Supplement to Frege's Theorem and Foundations for Arithmetic

Proof of Fact 6 Concerning the Weak Ancestral

Fact 6 concerning the weak ancestral \(R^{+}\) of \(R\) asserts:

Fact 6:
\(R^{*}(x,y)\rightarrow \exists z[R^{+}(x,z) \amp Rzy]\)

To prove this, we shall appeal to Fact 3 concerning the strong ancestral \(R^{*}\) of \(R\):

Fact 3:
\([R^{*}(x,y)\amp \forall u(Rxu\rightarrow Fu)\amp \textrm{Her}(F,R)]\rightarrow Fy\),

for any concept \(F\) and objects \(x\) and \(y\):

Now to prove Fact 6 about the weak ancestral, assume \(R^{*}(a,b)\). We want to show:

\(\exists z[R^{+}(a,z) \amp Rzb]\)

Notice that by \(\lambda\)-Conversion, it suffices to show:

\([\lambda w\, \exists z[R^{+}(a,z) \amp Rzw]]b\)

Let us use ‘\(P\)’ to denote this concept under which \(b\) should fall. Notice that we can prove \(Pb\) by instantiating Fact 3 (above) concerning the strong ancestral to \(P\), \(a\), and \(b\) and establishing the antecedent of the result. In other words, by Fact 3, we know:

\([R^{*}(a,b)\amp \forall u(Rau\rightarrow Pu)\amp \textrm{Her}(P,R)]\rightarrow Pb\)

So if we can show the conjuncts of the antecedent, we are done. The first conjunct is already established, by hypothesis. So it remains to show:

(1)   \(\forall u(Rau\rightarrow Pu)\)
(2)   \(\textrm{Her}(P,R)\)

To see what we have to show for (1), we expand the definition of \(P\) and simplify by using \(\lambda\)-Conversion. Thus, we have to show:

(1)   \(\forall u[Rau\rightarrow \exists z(R^{+}(a,z) \amp Rzu)]\)

So assume \(Rau\), to show \(\exists z(R^{+}(a,z) \amp Rzu)\). But it is an immediate consequence of the definition of the weak ancestral \(R^{+}\) that \(R^{+}\) is reflexive. (This is Fact 4 concerning the weak ancestral, in Section 4, “The Weak Ancestral of \(R\)”.) So we may conjoin and conclude \(R^{+}(a,a)\amp Rau\). From this, we may infer \(\exists z(R^{+}(a,z) \amp Rzu)\), by existential generalization, which is what we had to show.

To show (2), we have to show that \(P\) is hereditary on \(R\). If we expand the definitions of \(\textrm{Her}(P,R)\) and \(P\) and simplify by using \(\lambda\)-Conversion, then we have to show, for arbitrarily chosen objects \(x,y\):

(2)   \(Rxy\rightarrow [\exists z(R^{+}(a,z) \amp Rzx)\rightarrow \exists z(R^{+}(a,z) \amp Rzy)]\)

So assume

(A)   \(Rxy \)
(B)   \(\exists z(R^{+}(a,z)\amp Rzx)\)

to show: \(\exists z(R^{+}(a,z)\amp Rzy)\). From (B), we know that there is some object, say \(d\), such that:

\(R^{+}(a,d)\amp Rdx\)

So, by Fact 3 about the weak ancestral (Section 4, “The Weak Ancestral of \(R\)”), it follows that \(R^{*}(a,x)\), from which it immediately follows that \(R^{+}(a,x)\), by definition of \(R^{+}\). So, by conjoining (A), we have:

\(R^{+}(a,x) \amp Rxy\)

But since \(x\) was arbitrarily chosen, it follows that:

\(\exists z(R^{+}x(a,z) \amp Rzy)\),

which is what we had to show.

Return to Frege’s Theorem and Foundations for Arithmetic

Copyright © 2017 by
Edward N. Zalta <>

This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
Please note that some links may no longer be functional.
[an error occurred while processing the directive]