Notes to Platonism in Metaphysics

1. This is the most standard way to define the terms ‘platonism’ and ‘abstract object’, but there are other definitions in the literature. E.g., some philosophers choose to define them in terms of non-spatiality but not non-temporality; and some would argue that on this definition, the nature of an abstract object could change. Moreover, it is also worth noting that on some definitions of ‘physical object’, abstract objects could be physical; e.g., on one view, an object counts as a physical object just in case its existence is entailed by (true or accepted) physical theory; on this usage, abstract objects could be physical.

2. One might think that something is missing from this new version of the One Over Many, for one might think that part of the problem is to account for how two different things could share a nature. But I think people like Devitt would say that if you can account for how object a is F and also for how b is F, then you have accounted for how a and b share a nature.

3. It is worth pausing to note why this principle says only that we're committed by the singular terms in simple sentences and the existential quantifiers in existential sentences. The reason is that some singular terms and existential quantifiers are not ontologically committing. For instance, if I say ‘If Santa Claus lives at the North Pole, then we should be able to find him’, I have not committed to the existence of Santa Claus; and if I say ‘If there is a God, then there is a tooth fairy’, I have not committed to the existence of a God or a tooth fairy. This problem is avoided by concentrating on (a) singular terms within simple sentences, or atomic sentences, i.e., sentences of form ‘a is F’, ‘a is R-related to b’, ‘a, b, and c are S-related’, etc.; and (b) existential quantifiers in what I am calling existential sentences, i.e., sentences in which the existential quantifier is the main logical operator, i.e., sentences of the form ‘There is an object such that…’. Now, it would be wrong to say that these are the only sentences that are ontologically committing — e.g., we're committed by the singular term and existential quantifier in the sentence ‘Mars is a planet and there exist some teeth’, and this sentence doesn't fit into category (a) or (b) — but for present purposes, we can ignore such sentences and concentrate on sentences in categories (a) and (b).

4. Maddy did not take mathematical objects to exist outside of spacetime, so her view was not a version of platonism, as that view has been defined here. But I include her in this list, because on some definitions, she might count as a platonist, and she is often thought of as something like a platonist. In any event, we can say that her view has platonistic leanings, as is clear from the fact that it entails the existence of mathematical objects that are non-mental and, in some sense or other, non-physical (in particular, there is more to Maddian sets than the physical stuff that makes up their members).

5. Of course, some things are supposed to exist only in our heads, e.g., beliefs; thus, to say that a belief exists only in someone's head is not to say that it doesn't exist. But for things that aren't supposed to exist only in our heads — objective things like buildings and numbers — to say that they exist only in our heads is equivalent to saying that they don't exist.

6. One might doubt that this paraphrase is really nominalistic; for it would seem to commit people to things like sentences and mathematical theories, and one might argue that these things are best thought of as abstract objects.

7. In addition to fictionalism, there is a second (much more radical) way to claim that our mathematical theories are not true: one could endorse a non-cognitivist view of mathematics, claiming that sentences like ‘3 is prime’ don't really say anything at all and, hence, aren't the sorts of things that have truth values. One such view is game formalism, which holds that mathematics is a game of symbol manipulation and that, e.g., ‘3 is prime’ is one of the “legal results” of the game of arithmetic. This view was defended by Heine and Thomae and attacked vigorously by Frege (see Frege 1893-1903, sections 88-131). One might also interpret Wittgenstein's (1956) philosophy of mathematics as non-cognitivist, although this is controversial.

8. Someone like Davidson (1967) might claim that Boris believes the English sentence token (i.e., the one in the belief report) in virtue of the fact that it says-the-same as Russian sentence tokens that he believes. But the problem with this is that Boris has lots of beliefs that don't correspond to any Russian sentence tokens. For instance, he presumably believes that 17.427 is greater than 13.961; but it's unlikely that there has ever been a Russian sentence token that says this.

9. It needs to be kept in mind here that in formulating this argument for the existence of propositions, platonists do not commit to the view that all ‘that’-clauses are singular terms that denote propositions. Consider, e.g., the sentence ‘Ralph fears that the killer is coming’. One might very well doubt that this sentence says that Ralph fears a proposition; after all, since propositions are abstract objects, they are causally inert, and so they are not very scary — for instance, they can't shoot people. One might take this as evidence that the ‘that’-clause in the above sentence (that is, in ‘Ralph fears that the killer is coming’) does not denote (or purport to denote) a proposition, and indeed, one might take it as evidence that this ‘that’-clause isn't a singular term at all. There are a number of ways that platonists could try to respond to this: they might try to argue that despite appearances, the above ‘that’-clause does denote a proposition; or they might admit that it doesn't denote a proposition (they might even admit that it's not a singular term at all) and then argue that this doesn't undermine the claim that the ‘that’-clauses in belief ascriptions denote propositions. We won't pursue the question of how platonists ought to respond to challenges of this kind.

10. There is another sort of nominalist view that platonists of this sort would have to refute, namely, trope theory. (This view goes back at least to William of Ockham, but some people attribute this view, and not immanent realism, to Aristotle; others have attributed the view to Locke, Berkeley, and Hume; in any event, the view has been endorsed more recently by Stout (1914), Williams (1953), and Campbell (1990).) Trope theory holds that, e.g., red things are red because they have red tropes existing in them, where a trope is something like a particular aspect of a thing. Thus, trope theory is a bit like immanent realism, except that tropes are particulars. So whereas immanent realists maintain that red things are red because redness exists in them, trope theorists maintain that red things are red because red tropes exist in them; but the difference is that immanent realists maintain that one and the same thing (redness) exists in all red things, whereas trope theorists maintain that each red thing has its own trope. (Note that trope theory counts as a nominalist view (i.e., an anti-realist view) about properties, but that this is solely because properties are defined as universals. In a broader sense, trope theory is every bit as realist as immanent realism is, because tropes are just as real, according to trope theory, as properties are according to immanent realism, or for that matter, platonism.)

11. One might try to push the regress argument against platonists here, but it's not clear that it would succeed. If platonists say that a stands in the exemplification relation to Fness, one might ask: “How are a and Fness related to the exemplification relation?” But it's not clear that platonists can't just say that they exemplify it. There are worries that one might have about this view, but I won't pursue this here.

12. Platonists about properties who don't claim that properties are components of propositions could also try to argue that immanent realism is false because there are uninstantiated properties. They might do this by arguing for the literal, face-value truth of sentences like ‘The property of being a four-hundred-story building is not instantiated, but it might have been’. But one might think it would be harder to argue for the face-value truth of sentences like this than sentences like ‘Johnny believes that there is a four-hundred-story building in Sally's backyard’.

13. Frege's view entailed that for every predicate, there is a concept and an extension of that concept, and as Russell pointed out in a letter to Frege, this leads to contradiction. Contemporary Fregeans, such as Boolos (1986-87), Wright (1983), and Anderson and Zalta (2004), have found ways to avoid the contradiction.

14. It might seem that if stories are best thought of as abstract objects, then fictionalism about things like mathematical objects and propositions is not a genuinely nominalistic view, because fictionalism seems to commit to the truth of sentences like “‘3 is prime’ is true in the story of mathematics.” But fictionalists can avoid this worry by taking a fictionalistic attitude about stories, or fictions. It might seem that this would lead them into an unacceptable regress, but it does not; for a discussion of this issue, see Balaguer (1998a).

15. This interpretation of Gödel is a bit controversial. Evidence for it comes not just from his (1964), but also from his (1951). For more on the interpretation of Gödel, see Parsons (1995) and van Atten and Kennedy (2003).

Copyright © 2016 by
Mark Balaguer <>

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