Supplement to Frege's Theorem and Foundations for Arithmetic

First Derivation of the Contradiction

[Note: We use \(\epsilon F\) to denote the extension of the concept \(F\). We use the expression ‘\(F(\epsilon G)\)’ to more clearly express the fact that the extension of the concept \(G\) falls under \(F\).]

The \(\lambda\)-expression which denotes the concept being the extension of a concept one doesn’t fall under is

\([\lambda x \, \exists F(x\eqclose \epsilon F \amp \neg Fx)]\)

As we saw in the text, we know that such a concept as this exists, by the Comprehension Principle for Concepts. Let ‘\(P\)’ abbreviate this name of the concept. So \(\epsilon P\) exists, by the Existence of Extensions principle.

Now suppose that \(P(\epsilon P)\), i.e., suppose

[\(\lambda x \, \exists F(x\eqclose \epsilon F \amp \neg Fx)](\epsilon P)\)

Then, by the principle of \(\lambda\)-Conversion, it follows that

\(\exists F[\epsilon P\eqclose \epsilon F\amp \neg F(\epsilon P)]\)

Let \(H\) be an arbitrary such concept. So we know the following about \(H\)

\(\epsilon P\eqclose \epsilon H\amp \neg H (\epsilon P)\)

Now given Law V, it follows from the first conjunct that \(\forall x(Px\equiv Hx)\). So since \(\neg H(\epsilon P)\), it follows that \(\neg P(\epsilon P)\), contrary to hypothesis.

So suppose instead that \(\neg P(\epsilon P)\). But, now, by \(\lambda\)-conversion, it follows that:

\(\neg\exists F[\epsilon P\eqclose \epsilon F\amp \neg F(\epsilon P)]\),


\(\forall F[\epsilon P\eqclose \epsilon F\rightarrow F(\epsilon P)]\)

But by instantiating this universal claim to \(P\), it follows from the self-identity of \(\epsilon P\) that \(P(\epsilon P)\), contrary to hypothesis.


Copyright © 2017 by
Edward N. Zalta <>

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