Emergent Properties

First published Tue Sep 24, 2002; substantive revision Wed Jun 3, 2015

Emergence is a notorious philosophical term of art. A variety of theorists have appropriated it for their purposes ever since George Henry Lewes gave it a philosophical sense in his 1875 Problems of Life and Mind. We might roughly characterize the shared meaning thus: emergent entities (properties or substances) ‘arise’ out of more fundamental entities and yet are ‘novel’ or ‘irreducible’ with respect to them. (For example, it is sometimes said that consciousness is an emergent property of the brain.) Each of the quoted terms is slippery in its own right, and their specifications yield the varied notions of emergence that we discuss below. There has been renewed interest in emergence within discussions of the behavior of complex systems and debates over the reconcilability of mental causation, intentionality, or consciousness with physicalism.

1. A Brief History

British emergentists of the late-nineteenth and early-twentieth centuries may not have been the first to embrace emergentist ideas (Caston 1997 provides evidence that Galen was an emergentist), but they were certainly the first to work out a comprehensive emergentist picture. Much of the defense of emergentism in this era was centered on chemistry and biology. The question was whether or not the constitutive principles and features of these sciences were reducible to those of the corresponding ‘lower level’ sciences of physics and chemistry, respectively. Reduction-minded ‘mechanists’, who supposed that the processes of life were governed wholly by physical-chemical principles, contended with the extreme anti-reductionist ‘vitalists,’ who posited an entelechy, a primitive substance or directing principle embodied in the organism which guided such characteristic vital processes as embryonic development and the regeneration of lost parts.[1] Emergentists sought to develop a middle way, eschewing vital substances but retaining — in some sense — irreducibly vital qualities or processes.

1.1 J.S. Mill

Here is the early exponent of emergentism, J.S. Mill:

All organised bodies are composed of parts, similar to those composing inorganic nature, and which have even themselves existed in an inorganic state; but the phenomena of life, which result from the juxtaposition of those parts in a certain manner, bear no analogy to any of the effects which would be produced by the action of the component substances considered as mere physical agents. To whatever degree we might imagine our knowledge of the properties of the several ingredients of a living body to be extended and perfected, it is certain that no mere summing up of the separate actions of those elements will ever amount to the action of the living body itself. (A System of Logic, Bk.III, Ch.6, §1)

In analyzing such phenomena, Mill introduces the notion of a heteropathic effect and the attendant notion of a heteropathic law, in contrast to homopathic effects and laws. He does this by way of contrasting two modes of the conjoint action of causes, the ‘mechanical’ and ‘chemical’ modes. Mill says that the essence of the mechanical mode is that the total effect of several causes acting in concert is identical to what would have been the sum of effects of each of the causes acting alone. The laws of vector addition of forces, such as the parallelogram law, are for him the paradigm example of the conjoint action of causes in the mechanical mode. The total effect of two forces F and G acting in concert on a particle p just is the effect of F acting on p followed by G acting on p. In imitation of the principle of ‘Composition of Forces’ operative in physics, Mill named the corresponding principle for causes the ‘Composition of Causes.’ In Mill's terminology, effects of multiple causes produced in the mechanical mode — i.e. in accordance with the Composition of Causes — are known as ‘homopathic effects.’ Laws which subsume such causal relations between causes and their homopathic effects are known as ‘homopathic laws.’

By contrast, the chemical mode of the conjoint action of causes is characterized by a violation of the Composition of Causes: the joint action of multiple causes acting in the chemical mode is not the sum of effects of the causes had they been acting individually. This mode of conjoint action of causes is named after the chemical reactions which typically exhibit it, e.g.:

NaOH + HCl → NaCl + H2O

(Sodium hydroxide + hydrochloric acid produces sodium chloride + water)

The product of this neutralization reaction, water and a salt, is in no sense the sum of the effects of the individual reactants, an acid and a base. These are ‘heteropathic effects,’ and the causal laws which subsume them are ‘heteropathic laws.’ Heteropathic laws and effects correspond to a class of laws and effects that the later British Emergentists dubbed ‘emergent.’ Mill clearly believed in the existence of heteropathic laws within chemistry and biology, while supposing it conceivable that psychology generally could be reduced to physiology.

Within each level, however, there are also numerous homopathic laws characterizing causal interactions which obey the Composition of Causes. One might wonder how homopathic and heteropathic laws interact. On Mill's account, higher-level heteropathic laws will supplement but not supplant lower-level laws (whether homopathic or heteropathic). Regarding the relations between lower-level and higher-level laws in the case of vegetable and animal substances, Mill writes:

Those bodies continue, as before, to obey mechanical and chemical laws, in so far as the operation of those laws is not counteracted by the new laws which govern them as organized beings. (1843, p. 431)

The compatibility of higher-level and lower-level laws is due in some cases to lower-level laws containing ceteris paribus clauses, and in others to the fact that lower-level dynamical laws will simply sum over more causes. For example, Newton's second law, F = ma, does not state that only physical forces count. If any basic chemical or biological forces exist, they will be summed with whatever physical forces there are in the dynamical context, and that will be the value of F in the equation.[2]

It is important to note that both homopathic and heteropathic laws for Mill are causal laws, and homopathic and heteropathic effects are effects of causal interactions. Thus, Mill's dynamical account of emergence (heteropathic interactions) differs importantly from the synchronic, noncausal covariational account of the relationship of emergent features to the conditions that give rise to them that C. D. Broad was to espouse in Mind and Its Place in Nature (1925). Mill's account is thus an important precursor to the atypical dynamical accounts of emergence in the literature today. (See the discussion of Humphreys' and O'Connor's accounts in Part IV below.)

1.2 C. D. Broad

British Emergentism reaches its zenith with C.D. Broad's monumental The Mind and Its Place in Nature (1925), reworked from his Tarner lectures delivered at Cambridge in 1923. It is interesting to note that the aim of the Tarner Benefaction was to found a course of lectures on “the relation or lack of relation between the various sciences.” This is none other than the familiar contemporary question of the autonomy of the special sciences (Fodor 1974). We suggest below that Samuel Alexander's conception of emergentism is actually the closest parallel to the modern view known as nonreductive physicalism.

Broad sees his inquiry as aimed at answering a general question of which the debate between the Mechanists and Vitalists about living organisms is a particular instance: “Are the apparently different kinds of material objects irreducibly different?” (1925, p. 43) Broad is not merely interested in resolving the Mechanist-Vitalist controversy, but in answering the broader question of whether the special sciences are reducible to more general sciences (e.g. biology to chemistry), and ultimately to physics. He writes:

[One] wonders whether the question ought not to have been raised long before the level of life … The question: Is chemical behaviour ultimately different from dynamical behaviour? seems just as reasonable as the question: Is vital behaviour ultimately different from non-vital behaviour? And we are much more likely to answer the latter question rightly if we see it in relation to similar questions which might be raised about other apparent differences of kind in the material realm. (1925, p. 44)

He suggests that two types of answers to the reducibility question can be given, mechanism and emergentism. Broad characterizes the purest form of the Mechanist position thus:

[There] is one and only one kind of material. Each particle of this obeys one elementary law of behaviour, and continues to do so no matter how complex may be the collection of particles of which it is a constituent. There is one uniform law of composition, connecting the behaviour of groups of these particles as wholes with the behaviour which each would show in isolation and with the structure of the group. All the apparently different kinds of stuff are just differently arranged groups of different numbers of the one kind of elementary particle; and all the apparently peculiar laws of behaviour are simply special cases which could be deduced in theory from the structure of the whole under consideration, the one elementary law of behaviour for isolated particles, and the one universal law of composition. On such a view the external world has the greatest amount of unity which is conceivable. There is really only one science, and the various “special sciences” are just particular cases of it. (1925, p. 76)

As Broad notes, it is easy to see that there are weaker Mechanist positions which are still consistent with the idea and spirit of Mechanism, though for economy's sake we shall not explore such variants here.

The Emergentist position taken by Broad rejects the deep ontological unity posited by the Mechanist position. If emergence obtains, theorists would be forced to rest content with a hierarchy of various sciences ranging from the universal — physics — to the most specific (1925, p. 77). While Emergentists, too, are physical substance monists (“there is only fundamentally one kind of stuff”), they recognize “aggregates [of matter] of various orders” — a stratification of kinds of substances, with different kinds belonging to different orders, or levels. Each level is characterized by certain fundamental, irreducible properties that emerge from lower-level properties. Correspondingly, there are two types of laws: (1) ‘intra-ordinal’ laws, which relate events within an order, i.e., a law connecting an aggregate of that order instantiating a property of that order at a time with some aggregate of that order instantiating some other property at a certain time; and (2) ‘trans-ordinal’ laws, which characterize the emergence of higher-level properties from lower-level ones. Emergent properties are identified by the trans-ordinal laws that they figure in; each emergent property appears in the consequent of at least one trans-ordinal law, the antecedent of which is some lower-level property:

A trans-ordinal law would be one which connects the properties of aggregates of adjacent orders. A and B would be adjacent, and in ascending order, if every aggregate of order B is composed of aggregates of order A, and if it has certain properties which no aggregate of order A possesses and which cannot be deduced from the A-properties and the structure of the B-complex by any law of composition which has manifested itself at lower levels … A trans-ordinal law would be a statement of the irreducible fact that an aggregate composed of aggregates of the next lower order in such and such proportions and arrangements has such and such characteristic and non-deducible properties. (1925, pp. 77-78)

Trans-ordinal laws are what we now call ‘emergent laws,’ fundamental, irreducible laws that describe a synchronic, noncausal covariation of an emergent property and its lower-level emergent base. Emergent laws are not metaphysically necessitated by any lower-level laws, boundary conditions and any lower-level compositional principles. On the epistemological status of emergent laws, Broad comments that:

There is nothing, so far as I can see, mysterious or unscientific about a trans-ordinal law or about the notion of ultimate characteristics of a given order. A trans-ordinal law is as good a law as any other; and, once it has been discovered, it can be used like any other to suggest experiments, to make predictions, and to give us practical control over external objects. The only peculiarity of it is that we must wait till we meet with an actual instance of an object of the higher order before we can discover such a law; and that we cannot possibly deduce it beforehand from any combination of laws which we have discovered by observing aggregates of a lower order. (1925, p. 79)

Here we see the unpredictability element of Emergentism that is often discussed. The idea is that even the ideal theorist — Broad's mathematical archangel — with complete knowledge of the lower-level aggregates and properties will be helpless at predicting what might emerge from a specific lower-level structure with certain properties prior to observing the actual instantiation of the complex, higher-level event. This unpredictability, however, is not constitutive of emergence, but rather a consequence of the metaphysical irreducibility of the emergent properties and the trans-ordinal laws they bring in their train.[3]

1.3 Samuel Alexander

Though Broad was the last of the major British emergentists, we reserve the final slot for Samuel Alexander, who, inspired by his contemporary, C. Lloyd Morgan, gives a very different account of emergence.[4] Alexander's views are embedded within a comprehensive metaphysics, some crucial aspects of which are, to these readers, obscure. What is crystal clear in Alexander is that the activity of a living human being consists in a single kind of process whose fundamental qualities are physico-chemical:

We are forced, therefore, to go beyond the mere correlation of the mental with these neural processes and to identify them. There is but one process which, being of a specific complexity, has the quality of consciousness…. (vol.II, p. 5)

He is also adamant that, such identity of process notwithstanding, the mental process is “not merely neural” (p. 6), but “something new, a fresh creation” (p. 7). It involves a “distinctive quality” (p. 55) which emerges, rather than merely being resultant, from the neural process (p. 14).

What is the upshot of this conception for the relationship of physical principles to those exclusively concerned with higher levels of organization? Interpreters usually focus on texts such as these:

Physical and chemical processes of a certain complexity have the quality of life. The new quality life emerges with this constellation of such processes, and therefore life is at once a physico-chemical complex and is not merely physical and chemical, for these terms do not sufficiently characterize the new complex which in the course and order of time has been generated out of them. Such is the account to be given of the meaning of quality as such. The higher quality emerges from the lower level of existence and has its roots therein, but it emerges therefrom, and it does not belong to that level, but constitutes its possessor a new order of existent with its special laws of behaviour. The existence of emergent qualities thus described is something to be noted, as some would say, under the compulsion of brute empirical fact, or, as I should prefer to say in less harsh terms, to be accepted with the “natural piety” of the investigator. It admits no explanation. (pp.46–7)

To call [a structure] organism is but to mark the fact that its behaviour, its response to stimulation, is, owing to the constellation, of a character different from those which physics and chemistry are ordinarily concerned with, and in this sense something new with an appropriate quality, that of life. (p.62)

Such texts can easily be read as claiming that emergent features generate ‘configurational forces’ which supplement those of basic physics and chemistry. However, this reading is mistaken. First, it does not comport easily with the equally repeated claim that

The [emergent] quality and the constellation to which it belongs are at once new and expressible without residue in terms of the processes proper to the level from which they emerge… (p.45, emphasis added; cf. p.67)

At this point, we should ask ourselves, what exactly are ‘qualities’, according to Alexander? Consider that he remarks that speaking of ‘the new emergent quality’ of life really just “sums up” a number of interconnected features, such as self-regulation, plasticity of behavioral response, and reproduction (p.63; cf. p.70). This might suggest that talk of ‘a new quality’ is very often shorthand for what is in fact a complex set of features. Still, given the emphatic nature of his claims for the newness of emergent qualities, Alexander is probably best read as holding that corresponding to our summary terms “life” and “mind” are certain primitive features or other associated with the organized structures.

Do these primitive features exert a primitive form of causality, additional to the forms exerted at the level of basic physics? (Do they involve fundamental ‘configurational forces’?)[5] Here, the answer is certainly negative. For he allows that a Laplacian calculator of unlimited computational ability who knew only the basic principles of physics and the state of the universe at a pre-biological stage might predict the subsequent distribution of all matter in physical terms (pp.327–9). Contrast this with our first quotation from Mill.

Still, the Laplacian calculator could not predict the emergent qualities and processes of living and minded systems. Furthermore, these emergent qualities are causally relevant to the physical — they are not epiphenomenal (pp.8–9). The reader will be forgiven for doubting whether these disparate claims form a coherent package. Alexander's attempt to harmonize them is as follows: Emergent qualities are novel qualities that supervene on a distinctive kind of physico-chemical process. (They appear always and only in such complex systems, as a matter of empirical law.) They display their own characteristic form of activity, yet in a manner fully consonant with the completeness of fundamental physics. They are not epiphenomenal because, owing to supervenience, they pass a counterfactual test for causal efficacy: A given neural process would not possess its specific neural character if it were not also mental (pp.8–9). While “strictly speaking,” the mental qualities cause the coming to be of other mental qualities, and the associated, underlying neural qualities have neural effects, since there is but one process having both kinds of qualities, there is also a sense in which the mental state (identical to the neural state) causes a subsequent neural state (pp.12–13).

In sum, for those familiar with contemporary views on mental causation, we have a view very close in detail to a standard form of non-reductive physicalism (NRP). (The one major aspect of Alexander's view that is not clearly in agreement with standard forms of NRP is that his property type-dualism is apparently not matched with an acceptance of token identity. As we read Alexander, qualities are immanent to physical things, so distinctness of primitive qualities entails both type and token non-identity.) NRP emphasizes that while special sciences do not ‘compete with’ or complete physics, they do have an explanatory ‘autonomy’ — they use distinctive concepts and laws that cannot be derived from physical laws and concepts using only definitions and other necessary truths. Compare Alexander:

To call [a structure] organism is but to mark the fact that its behaviour, its response to stimulation, is, owing to the constellation, of a character different from those which physics and chemistry are ordinarily concerned with, and in this sense something new with an appropriate quality, that of life. At the same time, this new method of behaviour is also physico-chemical and may be exhibited without remainder in physico-chemical terms, provided only the nature of the constellation is known…Until that constellation is known, what is specially vital may elude the piecemeal application of the methods of physics and chemistry…. If the study of life is not one with a peculiar subject-matter, though that subject-matter is resoluble without residue into physico-chemical processes, then we should be compelled ultimately to declare … psychology to be a department of physiology, and physiology of physics and chemistry…. (pp.62–3)

Such is the account to be given of the meaning of quality as such. The higher quality emerges from the lower level of existence and has its roots therein, but it emerges therefrom, and it does not belong to that level, but constitutes its possessor a new order of existent with its special laws of behaviour. (p.46)

These two passages have a very Fodorian flavor.[6] They both emphasize the non-competing yet distinctive nature of special science “patterns of behavior,” and the second seems to give a natural-kind criterion for qualityhood. This reading is bolstered by Alexander's discussion of the reducibility of chemistry to physics, on which he is neutral. He says that the question hinges on whether “chemical matter is not so distinctively different in the way of complexity from physical matter that ‘chemism’ is properly a new quality emerging from physical existence” (p.61). Allowing in this way that the ‘distinctiveness’ of process that is the criterion of an emergent quality comes in degrees fits what we should expect on a Fodor-style, natural-kind picture.

1.4 Summary of British Emergentism

Let us sum up our discussion of the British Emergentists. Common to all these theorists is a layered view of nature. The world is divided into discrete strata, with fundamental physics as the base level, followed by chemistry, biology, and psychology (and possibly sociology). To each level corresponds a special science, and the levels are arranged in terms of increasing organizational complexity of matter, the bottom level being the limiting case investigated by the fundamental science of physics. As we move up the levels, the sciences become increasingly specialized, dealing only with a smaller set of increasingly complex structures with distinguishing characteristics which are the science's focus. The task of physics is to investigate the fundamental properties of the elementary constituents of nature and the laws that characterize them, whilst the task of the special sciences is to elucidate the properties had by complex material substances and the laws governing their characteristic behavior and interactions.

Crucial to an account of emergence, however, is a view concerning the relationship of such levels. On this score, we find that there are, in fact, two rather different pictures of emergence, one represented by Mill and Broad, and the other represented by Alexander. For Mill and Broad, emergence involves the appearance of primitive high-level causal interactions that are additional to those of the more fundamental levels. Alexander, by contrast, is committed only to the appearance of novel qualities and associated, high-level causal patterns which cannot be directly expressed in terms of the more fundamental entities and principles. But these patterns do not supplement, much less supersede, the fundamental interactions. Rather, they are macroscopic patterns running through those very microscopic interactions. Emergent qualities are something truly new under the sun, but the world's fundamental dynamics remain unchanged.

2. Epistemological Emergence

When we turn to the contemporary scene, easily the more popular approach to emergence descends from Alexander, not Mill and Broad. Though details differ, representatives of this approach characterize the concept of emergence strictly in terms of limits on human knowledge of complex systems. Emergence for such theorists is fundamentally an epistemological, not metaphysical, category. (Hence, their views of emergence are in fact weaker still than Alexander's position. Alexander held that emergent qualities were metaphysically primitive, although they did not alter the fundamental physical dynamics.) The two most common versions are these:

Predictive: Emergent properties are systemic features of complex systems which could not be predicted (practically speaking; or for any finite knower; or for even an ideal knower) from the standpoint of a pre-emergent stage, despite a thorough knowledge of the features of, and laws governing, their parts.

Irreducible-Pattern: Emergent properties and laws are systemic features of complex systems governed by true, lawlike generalizations within a special science that is irreducible to fundamental physical theory for conceptual reasons. The macroscopic patterns in question cannot be captured in terms of the concepts and dynamics of physics. Although he does not use the language of emergence, Jerry Fodor (1974) expresses this view nicely in speaking of the ‘immortal economist’ who vainly tries to derive economic principles from a knowledge of physics and the distribution of physical qualities in space-time.

This distinction is probably not a sharp one. Our use of it is intended to reflect the variable emphases of different emergence theorists, and such theorists do not often carefully distinguish their views from those of others. For some theorists, emergence reflects the unpredictable macroscopic outcomes of the world's dynamical evolution. Hence, they focus entirely on diachronic relationships between matter in pre- and post-complexity stages. For others, emergence concerns the relationship between micro- and macro-level theories, and so is equally manifested in synchronic patterns at different levels.

An instance of the temporal view of epistemological emergence may be Popper (1977). Popper confusingly blurs together a variety of issues — the status of general causal determinism, the metaphysics of indeterministic causality, and the synchronic relationship of properties of microscopic parts and macroscopic wholes. In places he argues that there are emergent features in the structural/dynamical sense, and it is likely that he also believes that there are emergent features in the stronger, ontological sense which we will discuss in the following section. Nonetheless, it is the case that he often equates emergence with unpredictability (see, e.g., p.16) and suggests that the failure of causal determinism is crucial to emergence in any of these senses:

If this Laplacian determinism is accepted, nothing whatever can be unpredictable in principle. So evolution cannot be emergent. (p. 22)

Any change in the higher level (temperature) will thus influence the lower level (the movement of the individual atoms). The one-sided dominance [of higher on lower levels of matter] is due … to the random character of the heat motions of the atoms…. For it seems that were the universe per impossible a perfect determinist clockwork, there would be no layers and therefore no such dominating influence would occur.

This suggests that the emergence of hierarchical levels or layers, and of an interaction between them, depends upon a fundamental indeterminism of the physical universe. Each level is open to causal influence from lower and from higher levels. (p.35)

A weaker variety of the prediction-based construal of emergence is offered by Mark Bedau (1997). He defines the notion of a weakly emergent state (contrasted with strong emergence of the sort discussed in our following section) thus: a macroscopic state which could be derived from a knowledge of the system's microdynamics and external conditions but only by simulating it, or modeling all the interactions of the realizing microstates leading up to it from its initial conditions. He has in mind in part chaotic phenomena, whereby long-range outcomes of a process are sensitive to very small differences in its initial conditions, owing to the nonlinear character of the system's dynamics. One might strengthen Bedau's condition by noting that when the existence of such processes is combined with the apparent fact that fundamental physical properties can be specified only approximately by empirical methods, the upshot may well be a kind of unpredictability in principle, at least for any finite, empirical observers. However, pace Popper, this does not require the system's dynamics to be indeterministic. (See Kellert 1993 for a thorough and accessible discussion of the mathematic features of chaotic dynamics and their philosophical implications; see Wilson 2013 for discussion of whether and when considerations of nonlinearity provide a basis for characterizing emergence of metaphysical varieties.)

There are a variety of recent instances of the second, structural/dynamic view of epistemological emergence. Much of this discussion has been influenced by the intertheoretic account of reduction, and its antithesis, emergence, given by Ernest Nagel (1961). (Nagel himself gives such an analysis of the notion of emergence on pp.366–374.) Paul Teller (1992) suggests a definition he intends to have broad application: a property is emergent if and only if it is not explicitly definable in terms of the non-relational properties of any of the object's proper parts (pp.140–1). As he notes, on this construal, emergent properties will include both relational and non-relational properties. He also admits that this will include fairly uninteresting cases.

As with Bedau, Andy Clark (1997, 2000) has his eye on complex systems theory (and cognitive science more particularly) in articulating a notion of emergence, but prefers one that will encompass an even broader range of phenomena that are striking from a macroscopic point of view. He suggests that a phenomenon is emergent just in case it is best understood by attention to the changing values of a collective variable — one that “tracks a pattern resulting from the interactions among multiple elements in a system,” which may include aspects of the environment (1997, p.112). Emergence will come in degrees as a function of the complexity of interactions subsumed by the collective variable.

Robert Batterman (2001), by contrast, connects philosophical discussion of emergence to intertheoretic ‘reduction’ within the physical sciences. He takes his point of departure from the fact that in actual scientific practice, reductions of theories to more fundamental ones are rarely, if ever, ‘smooth,’ in the sense that all of the central concepts of the less fundamental theory are directly characterizable and explainable in terms of the resources of the more basic theories, even given all necessary information concerning initial and boundary conditions. He discusses a range of striking phenomena arising at singular asymptotic limits for the relation of the two theories. The properties of systems at the limit values, he argues, cannot be derived from the more fundamental theories; instead, they require one to make use of a special-case theory involving elements of both the original two. These are the properties Batterman calls ‘emergent.’ Note that no claim is made concerning their ontological novelty or impact upon the fundamental physical dynamics. Rather, it is a point about the adequacy of the would-be reducing theories: while all the phenomena may be ‘grounded in,’ or ‘contained by,’ the reducing theory, the theory itself is unable to capture or explain the distinctive nature of the phenomena.

A general rule of thumb in perusing the diverse recent literature on emergence is that emergence encompasses whatever striking macroscopic phenomena the theorist in question is interested in. Philosophers desire the concept to have clear application, and their different foci within the special sciences lead them to slant the notion in somewhat distinct ways. (For discussion see section 4 of this article.)

3. Ontological Emergence

3.1 The Standard Ontology of Emergence: Supervenience Emergentism

Recall that among the British Emergentists, Mill and Broad had a more robustly ontological conception of emergence than the notions discussed immediately above. This is not always transparent in their writings, as they sometimes use epistemological criteria for identifying the metaphysical concept they have in mind. Here we offer a composite picture that captures what is implicit or explicit in a widespread understanding of ontological emergence from that era right up to much recent writing. We dub this view “supervenience emergentism.”

Ontological emergentists see the physical world as entirely constituted by physical structures, simple or composite. But composites are not (always) mere aggregates of the simples. There are layered strata, or levels, of objects, based on increasing complexity. Each new layer is a consequence of the appearance of an interacting range of ‘novel qualities.’ Their novelty is not merely temporal (such as the first instance of a particular geometric configuration), nor the first instance of a particular determinate of a familiar determinable (such as the first instance of mass 157.6819 kg in a contiguous hunk of matter). Instead, it is a novel, fundamental type of property altogether. We might say that it is ‘nonstructural,’ in that the occurrence of the property is not in any sense constituted by the occurrence of more fundamental properties and relations of the object's parts. Further, newness of property, in this sense, entails new primitive causal powers, reflected in laws which connect complex physical structures to the emergent features. (Broad's trans-ordinal laws are laws of this sort.)

Emergent laws are fundamental; they are irreducible to laws characterizing properties at lower levels of complexity, even given ideal information as to boundary conditions. Since emergent features have not only same-level effects, but also effects in lower levels, some speak of the view's commitment to “downward causation” (a phrase originating in Campbell 1974).

Earlier emergentists did not give very clear accounts of the relationship between the necessary physical conditions and the emergents, apart from the general, lawful character of emergence. Given the requisite structural conditions, the new layer invariably appears. Recent commentators have suggested that we think of this in terms of synchronic supervenience, specifically “strong” supervenience. So, for example, McLaughlin (1997) defines emergent properties as follows: “If P is a property of w, then P is emergent if and only if (1) P supervenes with nomological necessity, but not with logical necessity, on properties the parts of w have taken separately or in other combinations; and (2) some of the supervenience principles linking properties of the parts of w with w's having P are fundamental laws” (p. 39). (A law L is a fundamental law if and only if it is not metaphysically necessitated by any other laws, even together with initial conditions.) And though he does not say it explicitly here, it's clear that he thinks of this supervenience synchronically: given the ‘basal’ conditions at time t, there will be the emergent property at t. Van Cleve (1990) and Kim (1999, 2006a, 2006b) also think of the relation as a metaphysically contingent but nomologically necessary form of (synchronic) strong supervenience. (For further discussion see the entry on supervenience.)

On this picture, emergence is seen as a brute supervenience relation which holds in virtue of emergent laws, which are fundamental laws. This picture of ontological emergence is widely regarded as the standard formulation of ontological emergence, of which Broad's (1925) account of emergence and more recent accounts such as Van Cleve (1990), Kim (1990, 1999, 2006a), O'Connor (1994), McLaughlin (1997), and Wilson (1999, 2002) are examples. Though supervenience emergentism remains the received picture of ontological emergence (Crane 2001a, Kim 2006a), several questions about its consistency with major emergentist tenets has pushed emergentists toward alternative conceptions of ontological emergence. In particular, it is unclear how supervenience emergentism allows for novel, downward causal powers for emergent properties whilst still guaranteeing the covariation of emergent properties with basal properties in a way consistent with the fundamental emergent laws which ensure the supervenience of emergent properties on basal properties (Wong 2010). This suggests that if emergent properties are not to be epiphenomenal or explanatorily irrelevant, we need to introduce novel causal roles for emergent properties, which is a key motivation driving both alternative conceptions of ontological emergence discussed in the next subsection. One question is what the consequences of such a move are for the debate with the physicalist in terms of key claims such as the causal closure of the physical. (See Wilson 2015 for an overview of accounts of emergence with an eye to their consistency with physicalism.)

3.2 Alternative Conceptions of Ontological Emergence

3.2.1 Emergence as a non-supervening, causal relationship

Timothy O'Connor (2000a, 2000b) contends that the standard construal of emergence as a synchronic supervenience relation is suspect. If token emergent features are metaphysically primitive, their necessary appearance in the right circumstances should admit of causal explanation. This leads him to adopt a non-supervening, dynamical conception of emergence, which relation is nonsynchronic and causal in character. (This work repudiates in part his (1994), which allowed that emergence might be thought of as a species of supervenience.) He argues that supervenience will fail given a dynamical account, once we consider the contribution that other, prior emergent properties play (alongside more fundamental properties) in determining which emergent properties are instanced at a time. As some of these antecedent factors may be indeterministic, there could be two nomological possibilities instancing the same physical properties at t while instancing different emergent properties.[7] O'Connor suggests that dynamical emergence is a promising approach to understanding the relation of mental and neural states. Though a dynamical account of emergence appears to be a coherent model, one question about this view is whether it is merely a metaphysical possibility or whether there are actual instances of phenomena which fit this model. (For more details see O'Connor and Wong (2005), which sets up the dialectical context within which this emergentist view is situated.)

3.2.2 Emergence as ‘fusion’

Paul Humphreys also rejects the general suitability of the formal relation of supervenience of basal conditions to emergent features, and instead favors a metaphysical relation he terms “fusion”: “[Emergent properties] result from an essential interaction [i.e. fusion] between their constituent properties, an interaction that is nomologically necessary for the existence of the emergent property.” Fused entities lose certain of their causal powers and cease to exist as separate entities, and the emergents generated by fusion are characterized by novel causal powers. Humphreys emphasizes that fusion is a “real physical operation, not a mathematical or logical operation on predicative representations of properties.”

To explain the dynamics of fusion, Humphreys makes use of the notion of levels:

(L) There is a hierarchy of levels of properties L0, L1, …, Ln, … of which at least one distinct level is associated with the subject matter of each special science, and Lj cannot be reduced to Li, for any i < j.

He also assumes a Kimian event ontology, where events are property instantiations at a time. Events, so understood, are the relata of causation. (When Humphreys speaks of “property instances,” we take it that he is referring to Kimian events, not tropes.) Humphreys formally represents events as follows: Pmi(x ri) denotes an i-level entity (i.e., xr) instantiating an i-level property (i.e., Pm), for i > 0. Properties and entities are indexed to the first level at which they are instanced. Now let “*” denote the fusion operator. If Pmi(x ri)(t1) and Pni(x si)(t1) are i-level events (i.e., the event of x r's exemplifying Pm at t1, etc.), then the fusion of these two events, [Pmi(x ri)(t1)*P ni(xs i)(t1)], produces an i+1-level event, [Pmi*P ni][(xri)+(x si)](t2), which can also be denoted as Pli+1[(xri)+(x si)](t2). The fusion operation is not necessarily causal, but it is a diachronic, dynamic process.[8]

The key feature of a fused event [Pmi*P ni][(xri) + (xsi)](t2) is that it is a unified whole, in the sense that its causal effects cannot be correctly represented in terms of the separate causal effects of its constituents. Moreover, within the fusion the original property instances Pmi(x ri)(t1) and Pni(x si)(t1) no longer exist as separate entities and they do not have all their i-level causal powers available for use at the i+1-level. (But note that the objects themselves will often retain their separate identities, e.g., [(xri) + (xsi)] in the example of fusion above.) Properties that undergo fusion do not realize the i+1 property instance, as supervenient, realized properties would be co-present with subvenient properties. Rather, in the course of fusion the basal conditions become the i+1 property instance. For this reason, supervenience cannot obtain, as the basal conditions do not co-exist with the emergent feature.[9]

This innovative feature of fusion emergentism — the destruction of the basal property instances once they are fused into the emergent property instance — is what enables the emergent property instances to escape worries about their being causally superfluous (the causal exclusion worry that we will discuss in 3.3.1), since the fused property instances, which are the emergence bases of the emergent property instance resulting from fusion, are no longer present to compete causally with the emergent property instance.

The primary questions for Humphreys's view all concern the distinctive character of fusion: What is the extent of applicability of the fusion model? Do certain consequences of the novelty that fusion emergentism introduces undermine the innovation? Quantum entanglement is held up as an example for fusion. Even if we accept that fusion provides us with a model for quantum entanglement, the question still remains about the plausibility of fusion operation outside cases of quantum entanglement. A more serious worry is whether the novelty of fusion that the base instances are destroyed presents internal problems for the view (Wong 2006). One example is the correlation problem. For the range of special science properties that have empirically established lower-level correlates with which they are copresent, if we are to treat them as fusion emergents, then, as the framework stands, we appear to be committed to denying the copresence of their lower-level correlates, which is empirically implausible. Such worries link back to the issue of the extent of applicability of the view.

3.3 Objections to Emergence

Here we will briefly note two central arguments against the coherence of ontological emergence.

3.3.1 Kim's metaphysical argument

In “Making Sense of Emergence” (1999), Jaegwon Kim argues that emergent properties are epiphenomenal. His argument uses variants on two much discussed arguments he has developed in the course of challenging the tenability of contemporary nonreductive physicalism — the downward causation and causal exclusion arguments.

Downward causation argument. Kim argues that both upward and same-level causation entail downward causation. Consider a property M1, at nonfundamental level L and time t1, that causes another property M2, at nonfundamental level L and time t2. (Read this as shorthand for the occurrence of M1 at t1 .) Since M2 is a property at a nonfundamental level, by hypothesis, it has emergence base, P2, at t2 at level L-1. Kim sees a tension in this situation because there appear to be two answers to why M2 is instantiated at t2: First, M2 is instantiated at t2 because M1 at t1 caused it (ex hypothesi); second, M2 must of (at least) nomological necessity be instantiated at t2 because its emergence base, P2, is present. There appears to be two competing causes for the instantiation of M2 at t2, jeopardizing M1's causal responsibility for M2. Kim suggests that to preserve M1's causal responsibility for M2, we must suppose that M1 causes M2 via causing its emergence base P2. This gives us a general principle: that we can cause a supervenient (and hence emergent) property only by causing its emergence base.

Note that both O'Connor and Humphreys resist Kim's two-stage argument here at this first stage, since they deny that emergent properties will synchronically supervene. For O'Connor, the conditions on an emergent feature are all prior to its occurrence, as would be true of any primitive property described by physics. And emergent properties themselves can have emergent properties directly at the emergent level. For Humphreys, the ‘basal’ properties undergo fusion, and so cease to exist in the resulting emergent property. Thus the fusion Pli+1[x li](t1) can directly cause Pmi+1[x mi](t2) without first causing the i-level properties which upon undergoing fusion would result in Pmi+1[x mi](t2).

Causal exclusion argument. Kim's next step is to argue that emergent properties are epiphenomenal (and hence emergentism is incoherent). Here is his argument:

…I earlier argued that any upward causation or same-level causation of effect M* by cause M presupposes M's causation of M*'s lower level base, P* (it is supposed that M* is a higher-level property with a lower-level base; M* may or may not be an emergent property). But if this is a case of downward emergent causation, M is a higher-level property and as such it must have an emergent base, P. Now we are faced with P's threat to preempt M's status as a cause of P* (and hence of M*). For if causation is understood as nomological (law-based) sufficiency, P, as M's emergence base, is nomologically sufficient for it, and M, as P*'s cause, is nomologically sufficient for P*. Hence P is nomologically sufficient for P* and hence qualifies as its cause. The same conclusion follows if causation is understood in terms of counterfactuals — roughly, as a condition without which the effect would not have occurred. Moreover, it is not possible to view the situation as involving a causal chain from P to P* with M as an intermediate causal link. The reason is that the emergence relation from P to M cannot properly be viewed as causal. This appears to make the emergent property M otiose and dispensable as a cause of P*; it seems that we can explain the occurrence of P* simply in terms of P, without invoking M at all. If M is to be retained as a cause of P*, or of M*, a positive argument has to be provided, and we have yet to see one. In my opinion, this simple argument has not so far been overcome by an effective counter-argument. (p. 32)

We shall not analyze this complex argument here against supervenience emergentism, which turns on subtle issues concerning the nature of causation and counterfactuals. (See Wong (2010) for a detailed analysis of this argument and responses on behalf of the emergentist.) However, the reader should note that Kim's argument above does not employ the premise of physical causal closure: that every physical event has a sufficient physical cause, assuming it has a cause at all. Once this assumption is in play, the more familiar variation of the causal exclusion argument where physical causal closure plays a driving role is available. (In his most recent work (2006a), Kim employs just such an argument against emergence.) Kim's (1998) precisely parallel argument against the ostensibly different contemporary view, nonreductive physicalism, has been trenchantly criticized by Loewer (2001b). The reader may also consult the rather different form of reply on behalf of the emergentist made by Wilson (1999) and Shoemaker (2002). A more recent response is the development of interventionist accounts of causation and their application to special science causation (Woodward 2008, Campbell 2010, Menzies and List 2010). Such accounts probe two aspects of the dialectic: first, the causal exclusion argument does not go through because there may not be a control variable for the effect (of which the emergent or higher level property is a putative cause) at the basal level, and so no basal cause to compete with; second, on such an account of causation, the thesis that physics is causally closed is not well formed, as causation is primarily a macroscopic phenomena at which potential interventions can be made, rather than a microscopic phenomena. Thus there is no challenge to the causal efficacy of higher level properties from lower level proerties. But the availability of such dialectical strategies also calls into question the need to develop a robust form of ontological emergentism in order to vouchsafe the causal efficacy of emergent properties. (For further discussion see the entries on mental causation, physicalism, and causation and manipulability.)

3.3.2 Pepper's Epistemological Objection to Emergence

Stephen Pepper (1926) developed a form of criticism of emergence that resurfaces in different guises. Pepper's own argument is metaphysical. He argued that emergent laws quantifying over primitive macroscopic qualities will be epiphenomenal, since we can also represent ‘novel’ macroscopic phenomena of the sort the emergentist envisions within a more comprehensive physical theory. We need only augment the theory to include variables for the precise structural conditions in which the novel phenomena occur, and then draw up more complex functional laws of dynamical evolution that specify the ‘ordinary’ behavior when the new variables are not satisfied and the ‘novel’ behavior when the variables are satisfied. Now, taken as a metaphysical objection, this is easily overcome.[10] If the emergent properties are there and are in fact (partly) causally responsible for the novel behavior, then they are not epiphenomenal, even if there are empirically adequate descriptions of the trajectories of microscopic entities constituting such behavior that do not refer to them.

But Pepper's argument can be transformed into an epistemological challenge: there could never be good reason to posit an emergent property as opposed to complicating our fundamental theory to accommodate unusual macroscopic behavior. O'Connor (1994, 2000a) has replied to this that from the standpoint of fundamental metaphysics, it is unsatisfactory to rest content with such disjoint laws. It is always appropriate to posit properties to account for fundamental, systematic discontinuity. Where there is discontinuity in microscopic behavior associated with precisely specifiable macroscopic parameters, emergent properties of the system are clearly implicated, unless we can get an equally elegant resulting theory by complicating the dispositional structure of the already accepted inventory of basic properties.

Sydney Shoemaker has contended that such hidden-micro-dispositions theories are indeed always available.[11] Assuming sharply discontinuous patterns of effects within complex systems, we could conclude that the microphysical entities have otherwise latent dispositions towards effects within macroscopically complex contexts alongside the dispositions which are continuously manifested in (nearly) all contexts. The observed difference would be a result of the manifestation of these latent dispositions.

We'll leave it to the reader to assess the force of Shoemaker's challenge, which, like Kim's argument, involves subtle issues. (In this case, issues concerning ontological simplicity and the nature of dispositions.) O'Connor (2000b) questions the coherence of Shoemaker's picture on abstract metaphysical grounds. The present authors challenge its claim to greater simplicity than the standard emergentist ontology in O'Connor and Wong (2005).

4. Possible Applications

Epistemological conceptions of emergence have clear and straightforward applications in current scientific contexts. Indeed, such notions have been carefully defined to capture macroscopic phenomena of current interest within the special sciences.

Whether there are any instances of ontological emergence is highly controversial. Some metaphysicians and philosophers of mind contend that there are strong first-person, introspective grounds for supposing that consciousness, intentionality, and/or human agency are ontologically emergent. The intrinsic qualitative and intentional properties of our experience, they suggest, appear to be of a fundamentally distinct character from the properties described by the physical and biological sciences.[12] And our experience of our own deliberate agency suggests a form of ‘direct’, macroscopic control over the general parameters of our behavior that cannot be reduced to the summation of individual causal interchanges of relevant portions of the cerebral and motor cortex.[13]

Other philosophers reject such appeals to introspection. Some of these grant the appearance but dismiss it as of little evidential value and likely, on indirect grounds, to be illusory.[14] Others deny the emergentist claims about the character of our experience on one of the following grounds: there is no qualitative aspect to conscious experience beyond its intentional or representational content[15]; there is a qualitative aspect to conscious experience that we are able reliably to discriminate but we are not aware of its true, underlying nature (which is neurophysiological)[16]; intentional quality is not an intrinsic and immediately apprehendable feature of experience[17]; in our experience of agency we are not aware of a primitive form of direct, macroscopic control but are simply unaware of the underlying microscopic activities which in fact constitute our control.[18] Note that, if one grants the phenomenological claims of the mind-emergentist while denying their veridicality, one is doing something very different from twentieth-century scientists who debunked vitalist and strong emergentist views about life by uncovering life's physico-chemical basis. In the latter case, one accepts a challenge to provide a reductionist story of a seemingly unique sort of phenomenon, and meets it by developing better experimental and analytical tools. In the former case, on the other hand, one accepts the claims about how experience and agency seem to us but simply dismisses such seemings as illusory. Here, one is not simply overcoming an argument from ignorance with new, powerful theories; instead, one is doing something rather more like denying the data. (Further, classic empiricist accounts of the justification of our empirical beliefs assume that beliefs about the character of experience are veridical. Rejecting this assumption, it seems, entails a radical overhaul of one's epistemology, and it may be that this can be accomplished only by giving an implausible, deflationary conception of epistemic justification.)

Adjudicating the case for or against ontological emergence outside the mental realm is equally difficult. The Nobel laureate chemist, Ilya Prigogine, has long suggested that the ‘dissipative structures’ of non-equilibrium thermodynamics involve properties and dynamical principles irreducible to basic physics.[19] More recently, Nobel laureate physicist R.B. Laughlin and others have focused attention on a rich range of “protected” properties — properties that are insensitive to microscopics — of various kinds of macroscopic matter, such as the crystalline state. They argue that the behavior of these properties is well-understood through high-level principles while inexplicable in fundamental physical terms. Laughlin freely used the term “emergent” to describe such states.[20]

With both Prigogine and Laughlin, it is very difficult to tell whether they conceive the phenomena that concern them to be not only epistemologically, but also ontologically, emergent. Consider these assertions in Laughlin and Pine's manifesto against “reductionism”:

… the generic low-energy properties [of the crystalline state] are determined by a higher organizing principle and nothing else. (p. 29)
The belief on the part of many that the renormalizability of the universe is a constraint on an underlying microscopic Theory of Everything rather than an emergent property is nothing but an unfalsifiable article of faith (p. 29).

And, discussing the quantum Hall effect and the Josephson quantum:

Neither of these things can be deduced from microscopics, and both are transcendent, in that they would continue to be true and to lead to exact results even if the Theory of Everything were changed. Thus the existence of these effects is profoundly important, for it shows us that for at least some fundamental things in nature the Theory of Everything is irrelevant. (pp. 28–29)

The first two assertions can easily be read in context as suggesting a type of ontological emergence. But they stand alongside other claims about the practical impossibility of directly deriving predictions from quantum mechanics for systems containing more than ten particles. So it is also possible to understand Laughlin and Pine as arguing only that science must, as a practical matter, work with high-level principles in dealing with complex systems, and that these principles are confirmed independently of the nature of, or evidence for, our best fundamental theories. (That's a natural way of reading the third quoted statement.) Finally, one might argue that even if Laughlin and Pine are advancing a stronger, ontological claim, the evidence they adduce clearly supports only an epistemological conception, while being neutral on the question of ontological emergence.

A similarly uncertain verdict, we believe, must be given to Prigogine's claims in the context of thermodynamics. Still, the apparent independence of various confirmed high-level principles and the practical impossibility of deriving them from fundamental principles suggest that Brian McLaughlin's (1992) claim that there is ‘not a scintilla of evidence’ in favor of any sort of ontological emergence is overstated or at least highly misleading. The practical difficulties that prevent one from putting the ontological reductionist's vision to the test can hardly be counted as a strike against the emergentist. (While not explicitly discussing ontological emergence, Nancy Cartwright [1994, 1999] has argued influentially for a non-reductionist understanding of special science properties and mechanisms quite generally. We cannot consider here the issues raised by Cartwright's drawing of metaphysical conclusions from the broad methodology of science. For useful discussion see section 5 of the entry on the unity of science.)

5. Emergent Substance

Thus far, we have assumed that the concept of emergence applies to properties (or the event or states consisting in a system's having a property), rather than to a system or object. This is in keeping with the British emergentists' view of emergence as midway between ‘mechanistic’ reductionism and vitalism of a sort which posited entelechies, substances embodying life-governing principles. However, considerations from general metaphysics may make this ‘halfway house’ unstable. Composite objects having ontologically emergent features appear to be truer unities than those lacking such features. Since such features will make a nonredundant difference to the dynamical unfolding of the physical universe, one must quantify over their bearers in giving a minimally complete account of this evolution. Indeed, in some austere ontologies, there simply are not composite systems lacking emergent features. Talk of such ‘objects’ is a convenient fiction suited to human perceptual and linguistic proclivities. Merricks (2001) takes such a position and affirms emergence as the criterion for the existence of true composites. He does not, however, give an account of what emergence is, apart from its involving macroscopic causal powers that do not supervene on the causal powers of and relations among the basic microphysical entities. (Is the relation of physical substrate to emergent features one of causal determination, as above, or is it a brute fact? Do emergent features necessarily appear in all systems attaining a requisite level of complexity, or is this at best a contingent fact?) Nor does he indicate a position on the nature of causation itself, an issue that is crucial to understanding what the nonsupervenience of causal powers amounts to. (Presumably Merricks would reject a Humean account, on which causation is reductively analyzed in terms of actual or counterfactual patterns in the distribution of qualities over the world's history.) In any case, it seems fair to conclude from this overall account that Merricks believes there are emergent composite individuals.

William Hasker (1999) goes one step further in arguing for the existence of the mind conceived as a non-composite substance which ‘emerges’ from the brain at a certain point in its development. He dubs his position ‘emergent dualism,’ and claims for it all the philosophical advantages of traditional, Cartesian substance dualism while being able to overcome a central difficulty, viz., explaining how individual brains and mental substances come to be linked in a persistent, ‘monogamous’ relationship. Here, Hasker, is using the term to express a view structurally like one (vitalism) that the British emergentists were anxious to disavow, thus proving that the term is capable of evoking all manner of ideas for metaphysicians.


Further Reading

Kauffman (1993b) is an important and influential assessment of current scientific theories lending themselves to epistemological emergentist ideas.

A good recent anthology collecting classical sources on emergence and covering many aspects of emergence is Bedau and Humphreys (2008). An excellent source on ontological emergence is the collection of essays edited by Beckermann, Flohr, and Kim (1992). See especially the essays by Brian McLaughlin and Achim Stephan for historical and systematic overviews. Jaegwon Kim also has a valuable contribution to this volume, and the reader should also consider his most recent criticisms of the concept in Kim (1999) and (2006a). There has been a surge lately of essay collections relating to emergentism. These include Clayton and Davies (2006), Kistler (2006), Corradini and O'Connor (2010), and Macdonald and Macdonald (2010).

Two very accessible philosophical introductions to emergence are Chalmers (2006) and Kim (2006b). Crane (2001b) is a clear discussion of issues concerning ontological reductionism, nonreductive physicalism, and ontological emergence in the philosophy of mind. Van Gulick (2001) gives a neutral taxonomy of a good many such views.


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Timothy O'Connor <toconnor@indiana.edu>
Hong Yu Wong <hong-yu.wong@cin.uni-tuebingen.de>

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