaker (2001), have suggested that a better response proceeds by taking mental properties to be determinables of their physical realizers.[43] The appeal to determination reflects various features of determinates and determinables, including Causal compatibility. As Yablo says,

[W]e know that [determinables and determinates] are not causal rivals. […] Determinables and their determinates, like objects and their parts, are guaranteed to be on the same team. (1992: 259)

Moreover, determinables are typically multiply determined, and given that determinables and determinates are type- and perhaps also token-distinct, one can argue (see §3.5) that determinables are distinctively efficacious. If mental properties are determinables of physical realizers, these features are inherited: as causal non-competitors, overdetermination is avoided while accommodating multiple realizability, compatible with the distinctness and distinctive efficacy of mental properties. Similar considerations apply to other higher-level goings-on, in which case realization might be determination, more generally.

A determinable-based approach to realization is subject to two main concerns (besides those generally targeting a powers-based account; see §3.5), each aiming to show that realization cannot be determination, since realization lacks some key feature of determination (see Ehring 1996; Funkhouser 2006, 2014; Walter 2007; and Worley 1997). First is the argument from mental multiple realizability, according to which such realizability effectively violates Determination ‘in respect of’ determinables (entailing that determinates differ in respect of determinables), since

Mental properties are said to be multiply realizable precisely because distinct physical realizers can be exactly the same with respect to the mental property they realize, (Walter 2007: 219)

in which case

[T]he physical realizers of the mental will not differ mentally at all, as they should if they are determinates of the requisite mental states. (Ehring 1996: 474)

Second is the argument from mental superdeterminates, according to which a mental property could be maximally specified qua mental—as, e.g., a precise state of searing pain (Ehring), or a belief maximally specified along the dimensions of content and confidence (Funkhouser); but if realization is determination, this would falsely imply that mental super-determinates could be further determined.

Wilson (2009) responds to these concerns by analogical attention to color metamerism, in which colors of the same hue, saturation and brightness can differ in respect of color, and are moreover reasonably taken to have physical determination dimensions. One metameric moral is that properties such as color may have physical determination dimensions; a second is that which determination dimensions are had by a given higher-level property may be science-relative. Applying the morals: there is no in-principle problem with mental properties’ having physical determination dimensions;[44] moreover, which dimensions are associated with mental properties may be science-relative. This allows accommodation of mental multiple realizability: mental properties with diverse physical realizers can be exactly alike, relative to the determination dimensions associated with psychology, compatible with these mental properties being different, relative to a lower-level physical science distinguishing these realizers. And given that different sciences may treat a single determinable as having different determination dimensions, mental properties may be super-determinate relative to a purely psychological science, while being further determined relative to a lower-level science.

A powers-based implementation of the metameric morals[45] also provides a basis for a response to a third objection, due to Worley (1997), according to which the constituents of beliefs are not constituents of their physical realizers, as they would have to be if (as per Worley’s constitution-based account; see §3.5) beliefs were determinables of physical determinates.[46] Supposing that constituents are associated with sets of powers, the content of a belief may be a constituent of its physical realizers, after all—not qua content per se, but qua the relevant subset of powers.

5.3 Metaphysical indeterminacy

Many phenomena appear to be indeterminate: macro-objects (clouds, mountains) appear to have imprecise boundaries; the future, it seems, might be genuinely open; on certain interpretations of quantum mechanics, some properties of a system (e.g., position and momentum, orthogonal spin components) cannot jointly have precise values. In these and other cases there are reasons to think that the indeterminacy is metaphysical, as opposed to merely semantic or epistemic. Elder (1996) suggests that determinables might be useful for purposes of making sense of “the idea that corresponding to (at least some) vague predicates there really are, in the world, vague properties” (1996: 150). Wilson (2013) more specifically argues that determinables and determinates provide the basis for an account of metaphysical indeterminacy (MI) having several advantages, including being reductive, compatible with classical logic, and such as to make systematic sense of MI in a wide range of cases, as follows:

Determinable-based MI: For a SOA to be metaphysically indeterminate in a given respect \(R\) at a time \(t\) is for the SOA to constitutively involve an object (entity) \(O\) such that (i) \(O\) has a determinable property \(P\) at \(t\), and (ii) for some level \(L\) of determination of \(P\), \(O\) does not have a unique level-\(L\) determinate of \(P\) at \(t\).

One application of Determinable-based MI is to macro-object boundary MI; here the conditions are satisfied in ‘glutty’ fashion, reflecting that macro-objects typically have multiple overlapping realizers, as with Mount Everest and the multiple overlapping aggregates of rock in its vicinity at any given time. On the suggested approach, Mount Everest has a determinable boundary property, but no unique determinate boundary property, since there are too many candidate determinates of the determinable, associated with the comparatively precise boundaries of its realizing aggregates (at best, these determinate boundaries can be attributed to Mount Everest in relativized fashion).[47]

Determinable-based MI is also usefully applied to the case of value indeterminacy on (some interpretations of) quantum mechanics. As Darby (2010) and Skow (2010) argue, ‘metaphysical supervaluationist’ accounts of MI (see Akiba 2004, Barnes 2010, Williams 2008, and Barnes and Williams 2011) cannot accommodate such MI. On these accounts MI is effectively understood as primitive unsettleness about which maximally precise world or state of affairs is the case; but as Darby and Skow observe, such an approach cannot model quantum MI, since the Kochen-Specker theorem rules out simultaneously assigning definite values to all properties of a quantum system.

By way of contrast, Determinable-based MI is compatible with the Kochen-Specker theorem (and more generally, Heisenberg’s uncertainty principle), since as discussed by Bokulich (2014) and Wolff (2015), one way for a given determinable to fail to be uniquely determined is if no candidate determinate is present or instantiated, as the Kochen-Specker theorem suggests can be the case. As Wolff puts it for the case of spin value indeterminacy:

Permitting the instantiation of determinables without determinates helps to describe this phenomenon, because we can say that \(x\)-spin and \(y\)-spin are determinables with two determinates each, and [after a spin-\(z\) measurement] neither of these determinates is instantiated even though the determinables “spin-\(x\)” and “spin-\(y\)” are. (2015: 385)[48]

As Wolff goes on to note, a determinable-based account doesn’t resolve all the mysteries associated with quantum MI; on the other hand, our experiential and theoretical familiarity with determinables goes considerable distance towards rendering such MI intelligible—offering, along the way, a nice case-in-point of how determinables may be useful for purposes of illuminating the structure of natural reality.


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The author would like to thank Benj Hellie, Steven French, Olivier Massin, an SEP referee, and the SEP editors, for helpful comments on this entry.

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