First published Thu Feb 9, 2006; substantive revision Thu Jul 28, 2016

The world seems to consist of stuff and things. Some of the stuff composes things—that wood constitutes this ship. Some things endure for a long time—the 2nd century Pantheon building in Rome—others are transient—a sandcastle on the beach. People care, to varying degrees, what kind of thing is being considered, and whether the one they are discussing is the same one. The Pantheon in Rome today is the same one that was there in AD 150; the sandcastle on the beach today, though it is in the same location and looks the same, is not the one the tide washed away last night. Why do we care about objects and not just the stuff? Because objects are stuff with extra properties, properties that often persist and are often useful to know about even if the stuff changes

Philosophical realists view the emergence of objects from the stuff as an objective matter independent of human thought or interests; other philosophers argue instead that it is human cognition or language that produces the appearance of objects. Many philosophers have believed that the notion of a sortal is a, perhaps the, crucial philosophical tool in analyzing these issues and resolving the debates. Recently psychologists have also taken notice of the concept and argued for the importance of sortals in cognitive development. And researchers in artificial intelligence, specifically knowledge representation, have also started to use the idea. Unfortunately, there are conflicting understandings of the technical philosophical term sortal; authors often write at cross-purposes, which means that readers of any text about sortals should approach cautiously.

The three main ideas are that a sortal

  1. tells us what the essence of a thing is
  2. tells us how to count things of that kind, which requires knowing which things are different and which are the same
  3. tells us when something continues to exist, and when it goes out of existence

John Locke, who coined the term in 1690, was primarily concerned with (1), Peter Strawson, who in 1959 was the next to use the term, was primarily concerned with (3). Two historically intermediate philosophers who did not use the term but were interested in the concept, Spinoza and Frege, were primarily interested in (2).

What are some examples of sortals? The most generally agreed upon feature of sortals is that they provide a criterion for what is to be counted. All of the sortals listed next are counting sortals. Among the counting sortals, some are phase sortals—sortals that typically apply to something during part of its existence. An example is colt—the horse does not go out of existence when it matures and ceases to be a colt. Another category is restricted sortals, which also may cease to be true of the object without its going out of existence, for example a brown dog may turn gray. Philosophers debate about sortals and essences; we would distinguish between basic level sortals, the kind of noun or phrase that is most typically given as an answer to What is it? Questions. Good examples of answers to the question understood this way would be elephant or car. This form of sortal has strong affinities in some domains with what are called natural kinds, but many sortals apply to artifacts and not to natural objects. Another level of What is it? answer is at a very general categorial level, where some of the typical answers would be animal or vehicle.

Most nouns that are not sortals can form sortals in contexts where a unit is implicated, often without the supplementary unit being explicit. Coffee and gold are not sortals by most accounts, but we can intelligibly ask how many coffees Harry drank or how many golds the ski team won. It is understood from context that we are asking about cups of coffee and gold medals. These unitized sortals can be in any of the forms discussed above.

One of the most central kinds of sortal, and one of the most difficult to give uncontroversial examples of, are the persistence sortals. A persistence sortal is one where, if the sortal is no longer true of the object, the object no longer exists. If a car is crushed into a metal cube, the car no longer exists. But if the car is transformed into a boat, does some one thing exist first as a car and then as a boat? According to some views, when someone dies they cease to exist; according to various other views, the same person may be reincarnated in a new form. Is a werewolf sometimes a person and sometimes a wolf, or are they always a werewolf and neither a person nor wolf.

1. Overview

John Locke coined the term “sortal” in his 1690 Essay Concerning Human Understanding where he distinguished real essences (the mostly unknowable natures of things) from the nominal essences, the accessible characteristics we use to categorize things. The next use of the term was by Strawson in his 1959 Individuals in the context of investigating how we count and re-identify things. Subsequent influential discussions by Frege, Geach, Quine, Wiggins and others have combined some of the concerns about essences with issues of counting and identity.

The notion of a sortal overlaps with significant and long unresolved philosophical controversies in philosophy of language, metaphysics and philosophy of mind. Philosophers disagree about whether there are essences and those who agree that there are disagree about whether essences exist at a very general level—animal—or a specific level—tiger. And philosophers disagree about criteria of identity. Some believe that criteria of identity are relative to a sortal in ways that can conflict, two things might be the same ship but not the same wood. Others believe that identity conditions vary by sortal but do not conflict—that the criteria for the identity of ships is different from that for people but since people are not ships, the answers could not conflict. Others believe there is only one general identity criterion regardless of sortal, and others argue that there are no identity criteria. On one extreme view (Sider 1996), nothing exists at more than an instant We, like most of the literature on sortals, will not take that view into account in what follows.

Most, though not all (Geach, Lowe) agree that sortal words apply to things that we can count rather than things we measure. Sortals go with numbers and plurals. “Dog” is a sortal, “water” is not, so we say that we need two dogs but that we need more water. One confusing aspect of the distinction is that although “water” is not a sortal, there is often a tacitly understood qualifier in the context that combines to provide a sortal. At the grocery store, we might say we need two waters meaning two bottles of water; or in a restaurant we might ask for two waters, meaning two more glasses of water. So although “water” is not a sortal, the phrase “bottle of water” is, at least in one sense of the term. There are also quirks of language, English speakers decide how many vegetables to buy, but Germans consider how much Gemuse to buy, in spite of the fact that “Gemuse” means vegetable.

The counting characterization of what a sortal is includes many varied forms; we can count dogs, brown dogs, old brown dogs, old brown dachshunds, breeds of dog. But at most one of these characterizes the essence of the things we are counting. When being careful, philosophers call this subset essential or substance sortals. But not everyone is always careful. Also, there is a deep disagreement over whether the entire concept of an essence makes sense and so there are debates over whether there are a special subcategory of essential sortals. And among those who hold that there are essential sortals, there is disagreement over whether these are at a general level such as “animal” or a specific level such as “dog”

One point of agreement is that we must have a sortal in mind for counting to make sense. If we are looking at a barnyard and asked to count how many, we need to know what sort of thing we are counting. We could count animals or chickens or goats or tables or legs. Sortals specify the “kind of thing we are counting” and thus are associated with counting and a number. They contrast with other terms that involve measuring and an amount. Linguists distinguish count nouns, nouns that go with “How many?” and take plurals, from mass nouns that go with “How much?” and do not take plurals, Confusingly, many nouns have both a count and a mass meaning, so we can ask both how many chickens the farmer owns and how much chicken you would like on your plate.?

Often in order to count we also need to know when we have the same thing and when we have another, so sortals are also involved with identity. Identity questions are usually easy to answer when we are discussing currently existing things, though for very large objects the question can be tricky: Is the river that flows through Peoria Illinois the same one that flows through New Orleans?

Questions of identity through time are more often difficult, because they involve issues of persistence. If a kitten grows up it ceases to be a kitten but it is the same cat and the same animal. But if we tear down our garage and build a tree house out of the lumber it is not the same building. When does something survive change and when not? Which kinds of changes? Some philosophers believe that the special essence sortals provide criteria for continued existence and what these are depend on the essence of the object. So these are sometimes called “essential sortals” but readers should be wary because often writers drop the adjective even though they are only discussing the special subset. There are systematic disagreements among philosophers whether the essential sortals are to be located at a relatively specific level, e.g., “dog”, “river” or at the level of a more general category, e.g., “animal”, “geographic feature”.

In considering sortals, counting, and identity, it is important to bear in mind that the superficial forms of language use can hide complexity. For example, if we say that Sam and Maria own the same car, we probably do not mean that they are co-owners, but that they each own a car and that those cars are instances of the same model. What appears to be a question of identity between objects is actually a question of identity between kinds of cars.

But there are real, famous historical issues about identity that lead to disagreements about the relation between essential sortals and identity. Some philosophers believe that there is a unique universal identity relation which holds, or doesn’t, independently of any sortals. Others argue that identity is always relative to a sortal because we may have a statue of Lincoln which is a different statue than one of Caesar even though the lump of bronze from which the first was made is the same lump of bronze that constitutes the second. So in this case, the sortals “statue” and “lump of bronze” give different answers to the identity question.

While there is considerable agreement that sortals “provide a criterion of identity” there is disagreement on what is required for a criterion of identity. Some philosophers have more stringent expectations than others requiring that the statement of the criterion not use terms involving the sortals in question or similar terms. Also, as noted above some philosophers believe there is only one universal identity relation independent of sortals, and while others argue that there are no criteria of identity.

As a final preliminary to our more detailed history and analysis, we note that there is important variation between authors in whether “sortal” is applied to linguistic items, e.g., words like “cat” or “lake” or “cloud” abstract entities such as the property of being a cat or of being a lake or a cloud or to psychological entities such as the idea or concept of a cat or lake or cloud. The first interpretation views sortals as being culturally or linguistically determined, the second sees sortal categories as part of the furniture of the world independent of how we describe it, and the last is associated with a range of positions in between. The philosopher who coined the term “sortal”, John Locke, distinguished between the “nominal essence” of something, our concept of it, from the unknown “real essence” in the world, and used sortal to cover both.

2. Sortals and the mass-count distinction

Linguists have long distinguished between mass and count nouns on grammatical grounds and that distinction is close to the sortal vs non-sortal distinction philosophers deploy. Count nouns form plurals and occur in constructions involving “How many …” Mass nouns do not pluralize and occur in constructions involving “How much …?” We ask how many cats our friend owns and how much cat food. Some words, especially those involving food, have both a mass and a count sense. We can ask both how many chickens our friend owns and how much chicken you want for dinner.

The grammatical distinction is robust, almost all speakers of a language agree on which sentences are grammatical and which are not. But philosophers disagree about the extent to which count nouns match up with sortals. The sentences “There are three red things on the shelf” and “Two objects collided” are definitely grammatical, so “red thing” and “object” are count nouns, but most philosophers argue that they are not sortals. For example, Hirsch and Wiggins think not because they claim that you cannot count red things or objects, even though the request to do so is grammatical. Others think that we can count red things but that the only two possibly correct answers are “infinitely many” and “none”. If nothing red is present there are no red objects. But if some red thing is present then so are the top half of it, and also the bottom half, each of which are counted as a red thing, And the three thirds giving us three more red things, and so on ad infinitum. Whether this is the best understanding of “thing” is disputed. We won’t linger over that debate just now, but the issue recurs later when we discuss sortals and concept acquisition in children.

The count-mass distinction tracks closely in most instances with the intuitive difference between stuff and things we appealed to at the beginning, but not always. There are some differences in English that don’t seem systematic For example, “vehicle” and “vegetable” are count nouns, which makes sense because car and carrot are. But fruit and furniture are mass nouns although the things they refer to, apples and chairs, are referred to by more specific count nouns. And languages differ—as mentioned before, English speakers count their vegetables, but German speakers ask how much Gemuse you want, even though “Gemuse” refers to the same things as “vegetable”. And in Italian both “frutta” and “verdura” are mass nouns.

A related distinction is the one between counting and measuring. But while the differences between typical cases of counting—how many oranges do we have—as opposed to measuring—how much rice do we have—are clear, other cases are perplexing. Salmon (1997) offers multiple possible analyses of sentences such as “There are two and a half oranges on the table”, but he finds all of them wanting.

3. History of sortal from 1690–1959

Many philosophers (e.g., Wallace 1965) have claimed that the notion of a sortal is the same notion as developed by Aristotle under the label “secondary substance” in several of his writings. However, that concept is both complex and controversial (see Cohen 2016, Furth 1988) and we will not pursue the connection.

The first use of the term “sortal” is in Locke’s Essay Concerning Human Understanding (1975 [1690]).

But it being evident, that things are ranked under Names into sorts or Species…the Essence of each Genus, or Sort, comes to be nothing but that abstract Idea, which the General, or Sortal (if I may have leave so to call it, from Sort, as I do General from Genus) Name stands for. And this we shall find to be that, which the word Essence imports, in its most familiar use. (Bk.III, Ch.III, 15)

Locke goes on to distinguish between real essences, which are mostly hidden from us and determined by nature, and nominal essences, which we (somewhat) arbitrarily construct, but doesn’t say which he means to pick out by the expression “sortal” It is ironic that in discussion of the history of the term Locke and Aristotle are cited as the two historical sources, when a main point of Locke’s Essay was to argue against Aristotelian essentialism (Uzgalis 2016).

Roughly contemporaneously with Locke’s introduction of the term, Spinoza noted the importance of a sortal like term for counting though he did not use the term “sortal” or a Latin equivalent.

He who holds in his hand a penny and a dollar will not think of the number two, unless he can call both the penny and the dollar piece by one and the same name, to wit, a piece of money or a coin. (Spinoza 1674: 259)

The other pre-twentieth century author who is frequently cited as an antecedent of contemporary discussions is Frege. In Frege (1884) he makes the point that in counting things, we need to know what kind of thing we are counting. For example, something can be counted as one thing, a deck of cards, or as fifty-two cards. Frege was perhaps the first to use the phrase (which is translated as) “criterion of identity”. There is disagreement about whether Frege intended his remarks to apply to all kinds of identity, as Dummett (1973) argues, or only to numbers, as Lowe (1989) argues, but Dummett’s is the more common interpretation.

Wright (1983) argues that one of Frege’s most important contributions was emphasizing that numbers are objects and that this is intimately connected to Frege’s claim that “natural number” is a sortal. Wright is aware of the difficulties in characterizing sortals, which we will explore below, but remarks that “…whether or not it is ultimately rigorously explicable, the intuitive notion of a sortal concept is clear enough for our immediate purpose” (1983: 4). For further discussion see Zalta (2016, Section 2.5)

3.1 Strawson on sortals

The expression “sortal” reappeared on the philosophical stage in the 1950s and 1960s in lectures and in the written work of Strawson (1959), Quine (1960), Geach (1962), and Wiggins (1967) and variations on the concept entered the mainstream philosophical vocabulary. Because philosophers lecture and circulate manuscripts with their ideas for years—sometimes decades—before publication, the dates of the main publications of the protagonists concerning sortals do not necessarily reflect the historical priorities and influences. The most accurate simple summary is that the ideas of Geach, Strawson and Quine co-evolved and that Wiggins’ writings built on a foundation laid by those predecessors.

The widespread use of the term “sortal” definitely derives from Strawson, but readers should note that there are important differences among these authors. For a start, Strawson applies “sortal” to universals, Quine to predicates and Wiggins to concepts. Geach did not use the word “sortal” but most commentators identify his notion of a “substantival expression” with “sortal” in the other writers. Although Geach seems closest to Quine, since “expression” seems to be a linguistic notion, Geach generalizes his results across languages in ways that Quine would not find agreeable. These differences in usage among the four authors would not be important, if there were simple direct agreed upon relations among concepts, universals and expressions. But there aren’t.

Strawson made no mention of Locke, Aristotle, Spinoza or Frege in the context of introducing the expression “sortal universal” in Individuals in 1959.

A sortal universal supplies a principle for distinguishing and counting individual particulars which it collects. (1959: 168)

Strawson had two main projects in Individuals. The first was to show that material bodies and persons occupy a central position among particulars and that items in these two categories are basic to our conceptual scheme. The second was to

establish and explain the connexion between the idea of a particular in general and that of an object of reference or logical subject. (1959: 11–12)

Sortal universals are central to this second task because, according to Strawson, reference to particulars occurs by using expressions that are associated with sortal universals.

Strawson thus emphasizes two characteristics. Sortals

  • (1) give a criterion for counting the items of that kind
  • (2) give a criterion of identity and non-identity among items of that kind

It is not difficult to see why someone would identify these requirements. In order to know that there are exactly two Gs in a region S, it is necessary and sufficient to know that

There is an x which is in S and has G, a y which is in S and has G and is not identical to x, and for any z, if z is a G which is in S then z is identical with either x or y.

The phrase “criterion of identity” seems to mean a criterion which gives a necessary and sufficient condition for identity. In many cases, however, a weaker condition suffices for counting. To conclude that there are exactly two Gs in region S, all that is required is a sufficient condition for x and y to be distinct, and a sufficient condition for z to be identical with x or y. In the case of physical objects, it may be that being at the same location at the same time is sufficient for identity, and being in entirely separate locations at the same time is sufficient for distinctness. In most circumstances, these will suffice to count Gs, but it is far short of providing answers about partially overlapping Gs, and provides no guidance about identity across time. So often we may be able to count Gs without having a criterion of identity in the strong sense.

One of the unclarities of the phrase “criterion of identity” is that it is never spelled out what the criterion is to be applied to. For example, is it a criterion to be applied to names of objects or to perceptual representations of objects or to the objects themselves? It is also unclear how strictly we are to understand “criterion”. In “Entity and identity” (published in 1976 and reprinted in Strawson 1997b) Strawson proposed being quite strict, limiting the phrase “criterion of identity” to cases where there either is an explicitly statable necessary and sufficient condition that does not use the identity relation, or one where the identity relation is only applied to constituent parts of the objects. This can be done for numbers and sets, but probably not for any kind of concrete objects. In 1997, he retracted that proposal in favor of the looser (and still undefined) general philosophical use of the term (1997a: 2–3). In contrast, Wiggins understands the counting criterion very strictly so one instance where there is not a determinate answer to a question leads him to reject the counting criterion (2001: 75).

At the other end of the spectrum, Griffin (1997) only requires that

A term “A” is a sortal iff there can be cases in which “A” provides, without further conceptual decision, and without borrowing other principles of individuation, principles adequate for counting As. (1997: 43)

Since most philosophers who invoke the distinction want to reject “thing”, “object” and “entity” as non-sortals, Griffin’s suggestion is inadequate, or at least is a shift to a different concept with the same label. The question “How many things/objects/entity are in the space S?”, where S is an empty space has the determinate answer “zero”, so all of these terms pass the Griffin standard. One could attempt to amend the criterion by requiring that there can be cases which satisfy the above criteria and where there is at least one A. However, this fails to delineate the right cases, because there are sortals such as “unicorn” and “square circle” which have no instances. These points, and the observation that some of the various notions of sortal diverge, were first made in Feldman 1973 but have not been widely noted (Deutsch 2008). We will revisit some of these issues in Section 7.1 on sortals and infant cognition.

3.2 Criteria of identity

It is a triviality of logic, The Indiscernibility of Identicals, that if two things are identical, i.e., they are the same thing, then they share all of their properties. The controversial converse, The Identity of Indiscernibles, says that if two things share all of their properties then they are identical, i.e., they are the same thing. This is sometimes called “Leibniz’s law”. If “property” is understood sufficiently liberally, then the principle is certainly true—any object b has the property of “being identical to b”, and if c also has that property then \(b = c\). The question is whether the principle holds with any more restricted sense of property.

One way of understanding the phrase “criterion of identity” and the claims about sortals and identity is the following:

For any sortal F there is a set of properties \(\phi\) such that if b and c both are F, then if b and c instantiate exactly the same properties in \(\phi\) then \(b = c\).

Some attempts to give content to the phrase “criterion of identity” can be understood in this framework. Black (1952) argues that purely internal properties of objects do not suffice; his example is a universe with two spheres which share all of their internal properties, i.e., are the same color, weight, composition, etc. There are a wide range of philosophical views about criteria of identity. Brody (1980) takes the two identity and indiscernibility principles as jointly definitive of identity and consequently argues that no further criteria of identity are required. Baker (1997) argues that there are no criteria of identity across time, while Jubien (1996), Merricks (1998) and Zimmerman (1998) articulate reasons to doubt that there are any criteria of identity. Lowe (1989) is a more recent attempt to clarify the concept

3.3 Is identity strongly sortal relative?

One of the novel claims in Geach’s Reference and Generality was that identity is relative in the strong sense that for two sortal expressions F and G, b and c might be the same F, but not the same G. Geach used the expression “substantival” to characterize the kinds of term F and G are. His “substantival” coincides in many cases with sortals as understood by others, but cannot be entirely the same since he cites “gold” as an example of a substantival, in fact:

we can speak of the same gold as being first a statue and then a great number of coins, but “How many golds?” does not make sense. Thus “gold” is a substantival term, though we cannot use it for counting. (1962: 64)

One of the examples he gives is that b might be the same river as c, but not the same water. Or, if some bronze is made into first one statue, then a different one, then the two statues are not the same statue but are the same bronze.

Quine (1964) and others were critical of Geach’s solution to these puzzles and defended the view that there is only one unqualified sense of identity. In each of the problem cases, his strategy was to try to show that one of the statements of the form “same G as” is not a true identity statement. So in the river example, Quine would deny that the water is identical to the river and thus the two statements are about different objects. Almost all of Geach’s examples can with some plausibility be treated by distinguishing more carefully between objects of reference or distinguishing constitution from identity. Thus one might say that the bronze at different times constitutes the two statues but is not identical with them. Whether constitution really is or isn’t identity is a matter of continuing debate; for articulations of the two sides see Johnston 1992, Noonan 1993, and Baker 1997. For later stages in the debate between Quine and Geach, see Noonan 2014: §3.

Sometimes it appears that identity is relative, when in fact ambiguity of reference is present. We might say that George and I took the same bus, meaning that we both took a bus on route #56. Or you might say of the same events that we took different buses, because I took the #56 at 10:25 and George took one at 12:30. But these are not conflicting identity statements about the same things. The first concerns sameness of bus routes, while the second concerns time specific instances of the route.

One example that does not readily lend itself to these approaches is the problem of the Christian Trinity. According to this doctrine, God the Father, Jesus, and the Holy Spirit are three persons but one God or one substance. Thus they provide an alleged example where b and c are distinct persons but the same substance. We will not enter the debate, which is been conducted for over a millennium, as to whether this doctrine is coherent, but refer the reader to a modern discussion in Cartwright 1987. It is certainly accurate to say that all of Geach’s examples are contested.

3.4 Is identity weakly sortal relative?

Wiggins and others argue that identity is dependent on a sortal in a weaker sense. The criterion for the identity of sets is perhaps the one clear and uncontroversial case: Two sets are identical, the same set, if and only if they have the same members. (Notice that while the criterion is clear, the appeal to identity reappears with reference to the members.) While it is perhaps less uncontroversial, my car is the same as the car I owned five years ago even though the oil, tires, battery and have been replaced; the car can remain the same even though some parts change. My friend is the same person as he was five years ago in spite of many natural changes in the molecules composing his body, some dental fillings, an artificial hip and a new cornea lens. Two natural numbers are the same if they gave the same successor, and two real numbers are identical iff they bear all of the same order relations to the other numbers, =3.14…. Notice that in all of these cases appeal to identity recurs with reference to parts (whether body or automotive) or relations to other objects of the same category.

The weak sortal relativity claim consists of saying that the identity relation for sets is different from those for numbers, which is different from those for people and artifacts like cars, and numbers. For sets it involves members of whatever kind, for numbers relations to numbers and for persons and artifacts continuity of life and of function. For abstract non-mathematical things the relation is even less clear—the question when two ideas are the same idea is often only settled in a court case about copyright or patent infringement.

In other words, there are two conceptions of identity: On one the general identity relation is pieced together from the different identity relations for different categories of things. For a and b to be identical is for them to be the same person or the same number or the same artifact or …. On the other conception, there is a general notion of identity, perhaps given by the identity laws discussed in Section 3.2, and the specific ones are ways of instantiating that relation. The best argument for the first view is that the pieces seem too diverse to be parts of the same general relation. The best argument for the second is that as we move from domain to domain, and even invent new ones, the general identity scheme guides our development of an understanding of the more local notion. For a detailed analysis of Wiggins’ claims see Snowdon 2009.

4. Substance sortals

The sortals that Wiggins regards as crucial, the substance sortals, are a proper subset of the ones Strawson is concerned with. Substance sortals contrast with phase sortals; the latter typically only apply to some temporal segment of an object. Kitten is a phase sortal because when a cat matures it ceases to be a kitten but it does not go out of existence. Substance sortals are also contrasted with restricted sortals, e.g., “red table”. Wiggins has a detailed theory of the structure of substance sortals, arguing that if any two substance sortals overlap, then either one is a restriction of the other or both are restrictions of some other sortal.

This seems problematic because it is plausible that plant and animal are both substance sortals. While they do not overlap, another candidate for being a substance sortal carnivore overlaps both. This would probably not disturb Wiggins, since he already denies that “animal” is a substance sortal.

It is not to be denied that the words “this animal” suffice to express a rough and ready identification in ordinary contexts of what things are. But this is because “animal” so easily takes on an individuative force from a context and/or some other sortal predicate that is ready to hand. But the designation “this animal” is complemented in all sorts of different ways. In itself it determines no single principle of individuation. (2001: 129)

We said earlier that in contrast with Strawson, Wiggins is concerned primarily with the narrower class of substance sortals. Yet if we read his account carefully, it emerges that in the end individuation rests with an even smaller class which he calls “ultimate” sortals:

By an ultimate sortal I mean a sortal which either itself restricts no other sortal or else has a sense which both yields necessary and sufficient conditions of persistence for the kind it defines and is such that this sense can be clearly fixed and fully explained without reference to any other sortal which restricts it. (1967: 32)

…I shall call x’s ultimate sortal concept … the sortal concept which is individuative of x and restricts no other sortal concept. (1980: 65)

The idea is that “cat” and “dog” may both be individuated by the same criterion, so the fundamental criterion is not only associated with them but with other substance sortals that fall under the same ultimate sortal. We know from Wiggins’s remarks that “animal” is not a sortal, so the ultimate sortal for “cat” and “dog” is somewhere in the hierarchy above those concepts but below “animal”. Surprisingly, given the centrality of this notion, Wiggins nowhere gives an example of what he regards as an ultimate sortal. (At 1980: 123 he does speculate inconclusively that “man” might be the ultimate sortal for Julius Caesar.)

Without more specificity about when principles of individuation are the same and different, the foundation of Wiggins’s account is murky. For example, we don’t have enough information to determine whether some middle level term such as “mammal” is an ultimate sortal or not.

There are also other problems. Wiggins recognizes that his account of individuation of biological kinds in terms of “characteristic forms of activity” does not transfer well to prototypical artifacts. He tries to meet this concern by giving an analysis in terms of function for artifacts such as clocks. However, he seems to assume that there are not problematic intermediate cases between natural kinds and pure artifacts. Many kinds of things, e.g., rivers and lakes, can be either natural or artificial. They can also be partly artificial, as when a river is dredged or a lake enlarged. He provides no account of how these kinds of items are individuated.

Moreover, in his own favorite cases of biology, he remarks:

Almost everything that has been said so far has been mainly directed at words standing for the various species of natural substances. The account could be extended and adapted without overwhelming difficulty to predicates of genera, wherever these were still determinate enough to be autonomously individuative. (2001: 86)

Unfortunately, his own favorite examples, “elm” borrowed from Putnam (1975) and “frog” are not terms for species. “Elm” is a genus and “frog” an order. In fact, a quick consultation with a good dictionary will reveal that most commonly used biological terms are expressions for some classification above the level of species. Since Wiggins is cautious about extending his account to genera, he may have very few substance sortals by his account.

Yet another problem for species as the model of sortals is that most philosophers of biology now agree that species don’t have essences, though there is disagreement among them about the best way to characterize species (Ereshefsky 2016). Somewhat surprisingly, Wiggins himself presents some of the arguments why species don’t have essences. He states that species is an:

…insecure concept in plant-taxonomy, and threatened even in zoology by such phenomena as ring-species and the imperfect transitivity of the relation interbreeds in the wild with—the operational test of identity of species. (1967: 62)

5. Definitions of “sortal”

5.1 Sortals, essences and existence

Returning to our distinctions of ways of characterizing sortals, we can begin by repeating the observation that the counting criteria include many more things as sortals than do 3–5, which are also given as the definition of a sortal:

  • (3) gives a criterion for the continued existence of an item of that kind
  • (4) answers the question “What is it?” for things of that kind
  • (5) specifies the essence of things of that kind

Unless the question is given a more specific technical sense, it would seem that “What is it?” is quite satisfactorily answered by sortals in the broad Strawsonian sense. “A kitten” or “A red table” both seem reasonable, so (4) can diverge from (3). The kitten does not go out of existence when it becomes adult, but it is no longer a kitten. Evaluating (5) is very difficult since there is no consensus on whether kinds have essences (Quine would say “none”) and there is no consensus among those who assert the existence of essences as to what they are. Brody (1980), Forbes (1985), Salmon (1981) and Wiggins (1967, 1980, 2001) all have developed theories of essences, the first three relying on possible worlds for the analysis and Wiggins not. For critical discussion of the first and last, see Mackie (1994), and for the other two Robertson (1998, 2000).

In a different direction, Wiggins in his later writings gives examples to show that criteria of individuation and persistence are insufficient to count objects under a sortal, and thus some expressions meet conditions 3–5 but not 1–2.

…the concept crown gives a satisfactory way of answering identity-questions for crowns. But there is no universally applicable definite way of counting crowns. The Pope’s crown is made of crowns. There is no definite answer, when the Pope is wearing his crown, to the question “how many crowns does he have on his head” (1980: 73; 2001: 75)

In a footnote to the same pages, Wiggins gives a list of other examples of terms which permit individuation but not counting: “wave, volume of fluid, worm, garden, crystal, piece of string, word-token, machine”. Wiggins continues by explaining that, on his view, his account does not disagree with Strawson’s but corrects and enlarges it (2001: 75). We find it puzzling that Wiggins dismisses “animal” as a sortal but is willing to include “machine” which seems at least as problematic

5.2 Sortals and individuative terms

Quine’s terminology in this area differs from that of Strawson, Wiggins and Geach. In 1960 he uses the expression “term that divides its reference”, but in other writings (1969, 1981) he uses the expression “individuative word”. In footnote 1 of Quine 1960: 90 he says that his expression is equivalent to Strawson’s “sortal”. Unfortunately, that cannot be exactly true since 1960: 91 Quine says that “object” divides its reference, though we have seen “object” is not a sortal by the criteria of Strawson or Wiggins because it does not enable counting.

Quine does not give an explicit criteria for determining when a term “divides its reference”, but some have been proposed on his behalf. Wallace (1965) discusses two understandings of the term. The first is

G divides its reference iff it is never the case that if a is G, a can be divided into two parts which are G

While this characterizes “cat” as a sortal and “object” as a non-sortal, it also excludes some terms that are sortals by the counting criteria, e.g., garden hoses, rocks, piles of snow, sand dunes, amoeba and ice cubes. He also discusses the converse: G divides its reference just in case whenever a and b are G, the result of putting a and b together is never G.

This will get the easy cases right, as above, but also fails on the same problematic list. (Most of these points were made in Feldman 1973 where he also explores various other ways of modifying these principles.)

The closest Quine comes to an explicit formulation of a characterization is in contrasting individuative terms with mass terms:

So-called mass terms like “water”, “footwear” and “red” have the semantical property of referring cumulatively: any sum of parts which are water is water. (1960: 91)

By “sum” here he almost certainly means the mereological sum, not the result of physical juxtaposition. This would mean that “object” and “space time region” would not be sortals, but “spatio-temporally continuous object” and “space-time region with volume less than x” are sortals. These results may be consistent with Quine’s views given that he has indicated that he accepts “object”, but they diverge from the Strawson-Wiggins intent. Note that the three terms listed above have some significant differences; “water” refers to a kind of stuff, “footwear” to a kind of thing, and “red” is a property of both stuff and things. (See Laycock 2011 and the entry on object for further discussion.)

In any event, Quine’s view of the distinction is much more pragmatic than most. In explaining the distinction he says:

The contrast lies in the terms and not in the stuff they name. …consider “shoe”, “pair of shoes”, and “footwear”: all three range over exactly the same stuff, and differ from one another solely in that two of them divide their reference differently and the third not at all. (1960: 91)

Even this characterization of a contrast is dubious if we note that by the last criterion “object with mass more than 2 kg” is not an individuative term since the sum of any two such objects is another such object, whereas “object with mass less than 2 kg” fails the test since the sum of two such objects sometimes has mass over 2 kg. It is difficult to see any important respect in which the two expressions divide their reference differently. Object more than 2 kg and object less than 2 kg seem to divide their reference.

Another, example, given by Feldman (1973), can be used to illustrate the somewhat capricious nature of the distinction and its language dependence. He claims that “five-foot garden hose” is an individuative term since no part of it is a five-foot garden hose, but “garden hose” is not individuative. The latter claim requires some qualification. If being a garden hose requires a coupling on one end and a nozzle on the other, then the halves of a garden hose are not garden hoses. If being a garden hose requires neither a nozzle nor coupling, then each half (indeed each nth, up to some n) of a garden hose is a garden hose. If being a garden hose requires a coupling but not a nozzle, then one half of a garden hose is a garden hose but the other is not. Although the differences may be important to the gardener, it is difficult to see anything metaphysically deep here.

6. Sortals for abstract objects

Most discussions of sortals focus on kinds of physical objects, but by the definitions given many sortals also apply to abstract objects. And in some of these cases the question what is a criterion of identity becomes even more difficult. We can ask how many new ideas a political candidate has, how many governments Italy has had since 1950 and how many books David Wiggins has written. Ideas, governments and books (in the sense of type of book, not specific copies) are all abstract objects. We comment on changes in corporations over time—Apple has grown—which implies identifying Apple over time in spite of changes. But we are far short of having criteria to make decisions in harder cases: Did Rice Institute cease to exist in 1960 or was it just transformed with a new name and some changes in charter to Rice University. The buildings, faculty and students all persisted, but did the educational institution?

The question can perhaps be made more pointed if we consider sortals for collections that do not imply complex structure. Corporations are complex, as are educational institutions. In contrast, a flock of birds does not entail a great deal of complexity, just enough birds in one location. We can sometimes definitively say that two flocks are the same: if exactly the same birds flew over the lake this morning as did yesterday then the two flocks are in fact one. And if none of the birds that flew over the lake yesterday were in today’s flock, then they are definitively different. But suppose most but not all were the same birds?

Mathematics also presents issues about what counts as a criterion, even when the definition is quite precise. Two irrational numbers x and y are identical if they have exactly the same relations to each of the rational numbers. Pi is identical with 3.14… because Pi is greater than 3, 3.1, 3.14, etc and less than 4, 3.2, 3.15, etc. But does this count as a criterion? It appeals to the less than relation, which is a close cousin to identity itself and it involves relations to similar entities.

Yet another issue involves possible identification between different kinds of numbers. There is a natural number 2, a positive integer +2, a rational number 2/1, a real number 2.0000… Are these the same number? Different understandings of number and different philosophies of mathematics offer differing answers. But these controversies seem insufficient reason to deny “number” the status of a sortal.

7. Sortals and cognition

7.1.Sortals for infants

Is “physical object” a sortal? The general opinion among philosophers is that physical object is not a sortal. One reason for this conclusion is that to say something is a physical object does not give its essence, it doesn’t determine what kind of thing it is—this depends on the essence notion of sortal. A second argument is that it does not provide criteria for counting—the two halves of a physical object are also physical objects—this depends on the counting notion of sortal. A third is that it gives the wrong persistence conditions—the physical object which is a car for a period of time and then becomes a cube of crushed metal is not the same thing. This combines the essence and counting criteria for sortals.

Ayers (1974) argued that the concept of a physical object is fundamental to human cognitive processing and that it does provide criteria for counting and persistence even though it is not a sortal since it does not specify an essence. One important part of his argument is the clarification that a physical object is not simply the stuff of spatio-temporally continuous space time region but is a the stuff of a maximal region. That is, we do not generally regard any proper part of a physical object as a physical object.

The psychologist Xu (1997) has argued that the concept of a physical object is an essential part of cognitive development and is present in infants at a quite early stage. And she argued that physical object is a sortal because there are counting and persistence conditions (Spelke 1990). In contrast to Ayers, she argued that the physical object persists through even fairly dramatic changes, including her Biblical example of Lot’s wife becoming a pillar of salt (Xu 1997). Her position based on her own work and that of others (Xu & Carey 1996, Spelke 1996) is that the acquisition of the physical object concept is a crucial stage in cognitive development and is a step toward the development of the more refined sortal concepts that come with language acquisition. And she agrees with Ayers that the primitive concept remains in the cognitive repertoire of adults and can be deployed in cases where someone is confronted with a physical object whose further characteristics are as yet unknown. A similar argument is presented in Sarnecki (2008) for the necessity of a general sortal for objects as an intermediate step toward the acquisition of the sortals of language.

Quine (1960) articulated the claim that differentiation of the world into objects occurs only with the acquisition of language and with the conceptual apparatus of identity and quantification. Soja et al. (1991) provided experimental evidence that they conclude shows the Xu account gives a better explanation of the data than Quine’s.

Given the basic importance of object information for navigating the surrounding world, it would be surprising if at least some aspects of this concept was not shared by other species. There has been some uncertain evidence of this in primates, and recently appears to be strong evidence of the object concept in very young chickens Fontanari et al. (2014).

7.2 Sortals, essences and basic level objects

Gelman (2004) and colleagues have investigated the extent to which young children have beliefs about essential categories. The beliefs in question are that relatively accessible, perhaps superficial, conjunctions of characteristics indicate a common causal structure that provide the basis for inductive expectations about future behavior and properties. At a very general level, young children distinguish self-moving objects from those which only move under external causal influence. Although the evidence is only partial, it appears that to a considerable extent this classification is universal among humans and not simply an artifact of Western culture.

A related line of research initiated by Rosch (1973), Rosch et al. (1976) suggests that there is a category of basic level objects. Although context can lead to classifications at greater or lesser levels of specificity, in most contexts there is a common level of description that speakers prefer. For example, while we might generally describe something as a mammal or a poodle, the most common and natural noun would be “dog”. Rosch found considerable commonality in what are regarded as basic level objects across cultures although there is some variation. Her characterization of the basic level classifications is that those are the level at which relatively accessible information (shape, color, form of movement) provide the most information about other properties of the object. If it is self-moving and dog-shaped it is likely to bark, eat meat, chase cats, et cetera.

Although Roschian basic level objects are good candidates for informative answers to the question “What is it?” they do not provide traditional essences. Traditional essences as conceptualized by philosophers and most psychologists are necessary and sufficient conditions for being a member of that kind. On that conception, learning a new sortal requires knowing the elements and how they combine to define the new kind. On Rosch’s conception, sortal words are learned in families and the primary learning experience is becoming familiar with the prototypical members of the kind. Prototypes are the best examples, produce the quickest responses when subjects are queried about kinds, and are the most frequently cited when subjects are asked to give examples. In the category of birds, robins are one of the most prototypical, swans are intermediate and penguins are very unprototypical. Evidence for Rosch’s view of categories, which has clear roots in the views of Wittgenstein, consists of the failure to produce adequate necessary and sufficient conditions for most common sortals, as well as the positive experimental evidence just cited.

Related to the issues of essence, Markman (1989) and Markman et al. (2003) have argued that children’s early language learning is guided by several principles, one of which is the mutual exclusivity constraint. This constraint is that in learning words a guiding assumption should be that distinct words refer to distinct things. While this is not always true, Markman and others provide evidence that this constraint is operative, and that in the language learning environment of young children it is a very helpful, if imperfect constraint. If Rosch is correct about the existence of a preferred basic level of objects, it may be that speakers generally use words at that level of objects and thus the exclusivity constraint may be supported by the basic level object hypothesis. However, the experimental data are apparently conflicting on these questions (Mervis et al. 1994). Scholl (2008) provides a useful discussion of whether and how philosophy and psychology can interact beneficially in understanding these issues.

8. Sortals and Logic

8.1 Sortals and standard logic

Some philosophers, perhaps most notably Carnap (1950) have used a concept closely akin to sortals in formulating many-sorted logics. There is a technical point to be explained and a controversy to be discussed in relation to these.

Sometimes in applications of first order logic, i.e., when we are dealing at length with a specific class of interpretations the domain divides into intuitively disparate kinds of objects, e.g., people and numbers. In the usual formulation, one has predicates, e.g., Px and Nx which are true of those kinds of things respectively, and so one translates the English sentence “All numbers are odd” as \((\forall x)(Nx \rightarrow Ox)\) and “Some person is tall” as \((\exists x)(Px \mathbin{\&} Tx)\). In a many-sorted logic distinct variables are used for the different kinds of objects, perhaps m, n,… for numbers and p, q,… for people. In this language combinations of variables with predicates are sometimes restricted so that Nm and Tp are well-formed but Np and Tn are not. If one does not make this restriction then the notation is exactly equivalent to standard first-order logic. A many-sorted language is expressively equivalent to a single sorted one which has additional predicates for the various sorts of things (cf. Quine 1966).

From a purely technical point of view, one can introduce different kinds of variables to reflect any distinction one wants, e.g., there could be distinctive styles of variables for even numbers as opposed to odd ones, or for left-handed people as opposed to right-handed. However, Carnap and others who advocated a many-sorted logic for reasons that were more ontological than pragmatic introduced different variables only for what they believed were metaphysically distinct kinds of entities, e.g., numbers, physical objects, sense data. In this respect, there is some parallel with ultimate sortals as discussed above, although Carnap does not make an explicit connection with earlier writers.

A related use of many-sorted logic is to provide a kind of translation from second-order logic into a first-order logic. In this case instead of having second-order quantification over sets (or properties), one stays with a first-order language which is supplemented with a predicate true of all and only sets (or properties), a distinct style of variables for those entities, and with a two-place relation of either membership or instantiation.

8.2 Logics of sortals

Standard logic treats all predicate expressions alike—the predicates can be interpreted as any subset of the domain of quantification. If any of the claims discussed above about sortals are correct, then the sortal predicates have distinctive properties, and a more sophisticated logical treatment might provide philosophical illumination. One obvious and agreed on principle is that in general the negation of a sortal predicate is not a sortal. This contrasts with the predicates of standard logic where if F is a predicate, so is \(\neg F\), (not-F).

This principle holds regardless of which interpretation of “sortal” you take. Not only is “is not a cat” not a substantive sortal (Wiggins), you cannot count the non-cats since they include dogs, table, molecules, et cetera. However, for two of the other logical operators, disjunction and conjunction, the situation seems more complex. The expressions “dog or cat”, “apple or orange” and “fork or spoon” all seem to be well-behaved with respect to counting and identifying; we can easily imagine a city ordinance forbidding homeowners to have more than four dogs or cats. On the other hand, “dog or natural number” and “cat or clock” seem to provide methods of counting but seem unnatural as sortals.

The first “sortal logic” was developed in Stevenson (1975). Stevenson develops an account in which he says “We use ideas of Geach, Wallace and Wiggins, although we depart from each in certain respects” (1975: 186). Although the formalism follows Wallace in some respects, the main ideas seem to be those of Wiggins rather than Geach. Specifically, his theorem 3.4.5 affirms that for any sortals F, G, if b and c are the same F, and b is a G, then b and c are the same G, which is a denial of Geach’s relative identity thesis.

Two principles that Stevenson adopts following Wiggins are:

  • (i) For every sortal F, either F is an ultimate sortal, or there is an ultimate sortal G such that F is a restriction of G.
  • (ii) If two sortals F and G intersect, i.e., they are both true of at least one object, then there is a common sortal H of which both F and G are restrictions.

Stevenson proves the formal consistency and completeness of his set of axioms. It should be noted that completeness here is with respect to the language used. Since this is a minor adaptation of standard logic, there is no treatment of tense or modality, some essential elements of Wiggins’s notion of sortal cannot be expressed, e.g., if a sortal F applies to b at one time, then it applies to b at all times at which b exists, and if a sortal F applies to b, then F necessarily applies to b.

Stevenson does not permit combinations of sortal expressions, presumably because there is no easy way to deal with disjunctions and conjunctions of sortals in his formulation. However, a slight complication of his language would suffice to handle the problem. He uses “uS” for the ultimate sortal which governs sortal “S”. If instead he introduced a set of letters \(U'\), \(U''\) … for ultimate sortals, he could then superscript sortal expressions to indicate the ultimate sortal that governs them. He could then permit the disjunction of \(S^{U'}\) and \(T^{U'}\) since they are governed by the same ultimate sortal, but forbid the disjunction of \(S^{U'}\) and \(T^{U'}\) since they are governed by different ultimate sortals.

Cocchiarella (1977) presents a formal language, though no axioms or rules, for a logic of sortals which includes both tense and modal operators. His approach, like Wiggins, considers sortals to be concepts. Unlike Wiggins he gives a definition of “sortal concept”: as a socio-genetically developed cognitive ability or capacity to distinguish, count and collect or classify things (1977: 441). He disagrees with Wiggins on both principles (i) and (ii) above, arguing that while they may be true for natural kind terms, there are no reasons to believe that there are ultimate sortals of which various artifact sortals are restrictions, nor that every intersection of sortals must fall under an ultimate sortal. Cocchiarella’s approach also goes beyond Stevenson’s in that it involves second-order logic, i.e., it includes quantification over sortal concepts.

Cocchiarella’s ideas have been presented in more rigorous formal detail with axioms and consistency and completeness results for second-order logic in Freund (2000), tense logic (2001) and modalities (2004). However, neither Cocchiarella nor Freund address the question how to treat logical combinations of sortals. In their formalisms, sortal expressions S can only occur as qualifications of quantifiers, as in \(\exists xS\), which means that there is something which is S, or in the notation from Wiggins: \[b =_{S} c\] which means that b is the same S as c.

Guarina, Carrara, and Giaretta (1994) develop an account of sortals within knowledge representation, a subfield of artificial intelligence intended to bridge the gap between abstract formal logics and natural languages. Their definition of a sortal is that it is a predicate that provides countability and is temporally stable. A predicate provides countability if it does not apply to any proper part of what it applies to. As they explain this, “student” provides countability because no proper part of a student is a student; but “red” does not provide countability because parts of red things are also red. Temporal stability means that if the predicate applies to something at one time then it must at some other times as well. This is approximately the concept Strawson had in mind. They go on to distinguish a subset of these, the substantial sortals. A substantial sortal is one that, if it applies at all, necessarily applies all times. This is in close agreement with Wiggins’ use of the term. So while “student” provides countability and is temporally stable, it is not ontologically rigid, so it is a sortal but not a substantial sortal. On the other hand, a cat is always necessarily a cat.

Although there are obvious affinities with Strawson and Wiggins, it should be noted that Guarino et al. (1994) are primarily concerned with the distinction between kinds and properties of kinds, while the philosophers were more concerned with things and the stuff they are made of.

Belnap and Müller develop an alternative account of sortals within a non-standard formal logic for tense and modality. Unlike the usual background of possible worlds for modality, they use ideas from Bressan (1972) and adopt cases as the fundamental background notion They define a sortal as a predicate which is modally constant and provides separability. A predicate is modally constant iff it applies necessarily to something whenever it possibly applies. The idea is that while someone might possibly be a student without necessarily being a student, if they are human they are necessarily human. Thus “student” is not a sortal but “human” is. A predicate is modally separated just in case it is necessarily true that if any two things having the property are possibly identical, then they are in fact necessarily identical. Using their technical terminology of cases, if two things which have a modally separated property coincide in any case, then they coincide in every case. Belnap and Müller are explicit that they are providing a formal framework for classifying predicates, but that applications will require other kinds of thought:

whether a particular predicate is absolute is assumed to be not a matter of logic, but rather of science and metaphysics. (Belnap & Müller 2014: 397)

While there is a shared core of concerns in these last two approaches, it is clear that in addition to the superficial difference that Belnap and Müller restrict “sortal” to approximately the substantial sortals as defined in Guarino et al. 1994, there are differences even in the area of overlap. Modal rigidity and modal constancy are very similar. (Some caution is necessary here since the modal logic frameworks differ.) But Belnap and Müller emphasize modal separability and do not mention a counting requirement, Guarino et al. (1994) require countability but are not concerned with modal identities.

9. Conclusion

A large number of thoughtful philosophers have believed that the category of sortal was philosophically significant and this is a strong indication that there is something important they are attempting to delineate and analyze. In the last two decades cognitive psychologists and formal ontologists have applied the term in their research. However, our dissection of the definitions and discussions show that there are numerous distinctions in question and while these distinctions have significant overlap, they are not identical. It remains to be seen whether the sortal/non-sortal distinction marks one very important difference, or numerous less important distinctions related in complex ways.


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