Willard van Orman Quine

First published Fri Apr 9, 2010; substantive revision Mon Dec 1, 2014

Willard Van Orman Quine (1908–2000) worked in theoretical philosophy and in logic. (In practical philosophy—ethics and political philosophy—his contributions are negligible.) He is perhaps best known for his arguments against Logical Empiricism (in particular, its use of the analytic-synthetic distinction). This argument, however, should be seen as part of a comprehensive world-view which makes no sharp distinction between philosophy and empirical science, and thus requires a wholesale reorientation of the subject.

In what follows, a very brief section on Quine’s life and work is followed by an overview, which will serve to orient the reader. The third section is devoted to Quine’s arguments against the use that the Logical Empiricists made of the analytic-synthetic distinction, and the view that he worked out to take its place. The subsequent three sections go systematically through Quine’s own views; the final section is on Quine’s place in the history of philosophy.

1. Quine’s life and work

  • 1908: born, Akron, Ohio, on June 25th.
  • 1926–30: attended Oberlin College, Ohio; B.A, major in Mathematics with honors reading in mathematical philosophy.
  • 1930–32: attended Harvard University; Ph.D. in Philosophy, dissertation on Whitehead and Russell’s Principia Mathematica.
  • 1932–33: held a Sheldon Traveling Fellowship and visited (most notably) Vienna, Warsaw, and Prague (where Carnap was then teaching).
  • 1933–36: a Junior Fellow in Harvard’s newly-formed Society of Fellows; worked chiefly on logic and set theory.
  • 1934: published A System of Logistic, a revised version of his dissertation.
  • 1936–78: held teaching positions at Harvard, first as Faculty Instructor, then as Associate Professor (1941) and then as Professor (1948).
  • 1940: published Mathematical Logic.
  • 1942–45: U.S. Navy, working chiefly in Naval intelligence.
  • 1953: published From a Logical Point of View.
  • 1960: published Word and Object.
  • 1963: published Set Theory and its Logic.
  • 1966: published Ways of Paradox.
  • 1969: published Ontological Relativity and Other Essays.
  • 1974: published The Roots of Reference.
  • 1981: published Theories and Things.
  • 1990: published Pursuit of Truth.
  • 1995: published From Stimulus to Science.
  • 2000: died, Boston, Massachusetts, December 25t.h.

(Note: for the sake of brevity only Quine’s most notable publications in philosophy are listed.)

2. Quine’s Naturalism and its Implications

2.1 Introduction

Quine’s philosophical thought is remarkably consistent over the course of his long working life. There are, of course, developments, as he comes to appreciate difficulties in his view, or its implications, or distinctions that need to be made. Outright changes of mind, however, are relatively rare and mostly on relatively minor points. We can, for the most part, treat him as having a single philosophical orientation, to which what he calls naturalism is fundamental. This is not to say that his naturalism is self-conscious and explicit from the start; it is, rather, something that he became clearer about over the years.

The term “naturalism” has been understood in various ways; we need to see what Quine’s naturalism comes to. At one point, he describes naturalism as “the recognition that it is within science itself, and not in some prior philosophy, that reality is to be identified and described” (1981, 21). Two points are important to note about the idea of “science” here. First, it is less restrictive than it may seem. Quine certainly takes the natural sciences, especially physics, as paradigmatic. As he says himself, however, he uses the word “science” broadly; he explicitly includes psychology, economics, sociology, and history (see 1995, 49). Second, Quine does not see scientific knowledge as different in kind from our ordinary knowledge; he sees it, rather, as the result of attempts to improve our ordinary knowledge of the world: “Science is not a substitute for common sense but an extension of it” (1957, 229). The scientist, he says, “is indistinguishable from the common man in his sense of evidence, except that the scientist is more careful” (1957, 233). We might add that the scientist is more narrowly focused on issues of truth and objectivity and, as contributing to these goals, clearer and more systematic.

Many philosophers would no doubt accept that the methods and techniques of science are the best way to find out about the world. (With or without the points just noted about the word “science”.) The distinctiveness of Quine’s naturalism begins to emerge if we ask what justifies this naturalistic claim: what reason do we have to believe that the methods and techniques of science are the best way to find out about the world? Quine would insist that this claim too must be based on natural science. (If this is circular, he simply accepts the circularity.) This is the revolutionary step: naturalism self-applied. There is no foundation for Quine’s naturalism: it not based on anything else.

The point here is that Quine denies that there is a distinctively philosophical standpoint, which might, for example, allow philosophical reflection to prescribe standards to science as a whole. He holds that all of our attempts at knowledge are subject to those standards of evidence and justification which are most explicitly displayed, and most successfully implemented, in the natural sciences. This applies to philosophy as well as to other branches of knowledge. The epistemologist, therefore, reflects on science from within science; there is no theory of knowledge distinct from science. (“Epistemology”, Quine says, “…is contained in natural science, as a chapter of psychology”; 1969, 83.)

In Quine’s view, philosophers can, therefore, do no better than to adopt the standpoint of the best available knowledge, i.e. science, in some suitably broad sense. We adopt what he calls “the fundamental conceptual scheme of science and common sense” (1960, 276). Philosophers are thus to be constrained by scientific standards. In (1974) he puts it this way: “In our account of how science might be acquired we do not try to justify science by some prior and firmer philosophy, but neither are we to maintain less than scientific standards. Evidence must regularly be sought in external objects, out where observers can jointly observe it…” (174, 34f).

2.2 Negative Aspects

The view sketched above has both positive and negative aspects. The latter is better-known and Quine is perhaps often thought of as a negative philosopher, primarily concerned to criticize others. He casts doubt on terms which many philosophers take for granted. He does not dismiss such terms as meaningless, but simply as not meriting a place in serious science, or in the objective account of the world at which science aims. A well-known and important example is his criticism of the idea of meaning. Quine says: “Meaning… is a worthy object of philosophical and scientific clarification and analysis, and… it is ill-suited for use as an instrument of philosophical and scientific clarification and analysis” (1981, 185). The term is insufficiently clear, and putative explanations which employ it are in fact unexplanatory. (By engendering the illusion of explanation they tend to impede the progress of science; this may well account for Quine’s animus against the term.) It follows, in Quine’s view, that philosophers should not rely on the term.

Quine makes similar remarks about “thought”, “belief”, “experience”, “necessity” and other terms which many philosophers assume are legitimate and available for philosophical use without themselves requiring explanation and justification in other terms. He says about the first two on this list (and would no doubt extend the comment to the others): “If some one accepts these notions outright for such use, I am at a loss to imagine what he can have deemed more in need of clarification and analysis than the things he has thus accepted” (1981, 184).

This criticism of the scientific and philosophical use of certain ordinary terms goes along with rejection of philosophical questions which make essential use of those terms. The term “knowledge” is an example. He finds the word vague, and consequently rejects it for serious use, saying that the word is ‘‘useful and unobjectionable in the vernacular where we acquiesce in vagueness, but unsuited to technical use because of lacking a precise boundary’’ (Quine, 1984, 295). Many philosophers have found the vagueness or unclarity of the term to be a fertile field in which to cultivate what they take to be important philosophical problems: What exactly are the conditions on knowledge? Do we really know anything at all? For Quine, by contrast, such questions may simply be dismissed.

2.3 Positive Aspects (1): Knowledge

As we have just seen, Quine’s views issue in very general criticism of much philosophy. (Far more than is generally recognized.) It is, nevertheless, a mistake to think of him as primarily a critical or negative thinker. His criticisms rely on his positive doctrine; articulating and defending that doctrine generates its own questions and problems. As for whether those are genuinely philosophical questions and problems, it is implicit in what has already been said that he would not acknowledge such a category as the ‘genuinely philosophical’ if that is meant to imply questions which are different in kind from those of science. But certainly he accepts that some questions are sufficiently general, abstract, and remote from experiment and observation, that they may be classified as philosophical. At times he assimilates the questions with which he is concerned to those which have traditionally occupied philosophers. An example is scepticism, and epistemology more generally, although Quine’s approach to these subjects is quite different from that of many philosophers.

In some places, Quine approaches epistemology through the problem of scepticism about the external world. Quine has no room for the kind of scepticism which asks the following kind of question: even if our alleged knowledge, our science, is completely successful in its predictions, how do we know that it tells us the way the world really is? Thus he says: “What evaporates is the transcendental question of the reality of the external world…” (1981, 22). The next paragraph enlarges on the theme:

Our scientific theory can go wrong, and precisely in the familiar way: through failure of predicted observation. But what if… we have achieved a theory that is conformable to every possible observation, past and future? In what sense could the world then be said to deviate from what the theory claims? Clearly in none…. (1981, 22; emphasis added).

There is, however, a way of understanding the sceptical question which Quine can make sense of. Invoking gestalt psychology, he argues that the simple sensory idea which Berkeley and Hume had claimed were given by the senses are not in fact given, that we see things in three-dimensions, for example, instead of having to infer the third. He does not, however, claim that there is no problem here. Rather, he says, “the problem was real but wrongly viewed” (1974, 2). “The crucial logical point”, he continues, “is that the epistemologist is confronting a challenge to natural science that arises from within natural science” (loc. cit.). What is the challenge? It starts with the what Quine takes to be “a finding of natural science itself… that our information about the world comes only through impacts on our sensory receptors” (1990a, 19). The sceptical challenge is then: “How … could one hope to find out about that external world from such meager traces? In short, if our science were true, how could we know it?” (1974, 2).

Scepticism, understood in this fashion, is a challenge to Quine’s form of naturalism. It claims that our knowledge cannot be accounted for in terms which are, by Quine’s standards, purely naturalistic. Quine’s response is thus to sketch an austerely naturalistic account of how our knowledge, and the cognitive language in which that knowledge is embodied, arises, or might arise. This project, as he sees it, is both essential to the defence of his naturalistic world-view and “an enlightened persistence” (1974, 3) in the problem that had motivated earlier epistemologists; section 4. will go into a little more detail about the project.

When Quine asks: “How… could one hope to find out about that external world from such meager traces?” this is not a rhetorical question. It is, rather, a serious question, to be answered by deploying the full resources of our knowledge—it is a scientific question. Quine recognizes that the question, thus construed, is not exactly what earlier epistemologists had in mind, but argues that the change is justified: “A far cry, this, from the old epistemology. Yet it is no gratuitous change of subject matter, but an enlightened persistence rather in the original epistemological problem” (1974, 3).

2.4 Positive Aspects (2): the Nature of the World

The defence and articulation of Quine’s naturalism thus requires Quinean epistemology, an analogue, at least, of traditional epistemology but carried out as a scientific enterprise. It also requires that he set out just what is to be included in a naturalistic account of the world; in other words, it requires an account of the world, a least in broad outline. Among other things, this account constrains his epistemology, since it is a naturalistic account of knowledge that is required.

In what follows, we shall sometimes speak of Quine’s account of the world as his “metaphysics”, but it is metaphysics naturalized: it is not carried out a priori, or by reflection on the nature of Being quâ Being, or anything of that sort. (Quine himself does not much use the word “metaphysics” but he does speak freely about ontology, and advances substantive ontological views.)

Quine’s approach to his naturalistic analogue of metaphysics is through the idea of regimented theory. Regimented theory is our overall science, the sum total of our best and most objective knowledge about the world, reformulated in the clearest and simplest form. Quine sees this kind of reformulating as of a piece with ordinary scientific endeavour, but carried further than working scientists are likely to have reason to do. He discusses the distorting effect which language is likely to have on our view of the world and comments:

To some degree…the scientist can enhance objectivity and diminish the interference of language, by his very choice of language. And we [meaning we philosophers, we scientists at the abstract and philosophical end of the spectrum], concerned to distill the essence of scientific discourse, can profitably purify the language of science beyond what might reasonably be urged upon the practicing scientist. (1957, 235)

Regimented theory is, of course, an idealization. It is not a complete and finished object, available for us to examine. Quine’s reflections on it might be considered as something like a thought-experiment: if we were to set about assembling our total theory of the world and recasting it in the best form, what would it look like? Since the enterprise is not in fact going to be carried out all the way we are not going to get a complete answer. But on some important general issues, Quine holds, we can get answers. In particular, he argues that the framework of regimented theory is first-order logic with identity, that the variables of this theory range over physical objects and sets, and that the predicates of the theory, the only non-logical vocabulary, are physicalistic, in his somewhat complicated sense. (See section 4, below.) Although this is not traditional a priori metaphysics, we should not underestimate the ambition of the project. He says of his regimented theory that “all traits of reality worthy of the name can be set down in an idiom of this austere form if in any idiom” (1960, 228) and speaks of “limning the true and ultimate structure of reality” (1960, 221). The claim that the variables of regimented range only over physical objects and sets is, as far as he is concerned, the same claim as that only physical objects and sets really exist.

3. The Analytic-Synthetic Distinction and the Argument Against Logical Empiricism

The philosophers who most influenced Quine were the Logical Empiricists (also known as Logical Positivists), especially Rudolf Carnap. The distinction between analytic truths and synthetic truths plays a crucial role in their philosophy. Analytic truths might be characterized as those true solely in virtue of the meanings of the words they contain; synthetic truths, by contrast, state matters of extra-linguistic fact, and are known by experience. The Logical Empiricists accounted for truths which do not seem to be answerable to experience, most obviously the truths of logic and mathematics, by saying that they are analytic, and this position was very widely held by the 1940s. Quine, however, famously casts doubt on analytic-synthetic distinction, and rejects the use made of it by the Logical Empiricists and other philosophers from the 1930s on. (Notable among the others is C. I. Lewis, first a teacher and then a colleague of Quine; his influence on Quine has perhaps been underestimated. See Baldwin 2013.)

The issues here are complex, and the argument takes many twists and turns. The aim of this section is to give an account of Quine’s mature view, and of the strongest arguments that he has for it.

3.1 Carnap’s Principle of Tolerance and Quine’s Objections

Carnap holds that the role of philosophy is to analyze and clarify the language of science, and to formulate and recommend alternative languages. He holds that there are languages which differ in expressive power, not merely as notational variants. (The difference between intuitionistic logic and classical logic is an important example here, as is the difference between the language of Newtonian mechanics and the language of relativistic mechanics.) He also holds that there is no one correct language. Different languages may be useful for different purposes; it is no part of the philosopher’s job to prescribe this or that language, merely to analyze, to clarify, and to suggest alternatives. This idea has become known as the Principle of Tolerance; from the 1930s on, it is fundamental to Carnap’s view of what philosophy is and how it differs from science. (That there is such a difference is a point which Carnap never questions.)

The Principle of Tolerance requires that, for any language, there be a clear difference between the analytic sentences of the language and its synthetic sentences. The former are (roughly) those which are constitutive of the language: if we change our mind about the truth of such a sentence we have, in effect, adopted a new language. Carnap speaks of a change of this sort as external, since it involves a change of language. A change of mind about an ordinary synthetic sentence is, by contrast, internal, since it takes place within a given language. External changes are a matter for tolerance, whereas internal changes are correct or incorrect, not matters to which we should apply the Principle of Tolerance. For the principle to make sense, each sentence of the language must fall clearly into the one category or the other.

At least as Quine sees the matter, the use of the Principle of Tolerance also requires that analytic sentences be on an entirely different epistemological footing from synthetic sentences. Synthetic sentences are answerable to evidence; analytic sentences are a matter of the choice of language, which does not require theoretical justification.

Quine rejected the idea that there is epistemological a difference of this kind. Even if we can distinguish the analytic sentences from the synthetic sentences, we may still have reasons to reject an analytic sentence. And those reasons may be of the same kind that lead us to reject synthetic sentences. This point is hard to see if one focuses on examples such as “All bachelors are unmarried”. The matter is otherwise if one considers examples such as “Force equals mass times acceleration”. (See Putnam, 1962.) A change of mind about an analytic sentence would be a change in the language. Still, we might have reasons to make such a change, reasons that are of the same sort that lead us to make revisions to synthetic sentences.

This is the view that Quine argues for. On the one hand, he emphasizes the point (which Carnap largely accepts) that choice of language is not theoretically neutral: some choices will make for a better theory than others. On the other hand, he argues that the sort of ‘pragmatic’ factors which Carnap had accepted as playing a role in choice of language, such as simplicity, also play a role in the choice of a theory within a language. Hence, he claims, the two sorts of choice are on the same epistemological footing, and the Principle of Tolerance is unjustified.

Quine’s argument for this position relies on holism. This is the claim that most of our sentences do not have implications for experience when they are taken one-by-one, each in isolation from the others. What has experiential implication is, in most cases, not an individual sentence but a larger chunk of theory. Holism is not a very controversial doctrine. Carnap accepts it (see Carnap, 1934, 318), but Quine holds that he does not think through its implications far enough. In particular, Quine claims that holism shows that most of our sentences are not justified by the relation of the individual sentence, considered in isolation, to experience. Almost always, what matters is the relation to experience of some larger chunk of theory (and, in principle, although perhaps never in practice, of the theory as a whole). This means that the correctness of a given claim is almost never settled simply by gathering empirical evidence. Other factors will play a role, in particular the way in which accepting that claim would contribute to the efficacy and simplicity of the theory as a whole. But these are precisely the ‘pragmatic factors’ which Carnap thought played a role in the choice of language. In arguing that such factors play a role throughout our knowledge, Quine accepts ‘a more thorough pragmatism’ (1951, 46) which puts Carnap’s external changes on the same epistemological status as his internal changes.

3.2 Quine’s Alternative

If logic, mathematics, and other putatively a priori parts of our knowledge, are not to be explained by analyticity, how are they to be accounted for? Holism, which is central to Quine’s argument against Carnap, also provides him with an alternative position. Logic and mathematics seem to have a special status because they are independent of experience. They appear to be necessary and not susceptible of refutation by what future experience brings; they appear to be a priori because we know them independent of experience. Carnap sought to explain these appearances by appealing to the idea that accepting an analytic sentence goes with speaking the language, and to the Principle of Tolerance. Since choice of language is not justified by experience, the truth of the analytic sentences of a given language is not answerable to experience.

How is Quine to explain the apparent necessity and a priori status of some truths without appeal to the Principle of Tolerance? To take the second point first: Quine’s holism is the view that almost none of our knowledge is directly answerable to experience. (The exceptions are what he calls ‘observation sentences’; see 4.2, below.) In almost all cases the relation is indirect: a given sentence is only answerable to experience if a significant body of theory is presupposed. (When we say that a given observation confirms or refutes a given theoretical claim, we are tacitly presupposing much theoretical knowledge.) This is most easily seen if we consider a highly theoretical sentence, of theoretical physics, perhaps, but in Quine’s view it holds, of almost all our sentences. The reason to accept a sentence is its contribution to the success of theory as a whole as an efficient and simple method of dealing with and predicting experience; in principle, this means the success of our theory as a whole, the whole body of sentences that we accept, in dealing with experience as a whole.

This statement, in Quine’s view, holds with full generality. In particular, it applies to the sentences of logic and mathematics as much as any other subject. No particular experience confirms ‘2 + 2 = 4’; Quine is not advancing what Frege derided as a ‘gingerbread and pebble’ account of arithmetic (Frege 1884, vii), in which the sentence is justified by our observations of cookies or stones. But Quine does hold that the sentence, and the theory of arithmetic of which it is an inseparable part, earns its place in our body of knowledge by contributing to the overall success of that body of knowledge in dealing with experience as a whole.

As for the apparent necessity of some sentences, Quine appeals to holism to explain that too. Some sentences have great systematic import for our knowledge as a whole. (In Quine’s well-known metaphor, they stand near the centre of the ‘web of belief’.) The truths of elementary arithmetic are an example: they play a role in almost every branch of systematic knowledge. For this reason, we cannot imagine abandoning elementary arithmetic. Doing so would mean abandoning our whole system of knowledge, and replacing it with an alternative which we have not even begun to envisage. Nothing in principle rules out the possibility that the course of experience will be such that our present system of knowledge becomes wholly useless, and that in constructing a new one we find that arithmetic is of no use. But this is a purely abstract possibility, certainly not something we can imagine in any detail. So the idea that we might reject arithmetic is likewise unimaginable.

3.3 Meaning and Quinean Analyticity

As we have just seen, even sentences which we cannot imagine rejecting might, in principle, be rejected. As Quine says: ‘no statement is immune to revision’ (1951, 43). This claim of Quine’s has attracted a good deal of attention, and is sometimes thought to be shocking or even paradoxical. In the context of his debate with Carnap, however, it is not, by itself, at all surprising. For Carnap too, any sentence can be revised; he would insist, however, that in the case of some sentences, the analytic ones, a revision involves a change of language, and thus of the meaning of the words used in the sentence. So the idea of meaning, and sameness of meaning, occupies a crucial role in the debate over analyticity.

In Quine’s initial arguments against the analytic-synthetic distinction, he seeks to cast doubt on the idea that there is a notion of meaning which is clear enough to use in defining a notion of analyticity. (See especially Quine 1951.) Here too a crucial role is played by holism. One apparently clear conception of meaning is that the meaning of a sentence is given by the experiences which would confirm it; holism, however, implies that the idea of confirmation does not apply to individual sentences, considered in isolation from the theories of which they are parts.

Quine’s scepticism about the idea of meaning is much criticized. We will mention two criticisms. First, what standards of clarity is he employing, when he says that the notion of analyticity is insufficiently clear? The answer, not explicit in (Quine, 1951), is that the standards are those indicated by our discussion in the previous section; Quine is asking for an explanation which is acceptable by his naturalistic standards. Such an explanation would proceed in terms of the way in which language is used, behavioural terms. It would not presuppose an idea of meaning, and would use such ideas as definition or convention only in ways which are justified by the most literal sense of those terms. Second, some responses to Quine’s position here argue that it has obviously absurd consequences, such as that meaningful discourse would be impossible or that we could not understand our language. (See, for example, Grice and Strawson, 1956.) But Quine’s scepticism about meanings does not lead to any scepticism about meaningfulness. If we think of meaningfulness as a matter of having a meaning then we may think that our words cannot be meaningful unless there are meanings. But such a way of thinking is, Quine claims, quite misleading. In (Quine 1953), he offers a rough and ready behavioural account of meaningfulness; it is clear from the way the account proceeds that the success of something along those lines would be of no help at all in defining synonymy or analyticity.

We said above that Quine seeks ‘to cast doubt’ on the idea of meaning, and on the use of that idea to explain the distinction between those changes of doctrine which involve a change of meaning and those which do not, and thus also to explain analyticity. One might read (Quine 1951) and get the impression that he is not merely casting doubt but wholly rejecting these ideas. Even there, however, he accepts that an acceptable definition of analyticity might be given. In later works, he himself suggests such a definition. A sentence is analytic for a given native speaker ‘if he learned the truth of the sentence by learning to use one or more of its words’ (Quine, 1991, 270; see also Quine 1974, 78–80.) It is analytic without qualification if it is analytic for all native speakers. By this criterion, obvious sentences such as ‘Bachelors are unmarried’ will count as analytic. If we think of the set of analytic sentences as closed under logical consequence, as Quine suggests, then all first-order logical truths ‘would then perhaps qualify as analytic’ (Quine, 1991, 270). Along with this, he comes to accept that certain revisions of belief do involve a change of meaning, presumably in a sufficiently clear sense of meaning (Quine, 1991, 270).

It might seem as if Quine completely withdraws his earlier criticism of the analytic-synthetic distinction and thus, presumably, of Logical Empiricism as a whole. But in fact this is not so. Three features of Quine’s version of the distinction make this clear. The first is that it relies on claims about how words are learned, claims which are in most cases unknowable. Probably we all learned the word ‘bachelor’ in the same way, but, as Quine says, ‘we don’t in general know how we learned a word’ (1991, 271). So for many sentences it is wholly unclear whether they are analytic. The second is the scope of Quinean analyticity. The idea will perhaps (as Quine says) include first-order logic, but it will not include mathematics; on this count alone, it is clear that it will not do what Carnap requires of the idea of analyticity. Third, and perhaps most fundamental, Quine’s version of the analytic-synthetic distinction is not an epistemological distinction. Some changes of doctrine involve changes of meaning, others do not. In Quine’s view, however, this does not mean that the two sorts of change must have different epistemological bases. To the contrary: as we saw in 3.1, Quine rejects the Principle of Tolerance and, with it, the idea that a change of language takes place on a different kind of epistemological basis from a change of theory within a language. His acceptance of a limited conception of analyticity does not change this picture. As he says: “I recognize the notion of analyticity in its obvious and useful but epistemologically insignificant applications” (1991, 271; emphasis added).

Quite generally, Quine’s rejection of the Principle of Tolerance is the deepest aspect of his disagreement with Carnap. Quine sees all our cognitive endeavours, whether they involve formulating a new language or making a small-scale theoretical change, as having the same very general aim of enabling us to deal with the world better; all such endeavours have the same very general kind of justification, namely, as contributing to that end. In this picture, there is no basis for Carnap’s insistence that philosophy is in principle different from science. Philosophy, as Quine sees it, has no special vantage point, no special method, no special access to truth. Here we have the crucial idea of Quine’s naturalism, discussed in the previous section.

4. Quinean Epistemology

4.1 The Epistemological Project

As we saw in section 2, Quine takes the fundamental epistemological problem to be that of showing how we come to have knowledge of the world. He seeks an account which is naturalistic in his austere sense, and thus starts with the idea that we know about the world only from impacts of various forms of energy on our sensory nerves (see 2.3, above). How do we get from such impacts to something recognizable as knowledge of the world? In the words of the title of Quine’s last monograph: how do we get from stimulus to science?

This question is central for Quine’s scientific naturalism in general. An answer would show that this world-view can accommodate an account of human knowledge. If no answer is available, that world-view is cast in doubt. For these purposes it is perhaps enough if Quine can sketch an account, compatible with his naturalistic view, of how we might acquire the knowledge which we take ourselves to have, whether or not it is correct in detail. (See Quine 1990c, 291.)

Quine treats knowledge as embodied in language. Apart from other considerations, language-use is observable and thus subject to scientific inquiry. Quine’s concern with how we might acquire knowledge thus takes the form of a concern with how we might acquire cognitive language. His interest here is in epistemology, rather than in language for its own sake: “I am interested in the flow of evidence from the triggering of the senses to the pronouncements of science…. It is these epistemological concerns, and not my incidental interest in linguistics, that motivate my speculations” (1990b, 3).

Much of Quine’s work in epistemology is thus a more or less speculative discussion of how a child might acquire cognitive language. This genetic project may seem to be a long way from the traditional concerns of epistemology. Quine claims, however, that the project in fact affords us the best obtainable insight into the nature of the evidence for our theories, and into the relation between theory and evidence: “the evidential relation is virtually enacted, it would seem, in the learning” (1975c, 74–75).

4.2 Observation Sentences

Central to Quine’s naturalistic account of knowledge is the idea that all our knowledge is in some way based upon stimulations of our sensory nerves. For much of our knowledge, the relation is quite indirect. (This is one way of expressing holism; see 3.1, above.) Most sentences are not accepted because of a direct relation between the given sentence and stimulations of nerve endings; the connection goes via other sentences, and may be quite indirect and remote. But then there must presumably be some sentences which are directly related to stimulations. This is the role that observation sentences play in Quine’s thought. Acts of uttering such sentences, or of assenting to them when they are uttered by others, are shared responses to stimulation. (We shall enter some qualifications at the end of this sub-section.)

Observation sentence are the starting point for our acquisition of knowledge, the child’s entry into cognitive language. They are also the sentences which are evidentially basic. What fits them to play both roles is that they are independent of other parts of our language and our theory. Hence they can be mastered by a child otherwise without linguistic competence and they can be known without presupposing other parts of our theory.

Many philosophers are content to take for granted the idea of evidentially basic sentences. Quine, however, cannot take that attitude; he needs to show how we get “from stimulus to science”. The first step is to show that we can give a purely naturalistic account of how some linguistic utterances can be directly tied to the occurrence of stimulations of the sensory nerves, an account of observation sentences, more or less. Quine expends enormous labour on this point.

Quine considers acts of assenting to sentences (or dissenting; but I shall mostly leave that as understood). He focuses, in particular, on our dispositions to assent to sentences. (We will briefly consider the idea of a disposition in the next section.) To be an observation sentence, a sentence must fulfill two criteria. The individualistic criterion is that a sentence is an observation sentence for a given person if he or she is disposed to assent to it when (and only when) he or she is undergoing appropriate sensory stimulations, regardless of her internal state (e.g. the ancillary information which he or she possesses). “It’s warm in here” presumably satisfies this criterion; my willingness to assent to it perhaps depends only on which of my sensory nerves are stimulated at the given moment. “There’s milk in the refrigerator” presumably does not; unless I am actually looking into the refrigerator at the time, my willingness to assent to it depends not on what I am experiencing at the time but on my internal state, what I remember. The social criterion is that the individualistic criterion hold across the linguistic community as a whole. To specify this more precisely is tricky, and I shall postpone the matter for a few paragraphs.

Even the individualistic criterion raises considerable complications and difficulties. We speak of a disposition to assent (or dissent) in response to a pattern of stimulation but this is not quite accurate. Such a pattern, a complete list of which sensory nerves are firing, and in which order, will hardly ever repeat itself. So what we need is, rather, the idea of a correlation of a response with a type of stimulation pattern[1]. But the relevant idea of a type here is complicated. The physical resemblance of two stimulation patterns, what Quine calls receptual similarity, is not enough to make them constitute events of the same type, in the relevant sense; two such patterns may resemble each other very closely yet lead to quite different responses. (Two occasions on which I am driving a car may be almost identical in terms of my stimulation patterns, except that on one occasion I see a red light and on the other I see a green light. As far as my reaction goes, that small difference outweighs all the similarities.) What is wanted is a more complex notion which Quine calls perceptual similarity. Very roughly, two stimulation patterns count as similar (for an animal, at a time) if they tend to lead to the same response[2].

With the account of perceptual similarity in place, we can say what it is for a sentence to be observational for me: if I am disposed to assent to it on one occasion on which I have a certain neural intake, then I will also be disposed to assent to it on any other occasion on which I have neural intake which is (sufficiently) perceptually similar.

It is worth emphasizing the fact that the definition of the key notion of perceptual similarity is behavioural. It avoids any idea of experience, of awareness, of what strikes the person (or other animal) as more similar to what. It is simply a matter of responses. This is in accord with Quine’s insistence on what he takes to be scientific standards of clarity and rigour. One consequence of it is that the notion cannot be invoked to explain behaviour. Quine is under no illusions on this score. (See 1975b, 167, where the point is explicit.) The behavioural account does not explain our understanding of observation sentences; explanation, if possible at all, comes at the neuro-physiological level. What the behavioural account does is to make it clear exactly what behaviour constitutes that understanding and, hence, what the neuro-physiological account would have to explain. (It also shows that there is indeed something to be explained.)

So far we have only an account of what it is for a sentence to be an observation sentence for a particular person. But our language is shared, so we need to generalize the criterion across the linguistic community. One might at first think that the social criterion would be: if one person is disposed to assent to the sentence on any occasion on which they have a certain neural intake, then any other person having the same neural intake will also be disposed to assent to it. Quine gives essentially this account in (1960). As he quickly comes to see, however, it is not tenable, for it assumes that we can make sense of the idea of “same neural intake” between different people. But different people have different sensory nerves.

Quine returned to this problem on and off over the next thirty-five years. His eventual solution is that a sentence only counts as an observation sentence if an occasion which leads to my having neural intake which disposes me to assent to it also leads to your having neural intake which disposes you to assent to it. Here there is no cross-person identification of neural intake or cross-person standards of perceptual similarity. The solution does, however, require that our standards of perceptual similarity line up in the right sort of way. Two occasions which produce in me neural intakes which are perceptually similar by my standards must also (often enough) produce in you neural intakes which are perceptually similar by your standards. Quine is happy enough with this assumption of mutual attunement and suggests that it can be explained along evolutionary lines (see 1996, 160f.).

We have been explaining what is involved in our having shared responses to stimulation. For the most part, Quine assumes that assent to an observation sentence simply is such a response. This assumption, however, cannot be quite correct. It may look for all the world as if there were a rabbit in front of me, even though there is not. If I have no reason to be suspicious I will be disposed to assent to “Rabbit?”; if I know about the deception, however, I will not be. So my disposition to assent does not, after all, depend solely on my sensory stimulations at the time. It depends also on my internal state, whether I know that in this case the rabbit-like appearance is misleading. The difficulty arises from the corrigibility of “There’s a rabbit”, a feature which, on most accounts, it shares with just about every sentence other than those about the speaker’s current experience. If a sentence is corrigible then there will be circumstances in which it is false even though they will produce in observers stimulation patterns which would generally lead them to assent to it. But then some observers may know that the circumstances are of this deceptive kind and not be disposed to assent, while others have no such knowledge and are disposed to assent. The moral of this is that assent, even to observation sentences, is not a mere response to stimulation; the responder’s internal state (their having ancillary knowledge, or not) may also play a role.

Quine does not seem to have fully appreciated this point, though some of his later discussions come close to doing so (see, in particular, Quine 1996). It is not fatal to his general account; it complicates the story rather than requiring a radical change. There may be no sentences which can be wholly mastered simply by acquiring appropriate dispositions to assent and dissent in response to current stimulations. But for some sentences acquiring such dispositions comes close to mastering their use, because those sentences are almost always true in those cases where observers receive sensory stimulations which dispose them to assent. (Clearly this will be a matter of degree.) So the acquisition of the relevant dispositions, and partial mastery of the sentence, can be used as a basis on which the child can learn more of the language, and more about the world. This further learning in turn allows the child to modify her or his original disposition to assent and dissent merely in response to current stimulation.

4.3 More Complex Forms of Cognitive Language

To this point, our focus has been on observation sentences. Quine’s treatment of more sophisticated parts of language is notably sketchier and more speculative than his detailed discussion of observation sentences. In part this may be because he holds that it is most important to understand the very first step into cognitive language, how such language is possible at all. It may also be that the difficulty in getting a satisfactory account of observation sentences impeded him.

Beyond these points, there is, from a Quinean perspective, a limit to how detailed an account we should expect to have of the acquisition of sophisticated cognitive language. Mastery of an observation sentence corresponds (more or less) to a relatively straightforward disposition: to assent when receiving a stimulation pattern within a certain range. For most sentences, however, this is not the case. What disposition must one have acquired in order to count as understanding a sentence such as “The economy is in recession”? Perhaps one must be able to give evidence if pressed, but what counts as evidence is almost unmanageably diffuse; what evidence one actually has will vary greatly from one person to another. One’s assent to the sentence is no doubt tied to sensory stimulations that one has received, if only the sight of those words in a newspaper. These links, however, are “multifarious [and] not easily reconstructed even in conjecture” (1960, 11). A relatively clear-cut account of the sort that Quine gives of observation sentences is simply not available.

So Quine does not offer any sort of detailed account of the acquisition cognitive language beyond the observation sentences. Instead, he considers stages on the way, forms of language which one might suppose could be easily acquired by a child who has mastered observation sentences and which might provide steps leading to yet more advanced language.

One such step, which is emphasized in Quine’s later work, is the mastery of what he calls observation categoricals. These are sentences of the form “Whenever X happens, Y happens”, where the variables are to be replaced by observation sentences. (E.g. “Whenever there’s smoke, there’s fire.”) It is plausible to suppose that a child who has learnt the observation sentences can come by a mastery of the relevant observation categorical. The observation sentences are what Quine calls occasion sentences, true on some occasions and false on others, whereas the observation categoricals are eternal sentences, true or false once for all. Quine suggests that we can think of observation categoricals as a plausible first step into mastering eternal sentences, which make up our serious theoretical knowledge.

Another step of the same kind is what Quine calls eternal predications, subject-predicate sentences true or false once for all, such as “Fido is a dog”. Assuming the child has learnt both terms as observation sentences, the sight of the dog will dispose him to assent to each. Quine speculates that the sound of the word “Fido” may have something of the same effect as the sight of the beast, inclining our learner to assent to “Dog” and thus to “Fido is a dog”. It is notable that there is a sort of use-mention confusion operating here, if Quine’s suggestion is correct. Language is learned by confusion and “short leaps of analogy” rather than by “continuous derivation” (1975c, 178–9); indeed a holistic language cannot be learnt without such leaps.

A further advance, in Quine’s view, takes place when the child comes to use similar sentences but with two general terms, such as “Dogs are animals”. Such a sentence, Quine remarks is ‘‘really a universal categorical, ‘Every α is a β’.’’ (1974, 66). This kind of sentence, can be represented using pronouns (“If something is a dog then it is an animal”) or, more or less equivalently, using the logical device of quantifiers and variables. Such sentences have a particular importance for Quine in connection with the idea of reference. Merely to be able to use a name, to be able to name Fido upon seeing him, for example, is not yet to refer; one might simply be using the term as a response to the sight of the beast, hence as an observation sentence. Reference, as Quine sees the matter, requires the capacity to reidentify the object over time and changing circumstances: if a dog is barking then it—that very same dog—is hungry; hence the importance of pronouns.

4.4 Other aspects of epistemology

Quine also has things to say on more familiar epistemological themes. In some cases he indicates how they can be integrated into his approach; thus he suggests that we can (albeit unrealistically) schematize the testing of a scientific theory by thinking of ourselves as deriving observation categoricals which can then be directly tested against observation sentences. In other cases he is content to adopt more or less unchanged the account given by earlier authors, as in his list of the virtues of a theory (see 1990a, 20). My account above has stressed the most novel parts of his epistemology.

One issue left unaddressed above is the question whether Quine’s naturalized version of epistemology is normative. Some commentators have claimed that it is not, and that this is a serious defect (see Kim, 1988). Others defend Quine, claiming that naturalized epistemology is normative (see Gregory, 2008). Quine himself has weighed in, saying that critics ‘are wrong in protesting that the normative element…goes by the board’ (Quine, 1990, 19). He cites the ‘finding of natural science…that our information about the world comes only through impacts on our sensory receptors’ (Quine, 1990, 19) as being normative, ‘warning us against telepaths and soothsayers’ (Quine, 1990, 19). More generally, naturalized epistemology is concerned with ‘the whole strategy of rational conjecture in the framing of scientific hypotheses’ (Quine, 1990, 20). Naturalized epistemology is thus certainly normative in this sense: it tells us that in drawing up scientific theories, we should rely on the evidence of the senses rather than on soothsayers, we should aim at simple theories, and so on. In telling us these things, however, it relies on what we already know: it deploys some parts of our science to guide attempts in other areas. It does not take a normative attitude towards science as a whole, criticizing or justifying it by wholly external, non-scientific standards. That would require a wholly extra-scientific position, an idea which Quine derogates as ‘First Philosophy’ (e.g. Quine 1981, 67). The rejection of any such idea is one way of phrasing the naturalism he advocates.

5. Metaphysics Naturalized

Quine takes seriously the idea that “it is within science itself, and not in some prior philosophy, that reality is to be identified and described” (1981, 21). A consequence is that our best theory of the world tells us as much as we know about reality. (Our best theory at given time tells us as much as we know at that time; no doubt our views will progress.) So setting out the broad outlines of that theory is the Quinean version or analogue of metaphysics, though he does not much use the word. This subject interacts with that of the last section: Quine’s account of the world lays down the constraints within which an account of knowledge must proceed, and also is the knowledge that must be accounted for.

5.1 Method: Regimented Theory

How does Quine think we should establish the sort of claims that we are calling “metaphysical”? Some points are familiar from our discussion in section 2. First, we do not resort to any special kind of philosophical insight; we rely upon our ordinary knowledge. Second, what matters is ordinary knowledge as refined and improved upon: science. Third, we rely upon the idea of regimented theory, science formulated in a language that is clarified and simplified “beyond what might reasonably be urged upon the practicing scientist” (1957, 235; see 2.4, above). A further point is that in striving for the clarity and simplicity of our theory we must consider the whole theory; local gains may be offset by global losses. It is thus to overall regimented theory that we look when we are “liming the true and ultimate structure of reality” (1960, 221).

In some cases, the answers that Quine gives to such questions are, as we shall see, quite different from what unreflective common sense (or ‘intuition’) might suggest. What is Quine’s justification for relying on the idea of regimented theory, rather than on our ordinary conceptual scheme? (Cf. Strawson, 1959, Introduction.) Part of the answer here is that science is in the same line of business as ordinary knowledge but does it better. But part of the answer is the idea that “our ordinary conceptual scheme” does not pick out anything definite enough to answer metaphysical questions. Thus Quine says: “…a fenced ontology is just not implicit in ordinary language…. Ontological concern is not a correction of a lay thought and practice; it is foreign to the lay culture, though an outgrowth of it” (1981, 9).

Regimentation, in Quine’s view, involves paraphrase into logical notation. Such paraphrase greatly clarifies and simplifies our theory. Inferences which are a matter of logic will be revealed as such; where additional assumptions are required it will be explicit just what is needed. The logic which Quine takes as the structure of regimented theory is classical (bivalent) first-order logic with identity. Bivalence is justified on the grounds of simplicity. It is not that we have some independent insight into the nature of the world which shows us that every sentence of regimented theory is either true or false. It is, rather, that the simplicity that we gain from making this assumption, justifies our using a bivalent language; the metaphysical claim follows along. (This reversal of direction should remind us of Carnap. The difference is that Quine does not accept the Principle of Tolerance; see section 3, above.)

Quine’s choice of first-order logic, rather than second-order logic, has been more controversial than his adoption of bivalence. One reason he gives for the decision is that every formalization of second-order logic (unlike first-order logic) is incomplete, relative to the standard semantics. A further reason is that one purpose of the canonical framework is to enable us to assess the ontology of a theory. From this point of view it is an advantage that first-order logic has no ontological presuppositions of its own. (By adopting that logic we do commit ourselves to there being some object or other, but not to the existence of any particular entity.) Here again there is a clear contrast with second-order logic, which does have ontological presuppositions. Exactly what those presuppositions are is unclear and has been debated; for Quine, this unclarity is a further reason to avoid the subject entirely.

Paraphrasing a theory into classical logic imposes extensionality on it: a predicate may be replaced by a co-extensive predicate without change of truth-value of the containing sentence; likewise an embedded sentence by a sentence of the same truth-value[3]. Extensionality imposes quite severe restrictions. It requires, for example, that attributions of belief, and other propositional attitudes, be regimented into a form quite different from that which they may appear to have. So one might suppose that Quine accepts extensionality reluctantly, as the price to be paid for the advantages of the use of logic in regimenting theory. Such is not his attitude, however. To the contrary, he thinks of the clarity that extensionality brings as a great advantage, and of theories that lack it as not fully comprehensible: “I find extensionality necessary, indeed, though not sufficient, for my full understanding of a theory” (1995, 90f.)

5.2 Metaphysical Claims

Quine’s regimented theory, then, is the sum total of our knowledge, the best that we have, reformulated so as to fit into the framework of first-order logic. Besides the truth-functions, quantifiers, and variables of logic, the vocabulary consists only of extra-logical predicates. All metaphysical questions can thus be boiled down to two: What objects do the variables range over? and: What sorts of primitive predicates are to be admitted?

To the first of these questions Quine offers a straightforward answer: his ontology consists of physical objects and sets. He counts as a physical object the matter occupying any portion of space-time, however scattered the portion and however miscellaneous the occupants; such an object need not be what he calls a “body”, such as a person or a tree or a building (see 1981, 13). He briefly entertains the idea that we could manage without postulating matter at all, simply using the sets of space-time points, where these are understood as sets of quadruples of real numbers, relative to some co-ordinate system, an ontology of abstract objects only (see Quine, 1976). He seems to see no knock-down argument against this but abandons it, perhaps because the gain is too small to justify the magnitude of the departure from our ordinary views. That he is willing to consider such a view, and take it seriously, shows something about his general attitude.

Regimented theory contains no abstract objects other than sets. Many abstracta, however, can be defined in terms of sets: numbers, functions, and other mathematical entities being the most obvious. Quine excludes other alleged abstracta, such as propositions, and possible entities,. The chief reason for this is that he finds the identity-criteria for such entities unclear. He holds, quite generally, that we should not postulate entities without having clear identity-criteria for them. (This is the view that he sums up in the slogan “no entity without identity”; see (1969, 23) and elsewhere.) Doing so would threaten the clarity and definiteness which the notion of identity brings to theory; local gains from postulating propositions are not worth this global loss.

Regimented theory also has no place for mental entities, most obviously minds, if those are taken to be distinct from physical entities. The qualification is important. Many mental entities can be admitted as special cases of physical objects. Thus my act of thinking about Fermat’s Last Theorem at a particular time can simply be identified with my body during that period of time (see 1995, 87f.). The things that we might want to say about my act of thinking (that it was inspired, or stupid, or what have you) can simply be reconstrued as predicates true or false of physical objects. This is the view sometimes known as anomalous monism or as token-token identity theory, as distinct from type-type identity theory. I may think of the theorem at many times, over the years, and on each occasion that act is identified with the physical state that I am in at the time. Token-token identity theory does not claim that these physical states have anything in particular in common, still less that all acts of thinking about the theorem have something in common. There is no claim that each act of thinking about the theorem can be identified with, e.g. a repeatable pattern of the firing of brain cells. It is enough for Quine’s purposes that each particular act of thinking can be identified with a physical object. This ontological physicalism might seem almost trivial; Quine speaks of it as “[e]ffortless monism … form without substance” (1995, 85). (Note that this view excludes disembodied minds and mental entities. Quine thinks that is no loss at all. Note also that it can be construed either as eliminating mental entities or simply as identifying them with physical objects. Quine prefers the latter phrasing but thinks there is no real difference here; cf. 1960, 265.)

On the issue of the admissibility of predicates, Quine’s physicalism is more complicated. The requirement here is that the difference between a predicate’s being true of a given object and its being false of it should, in all cases, be a physical difference: “nothing happens in the world, not the flutter of an eyelid, not the flicker of a thought, without some redistribution of microphysical states…. physics can settle for nothing less” (1981, 98). If a predicate such as “…is thinking about Fermat’s Last Theorem” picks out genuine events in the world then there is a physical difference between its being true of a person and its not being true of them: a fact of the matter.

A difficulty in making sense of this is that the idea of a physical fact is not one that we can definitively specify. To tie the idea too closely to current physics would rule out fundamental changes in that subject; to leave it floating free might seem to allow anything to count. But clearly Quine does not mean just any subject that someone might call by the name “Physics”. He has in mind a subject continuous with our physics, alike or superior in its coherence and in its explanatory power. (In particular, it would not have “an irreducibly psychological annex”; see 1986a, 403f.). If phenomena occurred which could not be explained by any theory of that kind, then Quine’s physicalism would go by the board.

The most controversial application of this view is to (alleged) mental phenomena. Within that realm, Quine focuses on attributions of propositional attitudes, statements that so-and-so believes that such-and-such, or hopes that, or fears that, etc. (One reason for this focus may be that his interest is primarily in human knowledge; another that some other mental states, such as pain, can perhaps be accounted for by identifying them with certain types of neurophysiological events.)

On the face of it, ascriptions of belief (to stick to that case) violate extensionality. If Mary is the Dean, still Tom’s believing that the Dean sings well is not the same as his believing that Mary sings well, since her accession to the Deanship may be unknown to him. Quine escapes this sort of problem by taking an attribution of belief to express a relation between the believer and a sentence, understood to be, in the usual case, in the language of the ascriber (not the language of the believer, where the languages differ).

It is worth noting the idea of another sense of belief-ascription which would not be vulnerable even prima facie problems of extensionality: so-called de re belief, as distinct from de dicto belief. In the 1950s Quine argued that there must be such a sense. In the late 1960s, however, he abandoned the idea, for lack of clear standards of when it is correct to ascribe a de re belief to someone. (See Quine, 1956 for a statement of the distinction, and Quine, 1973 for retraction.) Other philosophers, however, continue to hold the idea.

Construing attributions of belief as statements of attitudes towards sentences gives them a syntax and an ontology that Quine can accept. That does not mean, however, that the idiom “A believes that p” satisfies his physicalistic criterion, i.e. that all statements of this form correspond to (physical) facts. The matter is complicated. Quine certainly accepts that most uses of this idiom do correspond to facts. The relevant facts are neurophysiological states of the person concerned, and those states are causally connected with actions which the person performs, or would perform under certain circumstances, and which we count as manifestations of the belief, or lack of belief. (Assenting or dissenting if one were asked is one such action, but only one among a myriad.) In cases where we have evidence for or against the ascription of a belief, the evidence consists in behaviour and there is presumably one or more neurophysiological states which explain the behaviour. The person’s being in those states, although not specifiable in neurophysiological terms, is the among the physical facts in which the truth of the ascription consists. Even where there is no behaviour of the relevant kind, there may still be dispositions to behave in those ways under certain unrealized circumstances. Here the dispositions are physical states in which the truth of the ascription consists. So in most cases where we ascribe belief, there is a fact of the matter which makes the ascription true or false. (For some discussion of dispositions, see a few paragraphs hence.)

The belief idiom, however, also lends itself to use in other cases, where there is no fact of the matter. These are not merely cases in which we have no evidence. They are case in which no behavioural tests which we might have carried out would have supplied evidence, cases in which there simply is nothing in the subject’s neurophysiology, and hence nothing in their actual or potential behaviour, which would decide the matter. Quine puts the point like this:

Some beliefs, perhaps belief in the essential nobility of man qua man, are… not readily distinguishable from mere lip service, and in such cases there is no fact of the matter…. But most attributions or confessions of belief do make sense…. The states of belief, where real, are… states of nerves. (1986a, 429)

Quine explicitly acknowledges that we could not in practice manage without idioms of propositional attitude, and that most uses of such idioms are entirely unobjectionable. But since such idioms allow the formation of sentence which do not correspond to facts of the matter, they are not part of regimented theory and should not be used when we are concerned with “limning the true and ultimate structure of reality” (1960, 221). (Some philosophers might insist: ‘Either you accept the concept of belief or you don’t’; Quine would not agree.)

A somewhat similar point can be made about subjunctive or counterfactual conditionals. Some are factual, but the general counterfactual idiom conditionals allows for the formation of sentences which are not factual. Like propositional attitudes, counterfactual conditionals have an important role in our practical lives. They are also closely connected with dispositions which, as we have seen, play a central role in Quine’s account of language and how it is learned. The connection is easily seen: to call an object fragile is to say that it would break if it were dropped onto a hard surface from a significant height.

Quine does not accept the general counterfactual idiom, “if X were to happen then Y would happen”, as part of regimented theory. As in the case of belief, the unrestricted use of this idiom allows us to form sentences whose truth-conditions are, at best, unclear. A famous example is the pair, presumably alluding to the Korean war of the early 1950s: “If Caesar were in charge he would use the atom bomb”; “If Caesar were in charge he would use catapults” (see Quine, 1960, 222. In such cases, we have no reason to think that some (physical) fact is being claimed. Many dispositions, however, are perfectly acceptable by Quinean standards. To call the glass fragile is to attribute to it a structure which would lead its breaking if it were dropped from a significant height onto a hard surface; the structure is a physical state, even if we cannot specify it in physical terms.

Quine claims that the dispositions he relies on in his account of language are like the case of fragility rather than the case of Caesar. The disposition to assent to an observation sentence when receiving certain stimulations is a physical state of the person concerned, in particular, presumably, of his or her brain. The claim that a given person has such a disposition is thus a claim about the state of a physical object. It is, moreover, a claim that we can test, at least under favourable conditions. There is no reason to exclude it from regimented theory.

Another idiom which Quine famously excludes from regimented theory is that of modality, statements that such-and-such must be the case, or cannot be the case, and so on. Such idioms have been the subject of much discussion on the part of Quine and (especially) his critics; the discussion here will be very brief. Technically, there are similarities with the case of belief. There is prima facie violation of extensionality which can, however, be avoided by taking necessity to apply to sentences; some philosophers have claimed that there is a de re sense of necessity which does not lead to even prima facie violations of extensionality. Quine’s attitude towards modality, however, is far less sympathetic than his attitude towards belief; he is particularly unsympathetic towards the idea of de re necessity, which he sees as requiring “Aristotelian essentialism” (Quine, 1953, 155).

What frames these critical points is the fact that Quine holds that regimented theory, the best and most objective statement of our knowledge, simply has no need for a notion of necessity. The benefit of including such idioms in regimented theory is not worth the cost in unclarity that it would bring.

5.3 Truth

Truth, in Quine’s view, is immanent. In accord with his fundamental naturalism, he sees judgments of truth as made from within our theory of the world. For this reason, he is in sympathy with what is sometimes called disquotational theory of truth: to say that a sentence is true is, in effect, to assert the sentence. Two qualifications must be made. First, the disquotational view is not a definition of “is true”. It enables us to eliminate the predicate when it is applied to a finite number of specific sentences but not from contexts where it is applied to infinitely many. Such contexts are of particular importance to logical theory. We say, for example, that a conjunction is true just in case both conjuncts are true; here “is true” cannot be eliminated. Second, calling a sentence true is in one way unlike asserting it. If we subsequently change our verdict on it we say that we used to believe it but now we don’t. We do not, however, say that it used to be true but now it isn’t; rather we say that it was never true. Quine, however, sees this as simply a point of usage, with no particular philosophical implications.

The immanence of truth, on Quine’s account, might suggest that his realism is threatened by what has become known as the underdetermination of theory by evidence: that two or more rival theories might have all the same observational consequences, and thus be empirically equivalent. Quine finds underdetermination harder to make sense of than might appear and, in any case, does not see a threat to realism; I shall defer further discussion to the next section.

6. Underdetermination of Theory by Evidence; Indeterminacy of Translation

In this section we take up two ideas much discussed by commentators. Neither is essential for an understanding of Quine’s overall philosophy, although in each case, but especially in the case of indeterminacy, the opposite claim has been made. (See Ebbs, 1997; for a defense of the position taken here, see Hylton, 2007.)

6.1 Underdetermination

The basic idea of underdetermination is stated at the end of the previous section. In Quine’s idealized schematization of the relation between theory and evidence, evidence for theory consists of observation categoricals. (These latter can, in turn, be tested by observing or contriving situations in which relevant observation sentences are true.) The case which most obviously poses a potential threat to realism is that of a final global theory, a perfected and completed version of our own. What if there are two or more such theories, each of which implies all true observation categoricals, and which possess other theoretical virtues, such as simplicity, to an equal degree? (Note that the theory will not be implied by all the true observation categoricals; apart from other considerations, some sentences of the theory will essentially contain terms which do not occur in observation categoricals.)

Quine is often thought to accept underdetermination. But in fact he holds that there is considerable difficulty in making sense of the doctrine. He identifies theories with sets of sentences, not with sets of sentence-meanings (propositions). So we can quite trivially obtain an empirically equivalent alternative to any theory: simply spell one of the theoretical terms differently at every occurrence. The result is a different set of sentences which imply all the same observation categoricals. The difference from the original theory, however, is merely orthographic; this possibility is clearly not of any philosophical significance.

A closely related point can be made in terms of translation. Translation of observation categoricals is, presumably, unproblematic in principle. So we can count two theories as empirically equivalent not merely if they imply the same observation categoricals but also if they imply intertranslateable observation categoricals. In that sense, however, the theory we are postulating is empirically equivalent to its translation into any other language. But this is also not of any great philosophical significance.

A version of underdetermination that might threaten realism would thus assert that our postulated complete global theory of the world will have empirically equivalent alternatives with no translation from one to the other being possible, i.e. that we cannot obtain one from the other by reconstruing the predicates of the theory. Quine comments: “This, for me, is an open question” (1975a, 327). Much of his subsequent discussion of underdetermination takes place in terms of the weaker idea that our theory might have empirically equivalent alternatives such that “we would see no way of reconciling [them] by reconstrual of predicates” (loc. cit, emphasis added; cf. also 1990, 97).

If some version of underdetermination were true, how should we respond? This is an issue on which Quine not merely changed his mind but vacillated, going back and forth between what he calls the “sectarian” and the “ecumenical” responses. The sectarian response is to say that we should not let the existence of the alternative in any way affect our attitude towards our own theory; we should continue to take it seriously, as telling us the unique truth about the world. (We are assuming that the two theories possess all theoretical virtues to equal degree; clearly Quine would say that if one theory were superior in some way then we would have reason to adopt it.) The ecumenical response, by contrast, counts both theories as true. In almost his last word on the subject he suggests that there may be little at stake since the “fantasy of irresolubly rival systems of the world” takes us “out beyond where linguistic usage has been crystallized by use” (1990, 100f). In an even later piece of writing, however, Quine speaks of himself as “settled into the sectarian [attitude]” (1986b, 684f.).

Quine can afford to vacillate because, in his view, nothing very much turns on the issue. In particular, he never holds that underdetermination, in any version, would threaten realism; at no time does he suggest that it casts doubt on the truth of our theory. That is not what is in question between the sectarian and the ecumenical positions; all that is in question is whether the alternative theory should also be counted as true. Nor is this surprising. The terms in which underdetermination is stated, such as observation categoricals, are part of our theory, as would be the demonstration that another theory was empirically equivalent. The point here is the naturalism which we have emphasized throughout. Nothing in our epistemology pronounces on the status of theory from an independent standpoint; to the contrary: it presupposes the truth of our theory. This central idea is not cast in doubt by underdetermination.

6.2 Indeterminacy of Translation

The general claim of the indeterminacy of translation is that there might be different ways of translating a language which are equally correct but which are not mere stylistic variants. The claim includes what one might think of as the limiting case of translation, that in which a given language is ‘translated’ into itself.

Some philosophers hold that the idea of indeterminacy is absurd, or that it amounts to an extreme form of scepticism about whether we ever understand one another, or whether correct translation is possible at all. It is not hard to see how such opinions arise. One picture of communication is like this: you have an idea, a determinate meaning, in your mind and convey it to me by your utterance. To those who have that picture, indeterminacy threatens the whole idea of communication, for it suggests that the conveying is always vulnerable to drastic failure. In the case of translation, the analogous view is that synonymy, or sameness of meaning, is the criterion of correct translation; in that case, indeterminacy may appear as a denial that translation is possible at all.

Such views, however, take for granted a view of communication, or of translation, which is very far from Quine’s. For Quine, the criterion of successful communication, whether or not it involves translation, is fluent interaction, verbal and nonverbal: “Success in communication is judged by smoothness of conversation, by frequent predictability of verbal and nonverbal reactions, and by coherence and plausibility of native testimony” (1990, 43). From this point of view, talk of synonymy and of ideas in the mind is simply a theoretical gloss which is (at best) in need of justification. Quine doubts that the gloss is justifiable; scepticism about the theorizing, however, is not scepticism about the data. Smooth communication certainly occurs, sometimes in cases where different languages are involved. That successful translation occurs is not cast in doubt by anything he says; his claim, indeed, is that it may be possible in more than one way.

At this point we need to distinguish two kinds of indeterminacy. Quine introduces the general idea of indeterminacy, in Chapter Two of (1960), without explicitly distinguishing them, but subsequently comes to treat them quite differently. The first is indeterminacy of reference: some sentences can be translated in more than one way, and the various versions differ in the reference that they attribute to parts of the sentence, but not in the overall net import that they attribute to the sentence as a whole. (This doctrine is also known as “ontological relativity” and “inscrutability of reference”.) To use an example which has become famous, a given sentence might be translated as “There’s a rabbit” or as “Rabbithood is manifesting itself there” or as “There are undetached rabbit parts”, or in other ways limited only by one’s ingenuity. All that is needed is what Quine calls a proxy function, which maps each object onto another object and each predicate onto one which is true of a given proxy-object if and only if the original predicate is true of the original object. For terms referring to physical objects, he suggests, we can take the proxy-function to map each object onto its space-time complement. The change to the translation of singular terms and the change to the translation of predicates cancel out, leaving the overall significance of the sentence unchanged. (Note that it will not help to ask the person we are translating whether she means to refer to the family dog or to its space-time complement: her answer is subject to the same indeterminacy.)

Indeterminacy of reference is akin to a view of theoretical entities put forward by Ramsey: that there is no more to such an entity than the role that it plays in the structure of the relevant theory (see Ramsey, 1931). For Quine, however, the point holds for all objects, since he “see[s] all objects as theoretical… . Even our most primordial objects, bodies, are already theoretical” (1981, 20). Quine holds, moreover, that that considerations akin to those of the previous paragraph amount to a “trivial proof” of indeterminacy of reference (1986c, 728).

The second kind of indeterminacy, which Quine sometimes refers to as holophrastic indeterminacy, is another matter. Here the claim is that there is more than one correct method of translating sentences where the two translations of a given sentence differ not merely in the meanings attributed to the sub-sentential parts of speech but also in the net import of the whole sentence. This claim involves the whole language, so there are no examples, except perhaps of an exceedingly artificial kind. There is also nothing resembling a proof; in some late works, indeed, Quine refers to it as a “conjecture” (loc. cit.). At some earlier points, he seems to think that sufficiently clear-headed reflection on what goes into translation will suffice to make the idea at least plausible. All that can be required of a method of translation is that it enables us to get along with the speakers of the other language: why should there not be more than one way to do it?

Arguments have been offered for holophrastic indeterminacy based on the idea of underdetermination of theory by evidence. Perhaps there is determinate translation of observation sentences, and thus observation categoricals. Still, if two distinct theories are compatible with all truths stated in observational terms, surely we could plausibly attribute either theory to the speaker of the other language? The weakness of this kind of argument is that translation must presumably preserve more than links between sentences and stimulations, as captured by observation sentences; it must also preserve links among sentences, links which make it more or less likely that a person who accepts a given sentence will also accept another. Could be methods of translation which preserved both kinds of links but nevertheless yielded different results? Quine’s term “conjecture” seems apt.

Given the interpretation advanced in section 3, above, indeterminacy is not crucial for Quine’s rejection of the sort of use that Carnap makes of the idea of analyticity. He has other arguments on that score, as we saw. More generally, indeterminacy is not a crucial part of Quine’s overall view. (His coming to speak of it as conjectural, while not questioning other parts of his philosophy, suggests that this is his view.) If we were sure that translation is determinate, we could perhaps use the idea to define a notion of synonymy. (Agnosticism here favours the contrary position.) And, as Quine has indicated, we could then define the meaning of an expression as the set of synonymous expressions. Such a notion of meaning might make some difference. It might, for example, provide a criterion of identity which enabled us to accept beliefs as entities (though it also might not: the criteria of individuation of meanings given by our hypothesized notion of synonymy might be too fine or too coarse to serve as a criterion of belief-identity). It will not, however, play the most important roles in which philosophers have cast the idea of meaning. In particular, it will not play a role in the explanation of how we understand our language, or of how communication is possible.

7. Quine’s place in the history of philosophy

In the 1930s and 1940s, many scientifically-oriented philosophers tended to assume some form of Logical Empiricism. One important aspect of Quine’s influence on the course of philosophy is that he called that view or nexus of views into question (see section 3, above). Some of his criticisms are detailed and technical. His target, however, was not a detail but the fundamental ideas of Logical Empiricism, that there is a distinction between analytic truths and synthetic truths which can account for a priori truth. After Quine’s work of the early 1950s, philosophers, even those who did not accept his detailed arguments could no longer take it for granted that some form of Logical Empiricism is correct. This was a very major change.

Quine’s rejection of Logical Empiricism him leads to two (connected) views which have been extremely influential. First, he rejects the idea of a distinction between philosophy on the one hand and empirical science on the other hand. To the contrary: he sees philosophy as essentially in the same line of work as science, but mostly concerned with more theoretical and abstract questions. This is an integral part of his naturalism. Second, his criticism of Carnap opens the way for something that might be called metaphysics: for very general reflections on the nature of the world, based on the best scientific knowledge that we have and on claims about how that knowledge might be organized so as to maximize its objectivity and clarity.

Both of these Quinean views, his naturalism and his acceptance of something like metaphysics, correspond to very important developments within analytic philosophy over the past half-century. We cannot know to what extent these developments would have taken place even without Quine’s work; it is, however, hard to resist the idea that his influence has at least played a significant role. (In the case of metaphysics, in particular, it is notable that two leading figures, Saul Kripke and David Lewis, were students of Quine’s.) For the most part, however, those doctrines have taken on forms that Quine himself would be strongly opposed to.

In the case of naturalism, many philosophers have welcomed the idea that they are free to use concepts and results drawn from empirical science. Fewer have accepted that philosophy should also be constrained by scientific standards of clarity, of evidence, and of explanatoriness. The result is that while views which claim to accept naturalism are common, those which accept Quine’s standards of what counts as reputable naturalistic philosophy are not.

The case of metaphysics is similar but perhaps more extreme. Quine does accept that the philosopher is in a position to make very general claims about the world (that there are sets but not properties, for example). In his hands, such claims are answerable to the idea of a total system of our scientific knowledge, regimented so as to maximize clarity and system. Many philosophers have welcomed the freedom to speculate about the nature of the world but have not accepted Quine’s constraints on the process. The result is a flourishing of metaphysics, often based on ordinary (unregimented) language or on the alleged deliverances of ‘intuition’; much of this work would be anathema to Quine.

On the one hand, then, Quine’s work has been extremely influential and has done much to shape the course of philosophy in the second-half of the twentieth century and into the twenty-first. On the other hand, much of the work directly or indirectly influenced by Quine is of a sort that he would have thought quite misguided.


Quine’s complete corpus

See the link in the Other Internet Resources to the list of writings of Quine compiled by Eddie Yeghiayan. See also the bibliography in Lewis Edwin Hahn and Paul Arthur Schilpp (eds.), 1986, The Philosophy of W. V. Quine, Peru, IL: Open Court; second, expanded edition, 1998 (which is complete up to 1997).

Works by Quine referred to in the text

  • 1951, “Two Dogmas of Empiricism”, Philosophical Review, 60 (1951): 20–43; reprinted in From a Logical Point of View, pp. 20–46.
  • 1953, From a Logical Point of View, Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press; revised edition, 1980.
  • 1956, “Quantifiers and Propositional Attitudes”, Journal of Philosophy, 53: 177–87.
  • 1957, “The Scope and Language of Science”, British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 8: 1–17; reprinted in Quine, 1966. (Note: there is an earlier publication with what Quine describes as “a corrupt text” in ed. Leary, The Unity of Knowledge, New York: Doubleday, 1955.)
  • 1960, Word and Object, Cambridge, Mass.: M.I.T. Press.
  • 1966, Ways of Paradox, New York: Random House; second edition, enlarged, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1976.
  • 1969, Ontological Relativity and Other Essays, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • 1974, Roots of Reference, La Salle, Ill.: Open Court.
  • 1975a, “Empirically Equivalent Systems of the World”, Erkenntnis, 9 (1975): 313–28.
  • 1975b, “The Nature of Natural Knowledge”, in S. Guttenplan (ed.), Mind and Language, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1975, pp. 67–81.
  • 1975c, “Mind and Verbal Dispositions”, in S. Guttenplan (ed.), Mind and Language, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1975, pp. 83–95.
  • 1976, “Whither Physical Objects?”, Boston Studies in Philosophy of Science, 39: 497–504.
  • 1977, “Intensions Revisited”, Midwest Studies in Philosophy, 2: 5–11.
  • 1981, Theories and Things, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • 1984, “Relativism and Absolutism”, The Monist, 67: 293–96.
  • 1986a, “Reply to Hilary Putnam”, in L. E. Hahn and P. A. Schilpp (eds.), The Philosophy of W. V. Quine, pp. 427–31.
  • 1986b, “Reply to Roger F. Gibson Jr.”, in L. E. Hahn and P. A. Schilpp (eds.), The Philosophy of W. V. Quine, pp. 684–85.
  • 1986c, “Reply to John Woods”, in L. E. Hahn and P. A. Schilpp (eds.), The Philosophy of W. V. Quine, pp. 726–28.
  • 1990a, Pursuit of Truth, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1990; revised edition, 1992.
  • 1990b, “Three Indeterminacies”, in R. Barrett and R. Gibson (eds.), Perspectives on Quine, pp. 1–16.
  • 1990c, “Comment on Parsons” in R. Barrett and R. Gibson (eds.), Perspectives on Quine, pp. 291–3.
  • 1991, “Two Dogmas in Retrospect”, Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 21: 265–74.
  • 1995, From Stimulus to Science, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • 1996, “Progress on Two Fronts”, Journal of Philosophy, 93: 159–63.
  • 2000, “I, You, and It”, in A. Orenstein and Petr Kotatko (eds.), Knowledge, Language and Logic, Dordrecht Kluwer Academic Publishers.

Secondary Literature

Note: works marked with an asterisk contain both essays on Quine’s work and comments on those essays by Quine himself.

  • Baldwin, Thomas, 2013, ‘C. I. Lewis and the Analyticity Debate’, Erich H. Reck (ed.), The Historical Turn in Analytic Philosophy, New York: Palgrave Macmillan, pp. 201–230
  • *Barrett, Robert and Roger Gibson, 1990, Perspectives on Quine, Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
  • Carnap Rudolf, 1928, Der Logische Aufbau der Welt (Berlin: Weltkreis-Verlag); translated by Rolf A. George as The Logical Structure of the World, London: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1967.
  • –––, 1934, Logische Syntax der Sprache, Vienna: Julius Springer Verlag; translated by Amethe Smeaton as Logical Syntax of Language, London: Kegan Paul Trench, Trubner & Co., 1937.
  • Ebbs, Gary, 1997, Rule-Following and Realism, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Frege, Gottlob, 1884, Die Grundlagen der Arithmetik, Breslau: Willhelm Koebner Verlag; trans. by J. L. Austin, The Foundations of Arithmetic, Evanston, IL: Northwestern University Press, 1978.
  • Gibson, Roger F., Jr., 1982, The Philosophy of W. V. Quine, Tampa, FL: University of South Florida Press.
  • –––, 1988, Enlightened Empiricism (Tampa, FL: University of South Florida Press).
  • –––, 2004, The Cambridge Companion to Quine, R. Gibson (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Gregory, Paul, 2008, Quine’s Naturalism: Language, Knowledge and the Subject, New York: Continuum Press.
  • Grice, H. Paul, and P. Strawson, 1956, “In Defense of a Dogma”, The Philosophical Review, LXV (2): 141–58; widely reprinted.
  • *Hahn, Lewis Edwin, and Paul Arthur Schilpp, 1986, The Philosophy of W. V. Quine, Peru, IL: Open Court; second, expanded edition, 1998).
  • Hookway, Christopher, 1998, Quine, Cambridge: Polity Press.
  • Hylton, Peter, 2007, Quine, London and New York: Routledge.
  • Kemp, Gary, 2006, Quine: A Guide for the Perplexed, New York: Continuum.
  • *Leonardi, Paolo and Marco Santambrogio (eds.), 1995, On Quine: New Essays, Cambridge, Cambridge University Press.
  • Orenstein, Alex. 2002, W. V. Quine, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • *Orenstein, Alex, and Petr Kotatko (eds.), 2000, Knowledge, Language and Logic, Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers.
  • Putnam, Hilary, 1962, “The Analytic and the Synthetic”, Herbert Feigl and Grover Maxwell (eds.,) Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science (Volume III), Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, pp. 358–97; reprinted in H. Putnam, Mind, Language and Reality, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 33–69.
  • Ramsey, Frank P., 1931, “Theories”, in The Foundations of Mathematics and other Logical Essays, R. B. Braithwaite (ed.), London: Routledge and Kegan Paul, pp. 212–236.
  • Strawson, P. F., 1959, Individuals, London: Methuen.

Other Internet Resources

  • W.V.O. Quine, a site maintained by Douglas Quine, son of W. V. O. Quine, dedicated to the work of the latter. It includes bibliographical information, lists of books on Quine, and much else.
  • Two Dogmas of Empiricism, the two versions, from 1951 and 1961, are reproduced, with the differences identified.


I am grateful to Dagfinn Føllesdal, Andrew Lugg, and Ed Zalta for their comments on earlier drafts of this entry.

Copyright © 2014 by
Peter Hylton <hylton@uic.edu>

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