The Frege-Hilbert Controversy

First published Sun Sep 23, 2007; substantive revision Thu Aug 30, 2012

In the early years of the twentieth century, Gottlob Frege and David Hilbert, two titans of mathematical logic, engaged in a controversy regarding the correct understanding of the role of axioms in mathematical theories, and the correct way to demonstrate consistency and independence results for such axioms. The controversy touches on a number of difficult questions in logic and the philosophy of logic, and marks an important turning-point in the development of modern logic. This entry gives an overview of that controversy and of its philosophical underpinnings.

1. Introduction

In June 1899, at a ceremony marking the installation of the new Gauss-Weber monument in Göttingen, David Hilbert delivered a lecture on the foundations of geometry. Published later that year by Teubner under the title “Grundlagen der Geometrie” (“Foundations of Geometry”), the piece stands as a watershed in the development of modern mathematics and logic. Though the subject-matter of the work is geometry, its lasting influence concerns more broadly the role of axioms in mathematical theories, and the systematic treatment of such metatheoretical questions as consistency and independence. By presenting a rich trove of consistency and independence demonstrations, Hilbert displays here the power of the “formal” approach to axioms, and lays the groundwork for what soon becomes our own contemporary model-theoretic approach to formal systems. (For the historical background to Hilbert's treatment of axioms, see Nineteenth Century Geometry; for the role of Hilbert's work in the development of model theory, see model theory.)

Hilbert's lecture and monograph inspired a sharp reaction from his contemporary Gottlob Frege, who found both Hilbert's understanding of axioms, and his approach to consistency and independence demonstrations, virtually incomprehensible and at any rate seriously flawed. Frege's reaction is first laid out in his correspondence with Hilbert from December 1899 to September 1900, and subsequently in two series of essays (both entitled “On the Foundations of Geometry”) published in 1903 and 1906. Hilbert was never moved by Frege's criticisms, and did not respond to them after 1900. Frege, for his part, was never convinced of the reliability of Hilbert's methods, and held until the end that the latter's consistency and independence proofs were fatally flawed.

The correspondence and essays involved in the Frege-Hilbert debate shed light both on the emergence, at the turn of the 20th century, of the modern, formal conception of logic and of axiomatic theories as evidenced in Hilbert's work, and also on the very different approach to these issues found in Frege's work. The difference of opinion over the success of Hilbert's consistency and independence proofs is, as detailed below, the result of significant differences of opinion over such fundamental issues as: how to understand the content of a mathematical theory, what a successful axiomatization consists in, what the “truths” of a mathematical theory really are, and finally, what one is really asking when one asks about the consistency of a set of axioms or the independence of a given mathematical statement from others.

In what follows, we look briefly at Hilbert's technique in Foundations of Geometry, detail Frege's various criticisms thereof, and finally outline the overall conceptions of logic that give rise to the differences.

2. Hilbert's Foundations of Geometry

Hilbert's work in Foundations of Geometry (hereafter referred to as “FG”) consists primarily of laying out a clear and precise set of axioms for Euclidean geometry, and of demonstrating in detail the relations of those axioms to one another and to some of the fundamental theorems of geometry. In particular, Hilbert demonstrates the consistency of various sub-groups of the axioms, the independence of a number of axioms from others, and various relations of provability and of independence of important theorems from specific sub-groups of the axioms. Included are new demonstrations of the consistency of the entire set of axioms for Euclidean geometry, and of the independence of the axiom of parallels from the other Euclidean axioms.

Hilbert's consistency demonstrations in FG are all demonstrations of relative consistency, which is to say that in each case the consistency of a set AX of geometric axioms is reduced to that of a familiar background theory B, demonstrating that AX is consistent if B is. The important technique Hilbert employs is the reinterpretation of the geometric terms appearing in AX in such a way that, as reinterpreted, the members of AX express theorems of B. For example, Hilbert's first consistency-proof interprets the terms “point,” “line,” and “lies on” as standing respectively for a particular collection of ordered pairs of real numbers, for a collection of ratios of real numbers, and for an algebraically-defined relation between such pairs and ratios; under this reinterpretation, the geometric sentences in question express theorems of the background theory of real numbers.

That such a reinterpretation strategy guarantees relative consistency can be seen via the following reasoning: If the set AX were inconsistent, then it would logically imply a contradiction. But as logical implication is independent of the specific meanings of such terms as “point” and “line,” AX would continue to imply a contradiction under its reinterpretation. But that is just to say that a set of theorems of B would imply a contradiction, hence that B itself would be inconsistent.

Independence is demonstrated in exactly the same way. To show that a statement I is independent of a set AX of statements (relative to the consistency of B), one interprets the relevant geometric terms in such a way that the members of AX, as interpreted, express theorems of B, while I expresses the negation of a theorem of B. That is, the independence of I from AX (relative to the consistency of B) is demonstrated by proving the consistency of AX ∪ {~I} relative to that of B.

The reinterpretation technique used by Hilbert here is not entirely new in 1899, but Hilbert's systematic and extremely fruitful use of it marks a turning-point in the development of modern views about the nature of axioms and about meta-theoretic reasoning. Once Hilbert's re-interpretation technique is applied to the sentences of a fully formalized language, we have essentially the modern understanding of models, whose use today in demonstrations of consistency and independence differs only in detail from that of Hilbert's technique.[1]

Hilbert's central idea, again, is to focus not on particular geometrical concepts like point and line, but to pay attention instead to the logical relations that are said, by the axioms, to hold between those concepts. The question of whether the parallels axiom is independent of the other Euclidean axioms has entirely to do with the logical structure exhibited by these axioms, and nothing to do with whether it is geometric points and lines one is talking about, or some other subject-matter altogether. As Hilbert says,

[I]t is surely obvious that every theory is only a scaffolding or schema of concepts together with their necessary relations to one another, and that the basic elements can be thought of in any way one likes. If in speaking of my points I think of some system of things, e.g. the system: love, law, chimney-sweep … and then assume all my axioms as relations between these things, then my propositions, e.g. Pythagoras' theorem, are also valid for these things. In other words: any theory can always be applied to infinitely many systems of basic elements. (Letter to Frege of December 29, 1899, as excerpted by Frege (ellipsis Hilbert's or Frege's) in Frege 1980, p. 40.)

This understanding of the geometric terms as susceptible of multiple interpretations enables one to see the geometric sentences themselves, and sets of them, as providing definitions of a certain kind. Specifically: A set AX of sentences containing n geometric terms defines an n-place relation RAX holding of just those n-tuples which, when taken respectively as the interpretations of AX's geometric terms, render the members of AX true. (For example: if AX is the set {There are at least two points; Every point lies on at least two lines}, then RAX is the relation that holds of any triple <P, LO, L> such that P has at least two members, L has at least two members, and LO is a relation that holds between each member of P and at least two members of L.) The defined relation is simply the abstract structure, or as Hilbert puts it the “scaffolding,” shared by any interpretation that will render the axioms true.

We can now redescribe Hilbert's technique, in a nutshell, as follows: Given a set AX of sentences, Hilbert appeals to a background theory B to construct an interpretation of AX's geometric terms under which the members of AX express theorems of B. This interpretation is, assuming the consistency of B, an n-tuple satisfying the relation RAX defined by AX. Its existence demonstrates the satisfiability of RAX and consequently the consistency of AX relative to that of B. Both the satisfiability of RAX and the consistency of AX, in the sense under discussion here, are matters that hold entirely independently of the meanings of such geometric terms as “point” and “line,” which serve in Hilbert's work essentially as empty place-holders, susceptible of multiple interpretations.

3. Frege — Background

For Frege, things are radically different. Frege takes it that the sentences we use in mathematics are important only because of the nonlinguistic propositions (or, as he puts it, the “thoughts”) they express. Mathematicians working in French and in German are working on the same subject because, as Frege sees it, their sentences express the same thoughts. Thoughts are on this view the things that logically imply or contradict one another, they are the things that are true or false, and they are the things which together constitute mathematical theories. Each thought is about a determinate subject-matter, and says something true or false about that subject-matter.[2]

The question of the consistency of a set of geometric axioms is, as Frege understands it, a question about a specific set of thoughts. And because thoughts are determinately true or false, and have a determinate subject-matter, it makes no sense to talk about the “reinterpretation” of thoughts. The kind of reinterpretation that Hilbert engages in, i.e. of assigning different meanings to specific words, is something that can apply only to sentences, and never to thoughts, from the Fregean point of view. The first difficulty Frege notes with Hilbert's approach is that it is not clear what Hilbert means by “axioms:” if he means the kinds of things for which issues of consistency and independence can arise, then he must be talking about thoughts, while if he means the kinds of things which are susceptible of multiple interpretations, then he must be talking about sentences.

The difficulties multiply from here. When Hilbert provides a specific reinterpretation of the geometric terms en route to proving the relative consistency of a set AX, Frege notes that we now have two different sets of thoughts in play: the set we might call “AXG” of thoughts expressed when AX's terms take their ordinary geometric meanings (e.g. on which “point” means point) and the set we might call “AXR” of thoughts expressed when AX's terms take the meanings assigned by Hilbert's re-interpretation (on which e.g. “point” means pair of real numbers from the field Ω). Hilbert's reinterpretation strategy involves, from Frege's point of view, simply shifting our attention from the set AXG of thoughts ordinarily expressed by the sentences AX (and in whose consistency we are interested) to the new set AXR of thoughts expressed by AX under the reinterpretation. Granting the reliability of the background theory of real numbers, the set AXR is clearly a set of true thoughts and hence is consistent; but as far as Frege is concerned, the inference from the consistency of AXR to the consistency of the very different set AXG is fallacious.

Frege acknowledges that the set AX can be seen to provide an implicit definition of an abstract structure.[3] As he puts it, the set (with its geometric terms now understood as variables) characterizes a “general case,” of which e.g. AXG and AXR are “special cases,” or “special geometries.” But again he takes it that Hilbert's treatment of these cases involves a crucial, illegitimate inference:

[G]iven that the axioms in special geometries are all special cases of general axioms, one can conclude from lack of contradiction in a special geometry to lack of contradiction in the general case, but not to lack of contradiction in another special case. (Letter of January 6, 1900 in Frege 1980, p. 48.)

Again, the “lack of contradiction” in AXR is insufficient to establish the “lack of contradiction” in AXG.

4. The Deeper Disagreement

The bulk of Frege's critique of Hilbert consists of criticizing Hilbert's lack of terminological clarity, particularly as this applies to the differences between sentences and various collections of thoughts. He takes Hilbert to task for misleadingly using the same sentences to express different thoughts, and points out repeatedly that Hilbert's use of axioms as definitions needs considerably more-careful treatment than Hilbert affords it. The more-substantial criticism flows naturally from this terminological critique: Frege takes it that once one disentangles Hilbert's terminology, it becomes clear that he is simply not talking about the axioms of geometry at all, since the sets of thoughts he actually deals with are the misleadingly-expressed thoughts about e.g. real numbers. And, adds Frege, one cannot infer the consistency of the geometric axioms proper from that of the thoughts Hilbert treats.

Frege's complaints against Hilbert essentially end here. Having pointed out what he takes to be the illegitimate shift in subject-matter from geometric thoughts to non-geometric ones, and noted that Hilbert's reinterpretation strategy will always introduce such an illegitimate shift, he takes himself to have discredited that strategy. The interesting philosophical question which receives considerably less emphasis from Frege is that of why, exactly, the shift is illegitimate. Why is it that the consistency of AXG doesn't follow from that of the structurally-similar AXR, particularly when each of these sets is expressible via the same set AX of sentences?

We should note, to begin with, that from Frege's point of view the burden of argument is squarely with Hilbert: if Hilbert thinks that the consistency of AXG follows from either the consistency of AXR or from the truth of AXR's members, then it is up to Hilbert to show this. Frege does not go out of his way to demonstrate that the crucial inference is invalid, but seems to take his point to have been essentially made once he has pointed out the need for a justification here.

From Hilbert's point of view, of course, there is no need for such a justification. The differences that Frege insists on over and over again between the sets of sentences (AX) and the different sets of thoughts (AXG, AXR etc.) are entirely inconsequential from Hilbert's standpoint. Because consistency as Hilbert understands it applies to the “scaffolding” of concepts and relations defined by AX when its geometric terms are taken as place-holders, the consistency he has in mind holds (to put it in terms of thoughts) of AXG iff it holds of AXR, since both sets of thoughts are instantiations of the same “scaffolding.” The same point can be put in terms of sentences: Frege insists that the consistency-question that arises for the sentences under their geometric interpretation is a different issue from the one that arises for those sentences under their real-number interpretation; for Hilbert on the other hand, there is just one question, and it is answered in the affirmative if there is any interpretation under which the sentences express truths. Hence while Frege takes it that Hilbert owes an explanation of the inference from the consistency of AXR to that of AXG, for Hilbert there is simply no inference.

We turn now to the more substantial issue, namely, why the inference from the consistency of AXR to that of AXG is in fact fallacious from Frege's point of view. Frege clearly takes it that the consistency of the set of thoughts expressed by a set Σ of sentences is sensitive not just to the overall structure of those sentences, but also to the meanings of the non-logical (here, geometrical) terms that appear in the members of Σ. What we need to understand, in order to see why this should be the case for him, is how Frege understands the relationship between the meanings of terms and the logical implications that hold between thoughts expressed using those terms. This relationship comes out most clearly when we turn to Frege's method of demonstrating that a given thought follows logically from other thoughts.

In general, for Frege, we can show that a given thought τ follows logically from a set T of thoughts via a two-step procedure in which we (i) subject τ and/or the members of T to conceptual analysis, bringing out previously-unrecognized conceptual complexity in those thoughts, and (ii) prove the thus-analyzed version of τ from the thus-analyzed members of T. The clearest examples of this procedure appear in Frege's work on arithmetic. Frege holds for example that the thought expressed by

  1. The sum of two multiples of a number is a multiple of that number

follows logically from the thoughts expressed by

  1. (∀m)(∀n)(∀p)((m+n)+p = m+(n+p))

and by

  1. (∀n)(n = n+0).

He demonstrates this by providing a careful analysis of the notion of “multiple of” in terms of addition, giving us in place of (i) a more-complex (i′) which is then derived from (ii) and (iii).[4] Similarly, a significant part of Frege's logicist project consists of the careful analysis of such arithmetical notions as zero and successor, analysis which brings out previously-unnoticed complexity, and facilitates the proof of arithmetical truths. (For a discussion of the logicist project, see Frege.)

As Frege puts it in the early pages of his Foundations of Arithmetic, when we are trying to prove the truths of arithmetic from the simplest possible starting-points,

… we very soon come to propositions which cannot be proved so long as we do not succeed in analysing concepts which occur in them into simpler concepts or in reducing them to something of greater generality. (Frege 1884, §4.)

In short: the components of thoughts can sometimes be analyzed in terms of simpler or more general constituents, in a way that brings to light previously-hidden relations of logical entailment. Hence when we want to know whether a given thought is logically entailed by a set of thoughts, we need to pay attention, from Frege's point of view, not just to the overall structure exhibited by the sentences expressing those thoughts, but also to the contents of the individual terms that appear in those sentences.

Because we can sometimes discover that a thought τ is logically entailed by a set T of thoughts only after a careful analysis of some of the apparently-simple components of those thoughts, so too we will sometimes be able to discover that a set of thoughts is inconsistent, i.e. that it logically entails a contradiction, on the basis of such conceptual analysis. Hence the consistency of the set of thoughts expressed by a set Σ of sentences is something which turns not just on the overall structure of the sentences in Σ, but on the meanings of the terms appearing in Σ's sentences.

To clarify this last point, let's look at a non-mathematical example, one which neither Hilbert nor Frege explicitly dealt with. Consider the set of sentences {Jones had a nightmare, Jones didn't have a dream }, or equivalently its first-order rendition, {Nj, ~Dj}. The set is clearly consistent in the sense used by Hilbert in FG; it is a straightforward matter to provide interpretations of “Jones,” “x had a nightmare” and “x had a dream” (or of “j”, “N”, and “D”) such that the sentences, so interpreted, express truths. (Consider, for example, an interpretation on which “j” is assigned the number 7, “N” the set of prime numbers, and “D” the set of numbers greater than 12.) But from the Fregean point of view, the thoughts expressed are inconsistent, since part of what it is to have a nightmare is to have a dream. The inconsistency from Frege's point of view can be demonstrated by providing an analysis of the thoughts expressed, and noting that the results of this analysis yield the set {Jones had a disturbing dream, Jones didn't have a dream}.

For the same reason, two sets of thoughts that are structurally similar in the sense that they can be expressed, under different interpretations, by the same set of sentences, can differ with respect to Frege-consistency. The inference from the consistency of one such set of thoughts to the other will be fallacious.

Frege does not claim to be able to give specific geometric analyses which contradict particular consistency-claims of Hilbert's, and there is no evidence that he takes any of those claims to be false. That he might well have had some such analyses in mind is hinted at in a letter to Hilbert in which he claims that in his own unfinished investigations into the foundations of geometry, he was able to “make do with fewer primitive terms,” which presumably means that he takes some of the terms treated as primitive by Hilbert to be susceptible of analysis via others. (See the letter to Hilbert of December 27, 1899 in Frege 1980, p. 34.) Any such analysis would reveal relations of logical dependence (from Frege's point of view) where Hilbert would find independence. Because none of Frege's work on this topic has survived, we have no details about the specific analyses he might have given. The crucial point in Frege's criticism of Hilbert, however, is not a disagreement about particular analyses or the consequent failure of particular consistency and independence claims, but instead concerns the general methodology of consistency and independence proofs. Because for Hilbert the consistency of a set of sentences turns entirely on the overall structure they exhibit, while for Frege the consistency of the set of thoughts expressed turns additionally on the contents of the non-logical terms appearing in the sentences, Hilbert-consistency doesn't imply Frege-consistency.

5. Conclusion

Because the content of the geometric terms is irrelevant to the issues of consistency and independence with which Hilbert is concerned, it is immaterial from his point of view whether one understands his axioms to be (a) fully-interpreted sentences whose geometric terms have their ordinary geometric meanings, (b) fully-interpreted sentences whose geometric terms take on one of Hilbert's re-interpretations, or (c) partially-interpreted sentences whose geometric terms appear simply as place-holders. Hilbert's own discussion indicates sometimes one, and sometimes another of these ways of regarding the axioms, and given his purposes, it is clear that there is no need for precision here: the differences between (a), (b), and (c) are irrelevant to the kind of consistency in which Hilbert is interested. That a set of sentences is consistent in Hilbert's sense is a matter that's entirely independent of what its geometric terms mean, and this consistency is immediately implied by the satisfiability of the relation defined by those sentences when their geometric terms are treated as place-holders.

For Frege on the other hand, the differences just listed are crucial, particularly since the consistency of the thoughts expressed by the sentences construed as in (a) above is not implied either by the consistency of the thoughts expressed by those sentences understood as in (b) or by the satisfiability of the relation defined by the sentences understood as in (c). Hence we can see both why Frege found Hilbert's cavalier attitude regarding the distinctions between (a), (b), and (c) to be virtually incomprehensible, and why Hilbert found Frege's criticisms entirely unconvincing.

Despite the clear failure of communication between Hilbert and Frege, their debate brings to light a number of important issues, not least of which are (i) the role of schematically-understood sentences in providing implicit definitions, which Frege articulates more clearly on Hilbert's behalf than Hilbert had yet done, and (ii) the extent to which the logical relations are to be treated as “formal.” On this last issue, the difference between Frege and Hilbert is instructive. Long before the debate with Hilbert, Frege already held that logical rigor requires the use of formal systems of deduction, “formal” in the sense that all thoughts are expressed via precisely-determined sentences, and that all inference-rules and axioms are presented syntactically. (See e.g. Frege (1879).) Most important for our purposes is the fact that Frege's formal systems are entirely modern in the sense that the derivability in such a system of a sentence from a set of sentences turns just on the syntactic form of those sentences. The famous conceptual analyses on which much of Frege's work turns are all provided prior to proof; it is on the basis of conceptual analyses that one arrives at the appropriate sentences to treat within the formal system, but the analyses themselves play no role within the proofs proper. Hence when it comes to the positive work of demonstrating that a given sentence is derivable from a set of sentences, Frege is just like Hilbert: meanings don't matter. Indeed, at the time of their correspondence, Frege's work was considerably more “formal” than Hilbert's, since Hilbert at this time was not using an explicit syntactically-defined system of deduction.

Nevertheless, Frege's conception of logic has the result that there is only a one-way connection between logical implication as this holds between thoughts and formal derivability as this holds between sentences. Given a good formal system, a sentence σ is deducible from a set Σ only if the thought expressed by σ is in fact logically entailed by the thoughts expressed by the members of Σ. (This simply requires that one's axioms and rules of inference are well-chosen.) But the converse is false: that σ is not deducible in such a system from Σ is no guarantee that the thought expressed by σ is independent of the set of thoughts expressed by the members of Σ. For it may well be, as in the cases treated explicitly by Frege's own analyses, that further analysis of the thoughts and their components will yield a more-complex structure. When this happens, the analysis may return yet-more complex (sets of) sentences σ′ and Σ′ such that σ′ is, after all, deducible from Σ′. In short, because considerable logical complexity can lie undiscovered in the thoughts expressed by relatively-simple sentences, non-derivability is no guarantee of independence, in the Fregean scheme of things. There is a significant gap, as one might put it, between the logical and the formal.

For Hilbert on the other hand, at least in the context of axiomatized geometry, the logical relations simply are the formally-describable relations, since they have entirely to do with the structure exhibited by the sentences in question, or equivalently with the “scaffolding” of concepts defined by these sentences. It is because consistency in Hilbert's sense turns just on this abstract structure, and not on the contents of the terms instantiating the structure, that the reinterpretation strategy is effective.

Hilbert is clearly the winner in this debate, in the sense that roughly his conception of consistency is what one means today by “consistency” in the context of formal theories, and a near relative of his methodology for consistency-proofs is now standard. This is not to say that Frege's objections have been met, but rather that they have essentially been sidestepped via the enshrinement of the formal notion of consistency, and a lack of concern, at least under that title, with what Frege called “consistency.”


Primary Sources

  • Frege, G., 1879, Begriffsschrift, eine der arithmetischen nachgebildete Formelsprache des reinen Denkens, Halle: Louis Nebert. Translated as Concept Script, a formal language of pure thought modeled upon that of arithmetic, by S. Bauer-Mengelberg in From Frege to Gödel, J. van Heijenoort (ed), Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1967, pp. 5–82.
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  • –––, 1884, Die Grundlagen der Arithmetik: eine logisch-mathematische Untersuchung über den Begriff der Zahl, Breslau: W. Koebner. Translated as The Foundations of Arithmetic: A logico-mathematical enquiry into the concept of number, by J. L. Austin, Evanston, IL: Northwestern University Press, 1978.
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  • –––, 1969, Nachgelassene Schriften, Hermes, Kambartel, Kaulbach (eds), Hamburg: Felix Meiner Verlag. (English translation as Frege 1979).
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  • –––, 1984, Collected Papers on Mathematics, Logic and Philosophy, B. F. McGuinness (ed.), Oxford: Blackwell Publsishers, 1984.
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Thanks to Edward N. Zalta for helpful suggestions on this entry.

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Patricia Blanchette <>

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