First published Sun Oct 3, 2004; substantive revision Mon Feb 3, 2014

Many of the concepts analysed by philosophers have their origin in ordinary—or at least extra-philosophical—language. Perception, knowledge, causation, and mind would be examples of this. But the concept of substance is essentially a philosophical term of art. Its uses in ordinary language tend to derive, often in a rather distorted way, from the philosophical senses. (Such expressions as ‘a person of substance’ or ‘a substantial reason’ would be cases of this. ‘Illegal substances’ is nearer to one of the philosophical uses, but not the main one.) There is an ordinary concept in play when philosophers discuss ‘substance’, and this, as we shall see, is the concept of object, or thing when this is contrasted with properties or events. But such ‘individual substances’ are never termed ‘substances’ outside philosophy.

There could be said to be two rather different ways of characterizing the philosophical concept of substance. The first is the more generic. The philosophical term ‘substance’ corresponds to the Greek ousia, which means ‘being’, transmitted via the Latin substantia, which means ‘something that stands under or grounds things’. According to the generic sense, therefore, the substances in a given philosophical system are those things which, according to that system, are the foundational or fundamental entities of reality. Thus, for an atomist, atoms are the substances, for they are the basic things from which everything is constructed. In David Hume's system, impressions and ideas are the substances, for the same reason. In a slightly different way, Forms are Plato's substances, for everything derives its existence from Forms. In this sense of ‘substance’ any realist philosophical system acknowledges the existence of substances. Probably the only theories which do not would be those forms of logical positivism or pragmatism which treat ontology as a matter of convention. According to such theories, there are no real facts about what is ontologically basic, and so nothing is objectively substance.

The second use of the concept is more specific. According to this, substances are a particular kind of basic entity, and some philosophical theories acknowledge them and others do not. On this use, Hume's impressions and ideas are not substances, even though they are the building blocks of—what constitutes ‘being’ for—his world. According to this usage, it is a live issue whether the fundamental entities are substances or something else, such as events, or properties located at space-times. This conception of substance derives from the intuitive notion of individual thing or object, which contrast mainly with properties and events. The issue is how we are to understand the notion of an object, and whether, in the light of the correct understanding, it remains a basic notion, or one that must be characterized in more fundamental terms. Whether, for example, an object can be thought of as nothing more than a bundle of properties, or a series of events.

1. Underlying Ideas

Reflection on the concept of an object has its first theoretical articulation in Aristotle's Categories, where he distinguishes between individual objects and the various kinds of properties they can possess. He illustrates the various categories:

each [individual term] signifies either substance or quantity or qualification or a relative or where or when or being in a position or having or doing or being affected. To give a rough idea, ideas of substance are man, horse; of quantity: four foot, five foot; of qualification; white, grammatical; of a relative: double, half, larger; of where: in the Lyceum, in the market-place; of when: yesterday, last year; of being in a position: is-lying, is-sitting; of having: has-shoes-on, has-armour-on; of doing: cutting, burning; of being-affected: being-cut, being-burnt. (1b25 - 2a4)

The individual substances are the subjects of properties in the various other categories, and they can gain and lose such properties whilst themselves enduring. There is an important distinction pointed out by Aristotle between individual objects and kinds of individual objects. Thus, for some purposes, discussion of substance is a discussion about individuals, and for other purposes it is a discussion about universal concepts that designate specific kinds of such individuals. In the Categories, this distinction is marked by the terms ‘primary substance’ and ‘secondary substance’. Thus Fido the dog is a primary substance—an individual—but dog or doghood is the secondary substance or substantial kind. Each arm of this distinction raises different issues. If one is concerned with kinds of substance, one obvious question that will arise is ‘what makes something a thing of that kind (for example, what is involved in being a dog)?’ This is the question of the essence of substantial kinds. But if one is concerned with individuals, the parallel question is ‘what makes something that particular individual of a given kind (for example, what is involved in a dog's being and remaining Fido)?’ This is the question of individual essences and of identity over time. Aristotle was mainly, if not exclusively, concerned with questions of the first kind, but, as we shall see in sections 2.5.2 and 3, the latter question assumed a prominence later.

This association of substance with kinds carries over into a use of the term which is perhaps more scientific, especially chemical, than philosophical. This is the conception according to which substances are kinds of stuff. They are not individual objects nor kinds of individual object. Examples of this usage are water, hydrogen, copper, granite or ectoplasm.

There is a connotation of the word ‘substance’, reflected in the sense of substantial, which signifies durability or even permanence. Events, or Hume's impressions and ideas are never substantial in this sense, because they are fleeting. Atoms, fundamental kinds of stuff, gods, or abstract entities, such as Platonic Forms or numbers, might be considered to be substantial to the point of being indestructible or eternal: they last at least as long as the world exists—and, in the case of gods or God, or abstract entities, perhaps longer.

It seems, in summary, that there are at least six overlapping ideas that contribute to the philosophical concept of substance. Substances are typified as:

  1. being ontologically basic—substances are the things from which everything else is made or by which it is metaphysically sustained;
  2. being, at least compared to other things, relatively independent and durable, and, perhaps, absolutely so;
  3. being the paradigm subjects of predication and bearers of properties;
  4. being, at least for the more ordinary kinds of substance, the subjects of change;
  5. being typified by those things we normally classify as objects, or kinds of objects;
  6. being typified by kinds of stuff.

We shall see later that the Kantian tradition adds a seventh mark of substance:

  1. substances are those enduring particulars that give unity to our spatio-temporal framework, and the individuation and re-identification of which enables us to locate ourselves in that framework. (It should be remarked in passing that at least one major expositor of Aristotle (Irwin: 1988, especially chs 1, 9, 10) attributes a very similar intention to Aristotle himself.)

In section 3.5 we shall introduce a notion grounded in Aristotle's account, but which has not naturally found a place in the earlier discussion, namely the connection between substance and teleology. This can be expressed as:

  1. The substances in a given system are those entities crucial from the teleological or design perspective of that system. ‘Crucial’ means that other things exist either to constitute them or to provide a context of operations for them.

Different philosophers emphasize different criteria from amongst this list, for reasons connected with their system as a whole. One could plausibly say that an account is intuitively more appealing, the more of the criteria it can find a place for. Probably, the Aristotelian tradition comes nearest to doing this.

2. History of the philosophical debate on substance

Almost all major philosophers have discussed the concept of substance and an attempt to cover all of this history would be unwieldy. The selection made will concentrate on those philosophers in whom the broadly analytic tradition has shown most interest. First we shall look at the development of the concept in the ancient world, culminating in the work of Aristotle. His account dominated debate through the Middle Ages and until the early modern period. We shall consider various rationalist and empiricist treatments of the concept. Locke's contribution will be considered in especial detail because so much contemporary discussion is inspired (as we shall see in section 3) by an Aristotle-Locke nexus.

2.1 Substance before Aristotle

Many of the pre-socratic philosophers in fact had a concept of substance rather like that above attributed to chemistry: that is, their emphasis was on criterion (vi) above. They thought, that is, that the being of the universe (hence they were pursuing substance in sense (i)) consisted in some kind or kinds of stuff. Thales, for example, thought that everything was essentially water, and Anaximenes that everything was a form of air. For Anaximander, the ‘stuff’ in question was indeterminate, so that it could transmute into the various determinate stuffs such as water, air earth and fire. By contrast, atomists such as Democritus took those determinate particular objects they called ‘atoms’ to be the substance of the universe. Atoms are objects in our ordinary sense, though they are not our ordinary objects: they are not dogs and cats or tables and chairs. They are the subjects of predication, but they do not change their intrinsic properties. Classical atoms are, therefore, strong instances of (i) and (ii), but somewhat deviant cases of (iii) and (v).

Plato rejected these materialist attempts to explain everything on the basis of that of which it was made. According to Plato, the governing principles were the intelligible Forms which material objects attempted to copy. These Forms are not substances in the sense of being either the stuff or the individuals or the kinds of individuals out of which all else is constructed. Rather they are the driving principles which give structure and purpose to everything else. In itself, the rest would be, at most, an unintelligible chaos. The Forms meet criterion (i)—ontological basicness—but in a slightly eccentric way, because they do not, in a normal sense, constitute things. They meet (ii)—durability—in a strong fashion, for they are eternal. They are not, in the intended senses, the subjects of predication, and in no sense the subjects of change, so they do badly on (iii) and (iv). They do not do well on (v) for they are not individual things in any normal sense, though they are individuals, of a very unusual kind. (Aristotle's main criticism of Plato's Forms was that they are a bastard confusion of universal and particular. See Fine (1993).) They are in no way kinds of stuff, hence failing (vi). But failure to meet these standards is not carelessness on Plato's part. It reflects his emphasis on criterion (i), together with his particular view about the way in which forms are basic.

2.2. Aristotle's account of substance

There are two main sources for Aristotle's approach to substance, the Categories and Metaphysics Z. These will be discussed in turn.

2.2.1 Categories

Aristotle's account in Categories can, with some oversimplification, be expressed as follows. The primary substances are individual objects, and they can be contrasted with everything else—secondary substances and all other predicables—because they are not predicable of or attributable to anything else. Thus, Fido is a primary substance, and dog—the secondary substance—can be predicated of him. Fat, brown, and taller than Rover are also predicable of him, but in a rather different way from that in which dog is. Aristotle distinguishes between two kinds of predicables, namely those which are ‘said of’ objects and those which are ‘in’ objects. The interpretation of these expressions is, as usually with Aristotelian cruxes, very controversial, but a useful way of looking at it is as follows. Dog is said of Fido because it characterizes him as a whole. Fat and the others are described as being in because they pick out a constituent feature that could be said to be, in a logical though not a physical sense, part of, or in him. Fido the individual is not attributable to any further thing at all.

This account is intuitive, but perhaps it cannot be treated as a formally adequate definition of the notion of primary substance or individual. Fido the individual could be said to be in a certain location and so attributed to something, namely a place. It is natural to reply to this that an object is not an attribute of a place in the same way as a property is an attribute of a thing: the property is in a thing ‘as a subject’, but a place is not a subject to which a thing is attributed: the place does not ‘underlie’ the thing as a thing ‘underlies’ its properties. Although this may be true, it presupposes that we already have a grasp on the sense in which properties belong to objects and how this differs from the various ways that objects belong to or can be attributed to things, and that we can call upon this informal understanding in interpreting the theoretical account. Whether this is legitimate might depend on what the objective was. If the objective were to explain the difference between substance and property in an entirely non-circular way by appealing to the fact that properties are in substances but substances are not in things, this would involve taking the notion of being in as primitive. If we have to distinguish the sense in which properties are in substances from the way in which substances can be in things—such as places—before we can make the original point, then there has not been a non-circular account. If, on the other hand, the objective is simply to differentiate between concepts already in play, then Categories achieves its objective.

Perhaps it is better, therefore, to see Aristotle in Categories not as defining ‘substance’, so that someone wholly lacking the concept might come to understand it, but as exhibiting the marks and characteristics of a primitive concept on which we have an intuitive grasp. If we understand his project in this way, we can see Aristotle as presenting various marks of substance in Categories. The marks of primary substance are:

  1. Being objects of predication but not being themselves predicable of anything else (at least, not in the way entities in the other categories are: see the problem about attribution to location above).
  2. Being able to receive contraries. (4 a10) A substance can go from being hot to being cold, or from being red to being blue, but the instance of blue in an object cannot similarly take on and lose a wide range of attributes.
  3. If substance did not exist it would be impossible for things in any of the other categories to exist. There could be no instances of properties if there were no substances to possess them.

But these criteria do not show why ‘dog’ is a secondary substance term and ‘brown thing’ is not. So we need marks for being a secondary substance, or substance concept. On this he says two things.

  1. ‘It is reasonable that, after the primary substances, their species and genera should be the only other things called (secondary) substance. For only they, of things predicated, reveal the primary substance.’ (2 b28–30)
  2. ‘Of the secondary substances the species is more a substance than the genus, since it is nearer to the primary substance. For if one is to say of the primary substance what it is, it will be more apt to give the species than the genus.’ (2 b8–11)

The second of these two points is more uncontroversial than the first, for it is indubitable that species terms focus more precisely on particular things than generic terms. The first is, however, once again intuitive but not compelling. It appeals to the fundamental intuition that ‘dog’ tells you what Fido is better than ‘brown thing’ does, but does not really give a reason for this claim. Only in Section 3.3, when we discuss Wiggins's theory, will we find more formal reasons for treating species or sortal concepts as more revealing of ‘what something really is’ than are other terms.

The division between being said of and being in—that is, between substance concepts and other properties—seems intuitively clear enough until one remembers that substance concepts are complex and are definable in terms of other properties. Thus, ‘man’ is defined as ‘featherless biped’ or ‘rational animal’, and it would seem that ‘featherless’, ‘two-footed’ or ‘rational’ are properties and hence the kinds of things that are in objects. Aristotle denies that this is so when they enter into the definition of a substance. The features that specifically make an object the kind of substance that it is, are called differentiae, and Aristotle says

the differentia also is not in a subject. For footed and two-footed are said of man as subject, but are not in a subject; neither footed not two-footed is in man. (3 a23–5)

It would seem that these properties belong to objects in different ways when they are part of a definition from when they are not. The issue is what constitutes the unity of the species or secondary substance: why is it not just a collection of properties and, if it is just such a collection, why is it so different from any other collection of properties? In order to begin to see how Aristotle tackled this problem we need the apparatus of form and matter, which does not appear in the Categories. (We will see when discussing contemporary theories in section 3.1, however, that it is not clear that even now can we provide a wholly non-circular account of substance.)

2.2.2 Metaphysics

The Categories sets out important logical distinctions between different kinds of attribute, but it does not enter into a metaphysical analysis of substance itself. This takes place mainly in Metaphysics, Book Z. In the latter, the analysis of substances in terms of form and matter is developed, whereas these notions have no place in Categories. The distinction has led some commentators to talk of Aristotle's ‘two systems’, containing two radically different conceptions of substance. (Graham 1987) In the earlier, Categories, substances are simply individuals; in the later work they are complexes of form and matter. Whether this represents a change of view, or whether the purposes of the Categories simply did not require reference to the metaphysical analysis of substance is a moot point. It seems unlikely, however, given Aristotle's Platonic background, that his early thought was oblivious to the role of form in substance. Whichever interpretation of the development of Aristotle's thought is correct, the introduction of substantial form is what gives the fully developed Aristotelian account of substance.

Aristotle analyses substance in terms of form and matter. The form is what kind of thing the object is, and the matter is what it is made of. The term ‘matter’ as used by Aristotle is not the name for a particular kind of stuff, nor for some ultimate constituents of bodies, such as atoms (Aristotle rejects atomism). ‘Matter’ is rather the name for whatever, for a given kind of object, meets a certain role or function, namely that of being that from which the object is constituted. Relative to the human body, matter is flesh and blood. The matter of an axehead is the iron from which it is made. Relative to the elements, earth, fire, air and water, matter is an intrinsically characterless ‘prime matter’ which underlies the qualities of them all.

Aristotle acknowledges that there are three candidates for being called substance, and that all three are substance in some sense or to some degree. First, there is matter, second, form and third, the composite of form and matter. Aristotle acknowledges that matter can be a subject of predication and of change, thereby meeting one of the main criteria set up in Categories (1028 b35ff). This suggests an inadequacy or incompleteness in the account in Categories, for there he had seemed to assume that being the subject of predication belonged peculiarly to substance, and also that a subject is an individual of an appropriate kind—what he calls a ‘this such’: and matter is not an individual, but that from which an individual is made. Two of the criteria of substancehood presented in the Introduction above are: (v) being individuals and kinds of individual; (vi) being stuffs and kinds of stuff. Aristotle acknowledges that things under (vi)—‘natural bodies such as fire and water and everything of that sort’ (1028 b10–11)—are, or are thought to be, substances. But, without seeming to give much argument, he strongly favours (v) over (vi).

The elimination of matter as a good candidate for being substance, leaves either form alone or the composite of form and matter. The composite seems more consonant with the doctrine of Categories, for the composite is the individual. Aristotle, however, chooses the form as more paradigmatically substance. This has puzzled some commentators. Wiggins (1998: 232ff), for example, thinks that the change in doctrine between Categories and Metaphysics is wholly unhelpful. The choice of form as substance causes perplexity because the form seems to be a universal and equivalent to the secondary substance, and so not the most fundamental case of substance. But whether substantial forms are universals in Aristotle is a controversial matter. Interpreters disagree about whether the doghood that is in Fido is best regarded as the universal, or as the particular instance of the universal doghood, other dogs exemplifying numerically different instances of the same universal. (For example, Lloyd: 1981, Irwin: 1988, Woods: 1991, and Bostock's commentary to Aristotle 1994.) On this view, the most perspicuous way of regarding the individual substance is not as the composite of form and matter (though this is not wrong) but as the form individualized in the matter. The matter is still an essential component in the substance, but not, so to speak, as an equal partner with the form, but as the catalyst by means of which the form becomes an individual substance. It is clear, however, that if one holds that Aristotle thinks that forms are universals, then forms are not substance, for, in his attacks on Plato, Aristotle makes it plain that universals are not substance. Substances for Aristotle are individuals, but it is much debated whether they are individualized forms or composites of form and matter.

There are at least three serious questions about Aristotle's substantial forms. One we have already noticed, namely (i) whether such forms are universals or particulars. The others are (ii) what is the relationship between the substantial form and the properties which enter into its definition? We have already noticed this question when discussing Categories. (iii) What is the ontological status of such forms? This is connected with the second question, for it is connected with the question of what the substantial form is over and above the properties essential to it. What I mean by this is as follows. Let us agree, for purposes of argument, that human being is a kind of substance and that rationality and animality are the properties in terms of which that substance is defined. It is uncontroversial that these properties are meant to be objective features of the external world. But what is the relation between the substantial form and those properties? Is the presence of the substantial form human being nothing more than the presence of those properties, or is the form something further which is, in some sense responsible for the presence of those properties? We saw in the previous section that the differentia in terms of which a substance is defined is not treated as being ‘in’ objects, as other properties are. This seems to suggest that calling an object a substance of a certain sort is not just a way of attributing to it the properties in terms of which it is defined. Aristotle is undoubtedly a realist about substantial forms, in the sense of thinking them to be something more than a mere collection of properties, but how are we to understand this ‘more’?

It would be universally agreed by scholars that substantial forms are real in the sense that they play an irreducible and ineliminable explanatory role in the behaviour of the things in which they are the form. There are two interpretations of what Aristotle meant by this, one of which seems compatible with modern science and the other not. First the compatibilist one. Empiricist philosophers of science used to believe that the concepts in higher order sciences could be reduced, either by means of reductive definition or by ‘bridging laws’, to those in the more basic sciences. (See, for example, Nagel 1961.) By such means, everything could be understood in terms of the most basic science—presumed to be physics. Concepts in the other sciences are thus only a kind of shorthand for laborious descriptions in the language of physics. Few, if any, philosophers of science believe this now. They agree that, even if the world is ‘closed under physics’—every event has a complete set of physical causes—the concepts of the other sciences are irreducible and do autonomous explanatory jobs. Even if dogs are wholly physical objects and even if all the atoms in dogs follow very precise laws of physics, nevertheless when doing the biology of dogs one will need concepts not to be found in a physics textbook. This is not for mere shorthand convenience, but because of the kinds of things in which, for example, the biologist or veterinary scientist is interested. There are interpreters of Aristotle who think that this kind of irreducibility is all that Aristotle means—or needs to mean—by postulating an explanatory role for substantial form. His theory is at least neutral on the question of whether there is a closed system at the level of basic physics. (Nussbaum 1978, 1984)

The stronger, incompatibilist interpretation is that Aristotle did not believe that the behaviour of complex entities followed from the laws that govern their parts or their matter. (Gotthelf 1987, Robinson 1983) By contrast, the behaviour of the matter is influenced by what it is the matter of. The nature of the matter places restrictions on what the enmattered thing can do—an animal can only be made from living tissue, not of stone or fire—but exactly how that matter behaves depends on the substantial form present in it. The substantial form plays, therefore, an essential role, not merely in certain kinds of scientific explanation, but by being a fundamental efficient cause in its own right. Whichever of these is the correct interpretation of Aristotle, it was the second which was the core of ‘Aristotelian science’ as found in scholastic philosophy, and it was this aspect of the Aristotelian doctrine of substance that aroused most opposition amongst seventeenth century philosophers and scientists. They insisted that bodies behave as they do because of the mechanical consequences of the nature of the matter from which they are made: the matter is not ‘pushed around’ or organized by a substantial form. Philosophers and scientists of the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries believed that in rejecting such influences they were rejecting the Aristotelian doctrine of substance.

Finally, let us consider how Aristotle fares according to the criteria of substance with which we ended the introduction. Aristotelian substance, whether construed as individualized form or composite of form and matter meets (i), the criterion of ontological basicness. It also meets (ii), relative durability, although in a rather modest manner. Individual substances are more durable than instances of the properties in the other categories, for it is substances that can take on and lose those other properties. Individuals are not, however, very long-lived and on this criterion Aristotle makes what could be regarded as a concession to Plato, for it is form as universal, which Aristotle does not consider properly substance, which is most durable. There are at least two senses in which substantial forms are eternal. First, Aristotle believes the world to be eternal and all the same species to exist eternally. So that, even though particular objects are subject to degeneration and decay, the species as such are eternal. Second, generation and decay depend on the material component in composites. Any form that does not require matter for its activity will be eternal by nature. This applies to the active intellect, which is an essential feature of all human intellects, and to the immaterial movers of the cosmos described in Metaphysics, Book Lambda. (Further consideration of these topics would take us into Aristotle's philosophy of mind and his theology.)

As we have seen, substances are the paradigm subjects of predication and change, so (iii) and (iv) are met. As Aristotle's substances are individual things and kinds of things (v) is met. A nod is made in the direction of stuffs and kinds of stuff, but Aristotle does not develop this thought, so (vi) is barely met.

There were two major problems that the Aristotleian tradition has faced in the modern period. They are: (1) explaining and justifying the sense in which substantial forms have causal or explanatory power, especially in the light of a developed mechanistic chemistry or physics; (2) the difficulty in understanding the relation of substantial form to properties, especially those in terms of which a given substance is defined. These are connected. It is because the substantial form has genuine causal force that it is conceived of by Aristotle as a unified entity in its own right, and not just as a name for the collocation of properties in terms of which it is defined.

(One subject that has not been discussed is the connection between the doctrine of substance and teleology. Aristotle regards this relation as important, but in this entry it will have a section of its own, 3.5 below.)

2.3 Medieval accounts of substance

The standard account of the medieval treatment of the topic is that S. Thomas Aquinas is the only important figure and what he says differs little from Aristotle, except for making things more rigid and formal. It is clear, however, that this is a serious oversimplification. For a more nuanced and sophisticated view, see Lagerlund (2012), on which this section draws extensively.

Our discussion of Aristotle ended by returning to the issue if the unity of substantial form – what is the difference between a collection of ‘essential’ properties and the form as a unitary entity. Various aspects of this issue of the unity of substantial form preoccupied medieval philosophers. According to Aquinas, a substance possessed only one form, and its matter was the essentially characterless prime matter. In other words the informed parts of an object – in the case of a living creature, its organs, and the various kinds of stuff that constituted it (in the end, quantities of earth fire air and water) did not possess their own forms, but were informed by the overall substantial form. Others disagreed. Some of the disagreements were internal to the hylomorphic system. Duns Scotus, for example, argued that a dead person's body was the same body as had existed when that person was alive. The soul had departed, so the form which was the immortal soul could not be identical with the form of the body. This argument may seem to be specialized to the case of the human immortal soul, but, presumably, a similar problem applies to a dead parrot: it has lost its perceptive and vegetative souls, yet is the same body – even if it is no longer a parrot.

This line of thought proved to be a slippery slope, and, as so often, the downward slide was led by William of Ockham. On the one hand, Ockham was committed to hylomorphism, in that a substance is composed of form and matter. But he reverses the priorities of Aquinas and Scotus by saying that the parts are actual in their own right and do not derive their actuality from the whole: rather, the whole is nothing but the sum of its parts. This line of thought opened the way to atomism and to treating the unity of wholes as a matter of convention or degree. Buridan, who represents a further development in this direction, says

In this sense, I am not the same as I was yesterday, because something was part of my integrity yesterday, which has already been used up, and something was not part of my integrity, which has meanwhile been added by nourishment.(Buridan, Physics I,q.10, f. xiii: cited Lagerlund, 476)

It is clear that this way of thinking paves the way for atomism and its associated problems as they emerged in early modern philosophy.

2.4 Descartes, Spinoza and Leibniz

The concept of substance figures centrally in a positive way for the rationalist philosophers, in a way that it does not for the empiricists. The rationalists' substances are not, however, the individual objects of everyday life.

Descartes believed in only two kinds of substance: material body, which is defined by extension, and mental substance, which is defined by thought, which, in this context, is more or less equivalent to consciousness. Descartes (like Aristotle and unlike most of his contemporaries and immediate successors) was not an atomist. He did not believe in a void between bodies, so there is a sense in which there is just one material substance, numerically as well as specifically. For Descartes, therefore, material substance falls more naturally into the stuff category, rather than into the thing category. The situation is different for mental substance. The cogito shows that Descartes definitely believes that each person is a different individual mental substance.

Descartes, like the atomists, believed that matter operates in an entirely mechanical way. There is, therefore, no causal role for substantial form to play and, hence, no need for such forms. His two substances are each defined in terms of one property (extension for matter and thought for mind), hence there is no problem about the relation between substance and the properties in terms of which it is defined. As he does not have substances as individuals made of kinds of stuff, there is no conflict between individuals and stuffs.

For Spinoza, there is only one substance, the existence of which is demonstrated by a version of the ontological argument, which is thought of as being both God and Nature. It is an unending controversy whether Spinoza was a pantheist, or an atheist who called nature ‘God’ because it was the one true substance and existed necessarily. Everything else is a mode of this one substance. The view is analogous to a claim that the universe is space-time as a whole, with matter as distortions in it. If this were true, material objects would be modes of space-time. The analogy would be more exact if one also thought of the laws of nature as equivalent to the divine intellect immanent in nature. Spinoza's view represents the extreme end of stressing the status of substance as the fundamental existent conceived of as wholly necessary and self-subsistent: that is, criteria (i) and (ii) in the original list come to take on maximum weight. Nothing but the universe as a whole meets this criterion fully.

Leibniz was not satisfied by this conception of divine substance, at least in part because it confines God to what actually exists. For Leibniz, God contains within himself all possibilities, not just the actual world: this latter is just that maximal set of possibilities that he has best reason to actualize. Leibniz acknowledges created substances, though they are very intimately dependent on God. In the Discourse on Metaphysics, (Section 14), he says:

it is clear that created substances depend on God, who conserves them and indeed who produces them continuously by a kind of emanation, just as we produce our thoughts. (1998: 66)

The analogy with thought hardly emphasizes the independence of substance! Nevertheless, created substances do constitute the created world, and do, in that sense, meet criterion (i) for being substance. They are also the subjects of predication, so they meet criterion (iii). Leibniz's substances, however, are the bearers of change (criterion (iv)) in a very different way from Aristotle's individual substances. An Aristotelian individual possesses some properties essentially and some accidentally. The accidental properties of an object are ones that can be gained and lost over time, and which it might never have possessed at all: its essential properties are the only ones it had to possess and which it possesses throughout its existence. The situation is different for Leibniz's monads—which is the name he gives to individual substances, created or uncreated (so God is a monad). Whereas, for Aristotle, the properties that an object has to possess and those that it possesses throughout its existence coincide, they do not do so for Leibniz. That is, for Leibniz, even the properties that an object possesses only for a part of its existence are essential to it. Every monad bears each of its properties as part of its nature, so if it were to have been different in any respect, it would have been a different entity.

Furthermore, there is a sense in which all monads are exactly similar to each other, for they all reflect the whole world. They each do so, however, from a different perspective.

For God, so to speak, turns on all sides and considers in all ways the general system of phenomena which he has found it good to produce…And he considers all the faces of the world in all possible ways…the result of each view of the universe, as looked at from a certain position, is…a substance which expresses the universe in conformity with that view. (1998: 66)

So each monad reflects the whole system, but with its own perspective emphasised. If a monad is at place p at time t, it will contain all the features of the universe at all times, but with those relating to its own time and place most vividly, and others fading out roughly in accordance with temporal and spatial distance. Because there is a continuum of perspectives on reality, there is an infinite number of these substances. Nevertheless, there is internal change in the monads, because the respect in which its content is vivid varies with time and with action. Indeed, the passage of time just is the change in which of the monad's contents are most vivid.

It is not possible to investigate here Leibniz's reasons for these apparently very strange views. Our present concern is with whether, and in what sense, Leibniz's substances are subjects of change. One can say that, in so far as, at all times, they reflect the whole of reality, then they do not change. But in so far as they reflect some parts of that reality more vividly than others, depending on their position in space and time, they can be said to change.

2.5 Locke

According to Locke, we have two conceptions of substance. One is a ‘notion of pure substance in general’ (Essay II xxiii 2), the other ‘ideas of particular sorts of substance’ (II xxiii 3). Both these conceptions of substance provide difficulties of interpretation. They also both relate to issues in contemporary philosophy of substance, in which Locke's influence is almost as important as Aristotle's.

2.5.1 Locke on ‘pure substance in general

Locke expresses this idea as follows:

The idea then we have, to which we give the general name substance, being nothing, but the supposed, but unknown support of those qualities, we find existing, which we imagine cannot subsist, sine re substante, without something to support them, we call that support substantia, which, according to the true import of the word, is in plain English, standing under or upholding. (II xxiii 2)

The traditional rationale of Locke's doctrine of ‘substance in general’ is as follows. Properties—or, in Locke's terms qualities—must belong to something—‘cannot subsist…without something to support them’. Of course, they belong to objects, but what are objects over and above their properties? The special category of substantial form, as found in Aristotle, is rejected. All that seems to be left is a bare ‘something’, which on pain of regress, has no properties in its own right, except the property of being the owner or support of other properties.

This interpretation of Locke's notion of ‘substance in general’ is, however, a matter of controversy. It is contested whether Locke actually believed in substance as a characterless substratum. Although the first quotation above seems to affirm it, Locke also in the same section speaks disparagingly about the idea, comparing it to the notion that the world rests on an elephant, which rests on a tortoise, and so on: in other words, as not constituting a real explanation at all. Michael Ayers (1975, 1991b: 39–50) believes that the only substratum that Locke acknowledges is the unknown—and, Locke thinks, unknowable by us—structure of the minute parts. This is what he elsewhere characterizes as the real essence. It is clear from the text that Locke is at least uneasy with the idea of ‘pure substance in general’, but it is less clear whether he feels obliged to accept an idea he dislikes, or whether he rejects it. (For the view that he accepts it, and why, see Bennett, 1971 and 1987.)

There are indications that Locke is confused about what he means by ‘substratum’. He argues that the notion of spiritual substance is in no worse a predicament than material substance, because

we have as clear a notion of the substance of spirit as we have of body: the one being supposed to be (without knowing what it is) the substratum to those simple ideas we have from without; and the other supposed (with a like ignorance of what it is) to be the substratum to those operations which we experiment in ourselves within. ‘Tis plain then, that the idea of corporeal substance in matter, is as remote from our conceptions, and apprehensions, as that of spiritual substance, or spirit;…. (II 23 v)

This argument seems to conflate the notions of substratum as pure logical support with that as minute parts. If he means minute parts, then, though it is true that we do not and, in his view, cannot know in detail what they are, we have a theory, which he endorses, that they are probably minute parts as conceived by the atomists, which means they have primary qualities similar in kind though not in scale to those possessed by macroscopic objects. This gives a coherent, though speculative, conception of material substance. Of spiritual substance, we have no similar hypothesis. If, on the other hand, he means pure logical substratum, there is nothing to know, for there is no more to it, in either the material or spiritual case, than its role as substratum. He seems to conflate the ignorance we have of minute parts with the logical emptiness of the idea of pure substratum.

In fact there are three issues concerning the material underpinning of things which Locke regards as mysterious, and he seems to move indifferently from one to the other. First, there is organization of the minute parts of particular kinds of objects, which is responsible for the manifest properties of those objects, and which he thinks will always fall beyond our knowledge. Second is the mystery of what holds the minute parts together: the problem of explaining attraction in a system that only understands influence by impact. (xxiii 23). Third, is that idea of substance as a bare substratum, which is “a supposed, I know not what, to support those ideas we call accidents.” (xxiii 15).

Perhaps it is more profitable to ask whether, in his own terms, Locke ought to have accepted bare substratum. If we accept that the question of what binds together the qualities of a macroscopic object can be answered by appeal to the minute parts, the issue would then be what binds the primary qualities of atoms. Do the size, shape, mass, solidity of a particular atom require a bare substratum to inhere in for them to constitute a coherent object? Would they, without such a substratum be just a stack of qualities, a house of cards with nothing holding them together? There does not seem to be anywhere in the text where Locke discusses this problem—that is, the coherence of atoms as opposed to composite objects—explicitly. One possible resort is to treat solidity as the core or master quality and all the others as features of it. One would never ask what binds together a patch of colour and its shape, because the shape is the shape of the colour patch, and, though the shape of something can change, its shape cannot come away from it, like a separable component. Perhaps the shape, size and density of an atom are similarly features of the solidity. The quality solidity would then become equivalent to the notion of material stuff or material substance and Locke shows no sign of wanting to elide the ideas of quality and substance in this way, though it should be noted that this is what Descartes does with extension. Because he does not believe in void, extension carries with it the other basic properties of matter as features of it.

2.5.2 Locke on ‘ideas of particular sorts of substance

The ideas of particular sorts of substance—called sortals—are formed

by collecting such combinations of simple ideas, as are by experience and observation of men's senses, taken notice of to exist together, and are therefore supposed to flow from the particular internal constitution, or unknown essence of that substance. Thus we come to have the ideas of a man, horse, gold, water, etc… (II xxiii 3)

Thus, for Locke, the real essence is an unknown atomic constitution. The types that we categorize them in depend on the properties we happen to be able to perceive and kinds or sorts are defined in terms of these observable properties. Definition in these terms he calls ‘nominal essence’. Our concepts of natural substances presuppose that the nominal essence hides a real essence—that is, that all water, gold, horses etc are in some way similar at a microscopic level. But he both denies that these real essences play any role in the formation of our concepts and is deeply sceptical of our ever being able to discover what they are. His attitude towards the Aristotelian view is expressed later in the paragraph just quoted:

…a philosopher…whatever substantial forms he may talk of, has no other idea of those substances than what is framed by a collection of those simple ideas which are found in them….

Locke's doctrine of sortals is in some respects realist and in some conceptualist or conventionalist. It is realist in at least the following ways.

  1. The properties [ideas] in terms of which sortals are defined do correspond to real qualities and powers in the world. There is no sense in which these building blocks of reality are creatures of our conceptual scheme.
  2. The properties invoked by nominal essences are “supposed to flow from the particular internal constitution, or unknown essence of that substance”(xxiii 3). This internal constitution “makes the whole subsist by itself” (xxiii 6).

Thus Locke is entirely realist about individual bodies and their properties. He is more conventionalist, however, about their classification under particular sortals. There are four ways in which he is a conceptualist about particular substances, as we classify them.

  1. There is nothing over and above the properties of an object corresponding to our substance concepts—nothing, that is, like a substantial form—present in the world. Sortals are entirely formed by our minds, in the light of the properties perceived to be in the world.
  2. The boundaries we draw between kinds of things are, to some degree at least, arbitrary and concept relative.
    I do not deny, but nature, in the constant production of particular beings, makes them… very much alike and of kin one to another: but I think it nevertheless true, that the boundaries of the species, whereby men sort them, are made by men…. (III vi 37: italics in original)
  3. The situation in (ii) is greatly aggravated by our ignorance of real essences. If we could know those more accurately, we would know better where to draw the boundaries.
  4. The disposition of properties in nature need not have been as it is and might actually contain oddities not corresponding to any of our sortals. Sortals, unlike Aristotelian species, place no constraints on how individual objects must or ought to be.

Locke's contribution is, therefore, three-fold. He brings to centre stage the question of whether properties require some substratum or bare particular to inhere in or belong to. He asserts that the substantial nature of the physical world is the unknown structure of atomic parts, not a substantial form which reflects our usual concepts. Third, he develops a theory of substance which is realist about particular objects and their properties, but conceptualist or conventionalist about our classifications, within the constraints that the facts about particulars and properties impose.

There is one important context, however, where Locke does not appear to talk in a conventionalist way about sortal identity, but in a way that seems to be reminiscent of substantial forms. This is when he is discussing the individuation of living things. He understands ordinary bodies as mereological sums of atoms. As such, any change of particle constitues a new object, for a mereological sum is individuated by its parts and a change of parts means a change of the object constituted by those parts. Treating ordinary, non-living, bodies as complex enduring objects is a matter of convention determined by the concepts we happen to possess. Living things, however, have a deeper principle of unity.

That being then one plant which has such an organization of parts in one coherent body, partaking of one common life, it continues to be the same plant as long as it partakes of the same life, though that life be communicated to new particles of matter vitally united to the living plant…. (Essay II.27.4)

One might wonder what this ‘common life’ is supposed to be, especially in the light of his rejection of Aristotelian ‘substantial forms’. Furthermore, it is tempting to argue that all coherent, solid bodies—such as a lump of rock or plasticene—have some principle of organization which persists through change. Living objects are simply the most dramatic case of this. (Though Peter van Inwagen (1990) defends the view that only living things and atoms are real entities: inanimate complex bodies are not true individuals.) Nevertheless, though the appeal to ‘life’ seems to modify Locke's conventionalism, it still leaves open the possibility that the divisions we make between different species are conventions, because, though we can recognize life (or a ‘continuing principle of organization’) itself, it is still relatively arbitrary and concept-dependent where life (or ‘principle of organization’) of one kind ends and another starts. So our division of things into species, though grounded in real continuities in the way that our non-biological (or non-natural) concepts are not, is still nominal.

As we shall see, the idea that there is a real unity which is passed on through the life of an object or through any principle of organization is something that Hume criticizes and rejects.

The potential for a stronger realism in Locke has been exploited by Putnam and Kripke in their development of a modern, essentialist conception of natural kind terms. Locke was pessimistic in two connected respects. First he was sceptical about the possibility of science discovering the nature of the real essences—the structures of atoms or molecules—that underlie kinds of substance picked out by our ordinary sortals. Second, he doubted whether the objects picked out by our actual substance concepts really shared a real essence in the way we assume that they do. He was not confident, that is, that everything we call gold, or iron, or a monkey, was actually interestingly similar at a non-superficial level. Both these forms of pessimism proved largely unfounded. The consequence of this is the possibility of bringing together real essence and the sortal concepts originally picked out by a nominal essence. We now know water to be H2O and iron to be the element of atomic weight 56. Our substance concepts were, often at least, tracking real essences in the world. This involves reinterpreting the rationale of our substance concepts. Locke thought that our concept of gold was properly expressed as ‘anything gold in colour, malleable, soluble in aqua regia’. He thought that we add the optimistic assumption that there will be similarity at the microscopic level. What many philosophers, under Putnam's influence, now think he should have said is that gold is that kind of thing which is individuated by a particular kind of minute structure that underlies the stuff which is gold in colour, malleable, soluble in aqua regia. In other words, our confidence that these kinds have a genuine real essence is built into the concept. If this is correct, then our ordinary ‘natural kind’ concepts, like water and gold, have built into them intimations of a deeper unity than that supplied by superficial features, even if it be allied to a complete agnosticism about what that unity might consist in or whether we might ever uncover it.

How does Locke, then, rate against the six criteria for substancehood that were set up in the introduction? Accepting, for these purposes, that Locke believed in substratum, we can apply these tests both to substratum, and to his ‘ideas of particular sorts of substance’.

First, consider substratum. (i) Ontological basicness. There is a sense in which it is ontologically basic, but it is a rather empty sense: it is the substancehood of everything, without explaining the nature of anything. (ii) Durability. Again, it meets the criterion, but in an empty way. It is difficult to see how it could be destroyed (like Aristotle's prime matter) but it has no positive nature. (iii) and (iv) Bearer of predication and subject of change. As with matter for Aristotle, it meets the first of these standards well, but, in so far as it is a component only in atoms, it is not the subject of change. (v) and (vi) Kinds of individuals and stuffs. Although in everything, it is itself no kind of thing and therefore no kind of individual or stuff. Substratum's claim to substancehood does not rest, however, on meeting the tests itself, but on being what enables particular kinds of substances to be substances. According to the believer in substratum, it is in virtue of their inhering in a substratum that a collection of properties can constitute an enduring, change-sustaining thing of a certain kind. Without that support, individual instances of properties could, if they could exist at all, be no more than ephemeral events.

We have seen that Locke's particular substances are kinds of things, and because they are kinds they correspond to Aristotle's secondary substances. But we have also seen that the boundaries between these kinds are largely a matter of convention, which is not true of Aristotle's secondary substances. In so far as their individuation is dependent on human convention, they are not ultimately real in their own right. But though they are not real as kinds, the individual parcels of matter that we classify in these ways are perfectly real. Locke does not, as far as I can see, refer to these individuals as ‘substances’. Substances, considered as kinds, or instances of kinds, can sustain change—living things, for example, change in size throughout their lives. Most individual parcels of matter, however, become different individuals if they change any of their parts; although we have seen that this does not apply to living things, where there seems to be a metaphysical component called sameness of life.

In general, Locke's particular substances are not ontologically basic, because their essences are nominal, though this is not so clearly true for sortals naming biological kinds. Locke's conceptualism about such substances makes most of the tests irrelevant, which are cast within a realist framework. Locke's ‘particular substances’ are kinds which are individuated conventionally, and so are not real substantial kinds, by Aristotelian standards. But Locke is not without substance other than substratum, for his real essence—that is, the atoms and their structures—are his real substances, and what we say above about the substantiality of atoms also goes for Locke.

2.6 Hume and Kant on substance

It is plausible to maintain the general thesis that there are many issues on which Hume was a sceptic or nihilist, but where his legacy is more reductionist than sceptical or nihilist. This general thesis can be explained and illustrated by considering his treatment of substance, for it is a case in question.

According to Hume, in the Treatise, our belief in substance is the result of a mistake or illusion.

When we gradually follow an object in its successive changes, the smooth progress of the thought makes us ascribe an identity to the succession…When we compare its situation after a considerable change the progress of the thought is broken; and consequently we are presented with the idea of diversity: In order to reconcile which contradictions, the imagination is apt to feign something unknown and invisible, which it supposes to continue the same under all these variations; and this unintelligible something it calls a substance, or original and first matter. (1978: 220)

Hume's target is any account that postulates a unifying ‘something’ that underlies change, whether this be a characterless substratum, a substantial form or (though this is not explicitly mentioned) something like the ‘continuing life’ that Locke sees as passed on in living things. The crucial point is that a succession of very similar things does not constitute the real continuation of anything, only the illusion of real continuation.

Thus Hume's treatment of substance is like his treatment of causation, in that he sees both as the projection onto the world of a tendency of our minds either to pass from one thing to another or to associate them in some way. He either doubts that there are such things as substance or causation (scepticism) or even positively denies that there are (nihilism). Out of Hume's very forthright negative attitude there developed two more subtle variants. One of these variants is in the empiricist tradition. That tradition modified Hume's approach by developing it into a form of reductionism. The experiences which gave rise, through habit, to the mistaken belief (in, for example, substance or causation) are presented as what the belief really affirms. That is, the empirical basis for what Hume deems to be an illusion, is reinterpreted as the reductive account of the concept. Causation then becomes constant conjunction, or substance a name for a bundle of properties organized in a certain way or the continuing of the possibility of certain sensations.

Kant developed the other variant. He took Hume's ‘tendencies of the mind to pass’ from one idea to another, without which we could not construct the world, and canonized them as a priori categories of the understanding. Hume's empiricist emphasis is psychological. It concerns what we are habituated to do. Because of his empiricism, he will not bring non-psychological necessity into it. Nevertheless, there is the implication that making these transitions is the only way in which one can understand the world. Kant drops the empirical psychology and makes it a matter of a priori psychology, that only by employing certain categories could we have experience as of a physical world. It is only by understanding the world as possessing enduring spatio-temporal objects, which enter into causal relations with each other (that is, it is only by applying the categories of substance and causation) that we can have intelligible experience. Substances—that is, a framework of stable, enduring objects—are essential, but the source of this necessity lies not how the world is in itself, but in the framework which we are obliged to impose.

In the Kantian philosophy of P. F. Strawson (1959, 1966), this framework of necessity is taken in a more common-sense and realist spirit. The world must possess such enduring objects for it to be intelligible for us—indeed, for us to be part of it, for we are essentially stable bodies amongst other stable bodies. The important point for both Strawson and Kant is that there must be substances for there to be a coherent empirical, spatio-temporal world. Substance has become a formal concept of central importance—that is a concept with a special central role in the structure of our conceptual scheme—rather than being the name for certain kinds of important things in the world. This distinction, however, is one that has to be handled carefully, especially within a realist Kantian framework, such as Strawson provides. This should become clear below when we discuss Wiggins's theory, which is both Aristotelian and Strawsonian. Nevertheless, it gives ground for adding the seventh of the marks of substance mentioned in the Introduction, namely that substances are those enduring particulars that give unity to our spatio-temporal framework and individuation and re-identification of which enables us to locate ourselves in that framework.

3. Contemporary controversies

Two major areas of controversy require attention. First, there are the issues concerning how to characterize substance in contradistinction to properties and the other categories. There are at least two major questions here. One concerns defining the notion of substance. In particular, there has been much debate about whether substance can be accounted for in terms of its special kind of independence. The other is whether substancehood require some extra component beyond properties, (and, if so, what?) or whether a 'bundle of properties' theory of substance is adequate. Second there is the relation between substances and our practices of individuation and reidentification. In particular, we shall look at the issue of whether objects must be individuated under the kind of sortal expressions that correspond to Aristotelian substance concepts, or whether a more generic notion, such as physical body, will suffice. This latter concern will lead on to a consideration of the connection between substance and teleology.

3.1. How substances are distinguished from things in other categories

One natural response to the question of what distinguishes substances from properties is that properties depend for their existence on substances, for they are properties of objects (that is, of individual substances), but that substances do not similarly depend on properties for their existence. The point cannot be made quite so simply, however. Properties could not exist without objects to be properties of, but neither could substances exist without properties, so the dependence appears to be mutual.

This problem can be overcome by more careful expression of the point, making it clear that we are not talking about properties in general and substances in general, but about particular instances or cases of a property and the particular objects to which they belong. A particular property instance cannot exist and could not have existed without the substance of which it is a property, but the particular substance can exist and could have existed without that property instance. Thus, a particular instance of colour cannot exist, and could not have existed, without the object of which it is the colour, but the object can exist without the colour instance, for it may change colour and remain the same object, or it could have had a different colour from the start.

Various problems can be raised for this account. The most obvious is that it does not, as stated, distinguish between substances and events. Some property-instances belong to events rather than substances. The performance of a symphony, for example, is an event, and it may possess the property, in one of its movements, of being allegro. It seems plausible that this particular case of something's being allegro could not have been exemplified by another performance, but the performance might go on to be andante in another movement, so the event can continue to exist without that original property. The assimilation of events with substances in this way seems strained, however. It does not seem natural to say that the same event was first allegro, then andante, because it is more natural to attribute the different properties to different parts of the event, which are themselves events (in this case, movements). This brings out a major difference between substances and events, namely that the temporal parts of events are themselves events in their own right, but the temporal parts of objects—meaning by that expression the temporal phases of an object's existence—are not themselves objects. Indeed, it is not natural to talk of the temporal parts of objects, though some philosophers (led by David Lewis (1986), but see also Sider (2001), Hawley (2001) and the entry on temporal parts) think that there are compelling philosophical reasons for doing so. The rationale implicit in our ordinary concept is that an object is wholly present at all the temporal points of its existence. I say ‘implicit rationale’, because it seems no more natural to speak of an object as being ‘wholly present at all temporal points of its existence’ than it is to say that it has objects as its temporal parts. Nevertheless, one does not think of a long-lived object as consisting of a series of short-lived objects stacked end to end, but one does think it natural to think of a drawn-out event as consisting of a series of shorter events. If it is not natural to think of objects as having objects as their temporal parts, this seems to commit one to thinking of objects as wholly present at all times of their existence, strange though this form of expression may also be.

The difference between substances, events and properties can now be expressed as follows. Substances and events are distinguished from properties by the fact that properties are the kinds of things the instances of which depend for their existence on the particular substance or event by which they are instantiated, whereas substances and events are such as not to depend for their existence on particular instances of properties. And substances are distinguished from events in the following way: events are those property-instantiators that, when they exist through time, are temporally composed of further things of the same category (i.e., events): substances are those property-instantiators that, when they exist through time, are not temporally composed of things of the same category (i.e., of substances) but endure singly through the period.

Lowe, in his (1998), which contains a very thorough discussion of all the topics discussed in this section, defends an ‘independence’ account of substance, which he states in terms of identity, as follows:

x is a substance if and only if x is a particular and there is no particular y such that y is not identical to x and the identity of x depends on the identity of y.

He considers two objections to his own account which would seem to apply to all independence accounts. One is that it cannot cope with essential properties, for it seems to imply that, for any given property-instance, a substance can exist without it, which is not true of essential properties. The other is that it cannot cope with the necessity of origin for individual identity.

Lowe responds to the former objection by saying that essential properties are identical with the substance, so cannot be cited as something other than substance that meets his criterion for being substance. It is not clear that this will work. The idea that the essence is identical with the substance is Aristotelian, but it is not clear how this applies to essential properties, taken individually. We have already seen, in our discussion of Aristotle, that the relation between the essence as some kind of unity and the properties that seem to constitute it is not clear. He copes with the second by denying that origin is essential to identity. Unfortunately, he argues for this position by citing human subjects: Socrates, for example, would still have been who he was even if he had had different parents. This is, of course, controversial about humans, but it is our Cartesian intuitions that make it plausible in that case. That this table, for example, could have been the same object even if made from different material does not have the same plausibility.

Whether these objections to the above versions of the independence account can be answered is unclear. Hoffman and Rosenkrantz (1994 and 1997) develop a different, though probably not incompatible, conception of the relative independence of substances compared to other categories. Substance, they say, is the only category of thing which might have only one instance through at least a minimally extended period of time. Thus, for example, there is no possible world which has, in a given period of time, only one event, for any non-instantaneous event will be made of events which are its parts. Similarly for properties or tropes, there can never be only one because any one entails the existence of others, as, for example, the existence of a red property (instance) entails the existence of (an instance of) the property colour. By contrast, there could exist through a period of time just one substance, provided that it was atomic.

As Mackie (2000) points out, the full statement of this theory involves various relatively ad hoc restrictions. More importantly, it does not seem to explain what unifies the category of substance, for it does not say that it is true of any substance that it could conceivably be the only substance existing for a period of time—indeed, it could not apply to non-atomic substances, for complex ones can exist only if other substances—those that constitute their parts—also exist. It implies only that something from the category of substance might so exist and that this could not be true of any other category. One might wonder what enabled substances that could not exist alone to count as substances at all.

If either of the above accounts are successful, substances, properties and events are distinguished. The question remains, however, how far these are nominal and how far real distinctions. That there is a difference between substance concepts and property concepts has definitely been shown, but does it follow that there are, in reality two different kinds of thing, namely properties and substances? The answer might seem to be obvious. Given that there are substance concepts, if those concepts are instantiated, then there are substances in reality. Cat, table, human being, are substance concepts by the above accounts, and there are cats, tables and humans, so there are substances in reality as well as properties.

The matter is not so simple, however. It is possible, and not uncommon, for concepts of a certain kind to be exemplified, but for it to be the case that, nevertheless, entities answering directly to those concepts are not included in the most economical statement of one's ontology. This is reductionism, and it can operate in either of two ways, namely either analytical reductionism or what one might call de facto or ‘nothing but’ reductionism. In the present case, it would conform to the analytical option if the concept of substance could be analysed in terms of properties or events (e.g., ‘to be a substance =df to be a collection of properties bound together in way W’). But one might still hold that, though the concept of substance is not precisely analysable and is indispensible, substances in fact are nothing but collections of properties. This latter is the de facto option. So the existence of substances does not show that the concept is important from a philosophical perspective, or, if it has some significance, whether this is just as a necessary part of our conceptual scheme, or as an ineliminable feature of reality itself.

3.2 Bundle theories versus substratum and ‘thin particulars

3.2.1 Bundle theories and their problems

We have just noted that there could be analytically reductionist or de facto reductionist accounts of substance in terms of properties. It is also the case that the properties might be conceived of as universals, or as individuals—that is, property-instances, which are sometimes called ‘tropes’. There are, therefore, four options for the bundle theorist.

  1. The concept of substance can be analysed in terms of some relation between properties conceived as universals.
  2. The concept of substance can be analysed in terms of properties conceived of as individuals, e.g., as property-instances or tropes.
  3. Substances are in fact no more than bundles of properties conceived of as universals.
  4. Substances are in fact no more than bundles of properties conceived of as individuals.

The main objections to the ‘universals’ form of the theory rest on its apparent commitment to the Identity of Indiscernibles, for if an object is no more than a bundle of properties, then if a and b have exactly the same properties, they are the same bundle. Whether it does carry this commitment may depend on whether one allows spatial points as particulars, in addition to the properties that are universal. If one did, then the universal theories would not entail the identity of indiscernibles, for the same universals could be in two bundles by being at two different locations.

If properties are conceived of as individuals—otherwise known as tropes, property-instances or individualized forms—then there cannot be a problem about the distinctness of exactly similar bundles, for the difference is built into the identity of the elements of the bundle, as it is not if the bundle is made of universals. The problem for this version of the bundle theory seems to be that it is difficult to individuate or distinguish tropes in a way that makes them suitable to be individuals—in one sense, the substances—from which objects are made. (Armstrong 1989, 115ff) For example, if an object has a size, a mass, and a motion, are the size and the mass different tropes and is it not strange to think of the size alone as a genuine particular suited to be treated as an ‘atomic’ component of the whole? One way out of this problem may be to resort to the notion of a master property which was invoked in the discussion of Locke on substratum (2.5.1); that is, to the notion of one property of which all the others are modes, as visual shape is a mode of colour, or extension is the master property of matter for Descartes. In the Newtonian model, solidity might fill this role, for shape is merely the outline of the solidity which constitutes the heart of the object. In a sense, theories of this kind are not ordinary bundle theories, for one property is chosen to fill the role of substratum, because the other properties inhere in, or are modes of, it. Whether anything could perform this role from amongst the properties that are basic to modern, post-Newtonian physics—properties such as charm, energy, spin and mass—is not easy to judge.

3.2.2. The concept of substratum or ‘thin particular’

If one is not satisfied with a bundle theory of substance, so that one thinks that an individual substance is more than a collection of properties, how is one to understand this ‘more’? This question can be given a deflationary or a substantive answer. The deflationary answer is that a substance is a thing which has properties, and that is all one needs to say. (See, for example, Crane and Farkas 2004, 143f, and Chisholm 1969.) An object is not composed of properties and some further ingredient—the ‘thingy’ bit—an object is something which simply has properties. Any feature of it can, of course, be regarded as a property, but that does not render an object nothing but a collection of properties. There seems to be a clash of intuitions at this point about what makes sense. An opponent of the deflationary view will say that properties, however understood, must be components of objects, conceptually or formally speaking. If they are not the only components in this sense, one must say something about the nature of the rest. The deflationist thinks that this line of thought embodies some kind of category mistake in the way it handles the idea of a component. The anti-deflationist will argue that the fact that we are talking about components only in a conceptual sense does not alter the fact that we are obliged, once we start, to offer an account that is complete and distinguishes the various elements.

Bennett offers one way out of the need to postulate a mysterious substratum.

When I say ‘This is an orange’ I mean that there are here instances of certain properties such as orangeness, sphericality etc., and I indicate that I am operating on my ideas of those instances in a certain combining manner. (1987: 202. Italics added.)

This solution, as Bennett recognizes, makes substancehood a function of how we operate on the properties we perceive. It is, in that sense, more Kantian than realist. As what it recognizes as out there in the world is just a bundle of properties, it does not dissolve the problem in the way that a deflationist would require.

Substantive theories take the thought of a further component seriously, and, though they do not seem to be generally distinguished, there are two main conceptions of this extra element, which I will call the ‘thin particular’ and the ‘substratum’ conceptions. ‘Thin particular’ is an expression of D. M. Armstrong's. It is the particular in abstraction from its properties. When considered with its properties it is a thick particular. The important point is that thin particulars really are particulars. ‘Bertrand Russell might have been a fried egg’: that is, the thin particular associated with one set of properties and, hence, with one thing, might have belonged to another. Different properties might have been hung on this hook. It is not so clear, by contrast, that a substratum of the kind Locke considers, or like Aristotle's prime matter, is a particular in this sense. It is more like a kind of stuff—the substantiveness on to which properties are stuck. On this conception, the suggestion that the ‘piece’ of substratum or ‘prime matter’ that is here in object a, might always instead have been there in object b, seems to lack content.

It is useful at this point to take note of the three different functions the thin particular or substratum might fulfil. Its role might be (i) to bind the properties into a unity, so that they do not ‘fall apart’: (ii) to individualize them, if they are universals: (iii) to carry one across the categorial barrier from property to substance; that is, to be what it is that makes something to be in the category of substance.

The first role will not be necessary if one thinks that there is a ‘master property’ of which the others are modes, or if one thinks that unity can come from some causal or organizational connection. (ii) will not apply to a tropist theory, or if one thinks that location will do the job. (iii) rests on the intuition that no collection of properties could, in themselves, amount to a substance: the very idea is a category mistake, and only the presence of a special ‘substantializing’ element could do that. It might be argued that this intuition begs the question against the bundle theory. At the current state of the debate, it looks as if there is no compelling reason for accepting substratum.

3.3 Substances and sortals

The Aristotelian tradition anchors the concept of substance, at least in nature, primarily to instances of species of natural object. The Kantian tradition ties it to those enduring bodies the individuation of which gives sense and structure to our spatio-temporal framework. David Wiggins (1967, 1980, 2001) has made a sustained attempt to prove that these two objectives necessarily go together and to make the Aristotelian notion of substance, even including its bias towards the biological, central to our practice of individuating objects.

Wiggins assumes that individuating a temporally enduring object involves being able to re-identify it at different times and under different descriptions. This assumption makes it possible to state substance individuation using the language of identity. Within the scope of this assumption, he makes two claims. The first is the sortal relativity of identity: that is, when any a and b are asserted to be the same thing, they must be the same something-or-other, and the something-or-other must be the kind of concept that answers ‘what is it?’ questions. In other words, there is no such a thing as ‘bare identity’—identity under no concept at all. Furthermore, the relevant concept must be an Aristotelian substance concept or sortal. More formally, this can be expressed as follows:

If a = b then (a) there is a sortal F such that:
  1. a is an F
  2. b is an F
  3. a is the same F as b.

The second claim is that is that if the object picked out by ‘a’ also falls under another sortal, G, then so will the object picked out by ‘b’, and it will be the same G as a. This is represented as an application of Leibniz's Law, for if a is the-same-G-as-a (as it must be) then, as a = b, b must be the-same-G-as-a.

(b) for any sortal G,
  1. a is G iff b is G,
  2. if a is G then b is the same G as a.

The conclusion is striking because it is a denial that a and b might be identical under one form of identification, but not under another. In fact it implies that every individuable object falls under just one ultimate sortal. (Wiggins admits this in (2001: 67 n.7). What is meant by ultimate sortal will emerge below.) For every ultimate sortal has its own principle of individuation, and if an object fell under more than one, there could be a time at which it satisfied the criteria for one and not for the other. Wiggins's thesis is a very strong claim, apparently backed up by a powerful argument. It is a strong claim for it purports to prove that any world with individuable objects must be constituted by Aristotelian substances. The argument is powerful because it follows by simple logic, granted seemingly plausible claims about identity, and Leibniz's Law.

On the other hand, there seem to be many cases of objects which can be identified under a variety of concepts, leading to different life histories. This is termed relativity of identity. For example, a and b may be the same person but not the same child because b is a grown up and no longer a child. Or a and b may be the same lump of clay but not the same statue because b is the lump after it has been reshaped out of its statue shape. These are the most typical kinds of counter examples and Wiggins has responses to both. He deals with the first by invoking the concept of a phase sortal. A phase sortal is one that, by its meaning, denotes part of the life history of something, which, as a whole, is denoted by another sortal. So child is a phase sortal which applies to a phase of the things fully designated by human being. This illuminates an important aspect of the concept of a sortal. It is a necessary condition for F's being an ultimate sortal that, whenever it applies to something, it applies in a present-tensed manner to the thing through the whole of its existence.

The statue and the lump of clay are dealt with by denying that the lump and the statue are identical: the lump of clay constitutes the statue, but is not identical with it. Notice that he could have argued that the statue was just a phase of the lump, but he does not do so because statue is not, by its very meaning, a phase sortal: statue, unlike child, does not indicate by its meaning a period in the existence of something.

So Wiggins deals with objections mainly by two distinctions. One is between sortals which apply to objects through the whole of their existence, and sortals appropriate only to a phase of their existence: the other is between the ‘is’ of identity and the ‘is’ of constitution. Correspondingly, criticism centres on whether the concepts under which we pick things out behave in as regimented a way as Wiggins requires, and on whether the ‘is’ of constitution is sufficiently different from the ‘is’ of identity to perform the task he wants of it.

3.3.1 The discipline of sortal identification

There are certain kinds of counter-example that Wiggins does not discuss in print. There might, for example, be a sword-stick, which has its blade removed and the inside of the cane filled with resin, so that it ceases to be a sword but remains the same walking stick. Walking stick and sword are perfectly good concepts for picking out objects, if any artifactual terms are, and, on pain of excessive artificiality, a sword stick is both a sword and a walking stick. This kind of example does not appear to occur amongst natural objects, but, as a swordstick is a perfectly good reidentifiable object, this fact about natural objects would seem to be a contingent truth about them. Of course, it is not an accident that nature works that way, but neither is it a conceptual requirement. Wiggins's original proof was a priori, and it should allow no exceptions. Wiggins's response to this example (in personal communication) is that the sword-stick ceases to exist when it loses its ability to function as a sword and is replaced by a walking stick. But this response too is ad hoc. It embodies the principle that if anything is both an F and a G, where F and G are normally ordinary sortals, then it is really an F/G and ceases to exist if it loses either its F or its G features and is replaced by something that is either just an F or just a G/

One possible way out of this kind of case is to say that the sword is a phase of the walking stick, thereby introducing ad hoc phase sortals. By the expression ‘ad hoc phase sortal’ I mean a sortal that can be used sometimes as a phase sortal, designating an object only through part of its existence, and sometimes as an ultimate sortal, designating an object through the whole of its existence. Of course, even normal phase sortal might, contingently, in a given instance, designate an object through the whole of its existence. One might say that the phase sortal baby could designate something through the whole of its existence if, for example, a human being died at the age of six months and hence never got beyond babyhood. But it remains the case that, by dint of the meaning of the term, a baby is a phase of a human being (or, perhaps, some other animal) even when a particular creature fails to get beyond that phase. A sword is not, however, in virtue of the meaning of the word ‘sword’, a phase of anything, and to use the term to name a phase of something in a given case, when it suits, is ad hoc. Allowing sortals of this kind would put the concept of sortal under pressure, for an ultimate sortal was originally thought to be a kind of concept that necessarily characterizes an object present-tensedly throughout its existence, not a concept that sometimes does and sometimes does not. If it were possible for a given sortal, such as sword, sometimes to be an ultimate sortal and sometimes a phase sortal, it is not clear how such an expression would differ from an expression such as brown thing, which may or may not characterize something through the whole of its existence. But it is vital that the distinction between sortals, phase or ultimate, and expressions such as brown thing be clearly maintained, if the notion of sortal is to serve any formal purpose.

More importantly, that there are no ad hoc sortals is essential to the significance of the formal proof that there is no such thing as relative identity. In logic and in the application of Leibniz's Law, ‘a is F’ is normally equivalent to ‘a was, is or will be F’, otherwise the Law would not apply to such accidental properties as ‘is brown’. This is also the way phase sortals work: a human being is, was, or will be a baby. The argument against relative identity works by arguing that, if one allowed relative identity, a contradiction would follow, namely that one would get a situation in which a is G, a = b and b is not G. For this to be a contradiction, ‘is G’ must be univocal in both cases as either ‘—was, is or will be G’ or ‘—is at all times G’. For there is no inconsistency in a is, was, or will be G, a = b, and b is not at all times G. But if, whenever a contradiction is generated, one deems one of the sortals to be a phase sortal, and so to fall under the ‘is, was, or will be’ rubric, and the other to be the ultimate sortal which applies at all times, no contradiction will ever arise. All the cases of putative relative identity could be reconciled with Leibniz's Law by deeming one of the sortals to be operating as a phase sortal in this instance.

Another possible line is that a swordstick is not one object, but two objects that share some of their matter. This introduces a category of what one might call Siamese objects. It can be argued, however, that allowing this kind of entity undermines Wiggins's opposition to those, like Ayers, who think that the concept for reidentifying objects is, or often is, something more generic than sortal concepts; something akin to material body. To see how this may come about, we must consider the rationale for Ayers's theory.

The fact that sortals do not seem to follow the discipline that Wiggins wishes for them might be taken to support the view that substances can be individuated under much more generic notions, such as same body or same material thing. (Ayers 1991a). On this view, material cohesion is what picks out paradigmatic physical things. Wiggins regards these ideas as too generic to be adequate on their own. Such a concept cannot be

understood except as determinable that has dog, horse, ball, [etc] among its determinations. (1997: 417–8)

Ayers, on the other hand, thinks that Wiggins takes the notion of body too loosely, because he [Wiggins] classifies as ‘lump-mass terms’ everything from bars of soap and pats of butter to pools of water and pots of stew. (Ayers 1991b: 229–30) Wiggins, in other words, does not take seriously enough the cohesiveness of real bodies, conflating them too easily with looser masses of matter. One natural thought is that we can reidentify middle-sized physical bodies that have fairly stable properties, irrespective of whether there is any interesting sortal term under which they fall. This is not to say that they could be reidentified under the purely generic notions body or physical thing, if there were no continuity of manifest properties.

That this may be a powerful criticism of Wiggins's view can be seen by considering the notion of a Siamese object, which seemed to be necessary to answer the kind of problem posed by the swordstick. The physical mass that houses both the sword and the walking stick can be identified independently of either. If this were not the case it is difficult to see how one could even make the mistake of thinking of it as one thing. The composites Siamese entities form are quite identifiable, and yet that entity is not supposed to fall under a sortal in its own right.

The ontological status of complex bodies and ‘masses of matter’ (in Locke's phrase) is an issue very much under dispute and we shall return to it below.

3.3.2 The ‘is’ of constitution

A statue and a lump of clay occupy the same place at a given time. What is their relation to each other? The apparent options are (i) they are identical (ii) they are not identical, but the clay constitutes the statue. (i) appears to be ruled out because they have different identity conditions. (ii) has seemed to many philosophers to be the natural solution to the problem, but it, too, faces difficulties. First, it has the intuitive disadvantage that it allocates two solid physical objects to the same place. Each of them weighs, say, ten pounds, yet the total of their weight is only ten pounds. It might seem natural to think—and it was formerly a well established maxim—that there can be only one solid physical thing at one place at a given time. Someone impressed by the idea that two bodies cannot be in the same place at the same time might think it more natural to say that there are two different ways of conceptualizing the material presence at that point, than that there are two material things. That way it is easy to see why two ten pound objects need not add up to twenty pounds when put together.

Second, the language of constitution is more natural if the situation is described in some ways rather than others. It is natural to say that the statue is made of clay or even from a piece of clay. But suppose one characterizes the clay more exactly, in terms of the particular atoms in a particular arrangement. Strictly, on modal grounds, this structured collection and the statue are different. The statue could have been made of a collection of atoms with at least some different members, but the entity defined as containing just those atoms could not. This entity—atoms A1…An in given spatial arrangement S—is not a very natural kind of object, but it is a real body, in a way that something arbitrarily composed of, for example, half of this table and two toes from President Bush's left foot is not. This collection of atoms in this structure is what investigation would show to be really there. Though it is natural to say that the statue is constituted by the atoms, it is less natural to say that the atoms and the structure taken together, are what it is made from: rather it might seem natural to say that that is what it is. To use the Aristotelian terminology, there is strong pressure to say that atoms and structure together are matter and form, and hence are the complete individual.

All these issues are very controversial, and different philosophers have different intuitions. (See, for example, Rea 1997.) But, if one were to conclude that the statue and the lump are neither identical nor stand in the constitution relation, what else could one say? One strategy is to take the notion of body or material object as basic. In the next section, this possibility is compared with other options.

3.3.3 A possible reconciliation of Wiggins and Ayers.

As we saw above, for Wiggins the concept ‘body’ is always generic, never sufficient in its own right to sustain identification, needing to be filled out by appeal to a more determinate sortal, such as ‘dog’ or ‘table’. Call this ‘sortalism’.

For Ayers, on the other hand the notion of a coherent, unified body or material object is the basic notion for individuating objects and is presupposed by sortal concepts. It is only in so far as dogs and tables are unified bodies that these notions can be used to individuate objects. Call this ‘somatism’.

We saw, briefly, in section 3.3.1., why Wiggins and Ayers think as they do. Although van Inwagen's position is different from both, his reasons for thinking that the concept of a complex body is, of its own, an inadequate concept, are consistent with Wiggins's claim that the idea is too determinable to function in its own right. Van Inwagen, therefore, more directly challenges Ayers. (For a brief discussion of van Inwagen's argument, see section 3.4 below.)

How might we choose between sortalism and somatism? The dispute between them can seem difficult to pin down. Perhaps an irenic compromise is possible. Metaphysically, this compromise favours the somatist, but seems to give the sortalist everything he should want. The principle of the compromise is that Wiggins's formal argument is correct: and hence it is necessarily true that Relative Identity is not possible. But it is only a contingent truth that the terms that can substitute for F in his formal proof are generally—but not always—sortals of an Aristotelian kind. Anything can be substituted for F which picks the object out as a unified body.

Take Wiggins's formula, a =F b, where it is assumed that the F is a material object, (not God or a spirit etc). The following theses might plausibly be maintained.

  1. For any identifiable and re-identifiable object, there must be some predicate F which applies to it in a present-tense manner through the whole of its existence, and which, by its meaning, picks the object out as a unified physical whole.
  2. All natural ultimate sortals designate unified physical bodies in the manner prescribed in (1), and so are very suitable as substitutions for F. It is logically possible, however, that this might not have been so, (there might logically have been natural sortals that worked like swordstick), but that they do follow this model, and are not like swordstick, is a pretty deep fact about our world and about any world with similar laws of nature to those that hold in our world.
  3. Artifactual sortals generally designate distinct, unified bodies (as do ‘sword’ and ‘walking stick’ in the ordinary cases), though exceptions ( as in the case of the swordstick considered above) are more common and less fantastic than in the natural cases.
  4. There are acceptable substitutions for F which would not normally be classified as sortals, but using concepts such as piece, or hunk or lump of stuff. In at least some of these cases, there is no sortal available.
  5. ‘[Unified] body’ could always do the job of F, because other, more specific, terms work just because the things they designate are unified bodies. On its own, ‘same body’ is just not very explanatory.

This account has the advantage that it is compatible with the fact that most identities are bringable under sortals, but that there are other cases—such as ‘piece of…’, ‘hunk of…’—where this is not so. It also avoids the need to employ the ‘“is” of constitution’ to link sortals and particulars, like lumps and hunks, rather than just mass terms, such as ‘clay’ or ‘gold’. The case where the lump and the sortally individuated object do not coincide, applies only to some problematic artefactual cases, and in those cases the sortal name of the artefact will not be suitable substitute for F, but the ‘lump’ expression will be. In that way, it will be possible to avoid the need to have two material objects in the same place.

3.4 Contemporary hylomorphism

Since about the mid 1990s there has developed a debate covering similar territory to that disputed by Wiggins and Ayers, but having rather different roots. It claims to be a revival of a broadly Aristotelian hylomorphism, but it comes mainly from disputes in mereology.

David Lewis famously propounded the doctrine of Unrestricted Composition: that is, any combination of things in the world constitutes a further thing (e.g., 1986, 211). So my left foot and any arbitrary stone at the bottom of the sea constitutes an object, though an object of no descriptive or explanatory interest. In the opposite corner, Peter van Inwagen (1990) denied that there was any such thing as composition, at least for inanimate material objects.

Van Inwagen's main argument is that necessary and sufficient (particularly sufficient) conditions cannot be given for the kind of cohesion of parts that is supposed to bind atoms into complexes. None of the standard candidates—contact, fastening, adhesion, fusion, nor any acceptable disjunction of them—will suffice. They all have counterexamples. So the notion cannot be well defined. The arguments are subtle and interesting. The question might be raised whether van Inwagen gives sufficient consideration to the possibility of taking a line similar to that taken by Putnam on natural kinds. One fixes putative paradigm cases of non-living complexes, and says that the kind of cohesion required is whatever sort of bonding holds in those cases. It seems unlikely that there will not be a reasonably tidy, scientific account of how atoms bond. Nevertheless, van Inwagen's mereological nihilism has a stopping point, namely that he believes that he, though a composite material object, really does exist. So organisms do exist.

Van Inwagen's unwillingness (unlike the early Unger (1975)) to apply the nihilism to himself, and others like him, prompted the thought in other philosophers that there may be a way of having a doctrine of Restricted Composition on the basis of being things of the right kind —namely having a structure of the right kind— and that this idea resembled Aristotle's notion of form and his doctrine of hylomorphism. Philosophers following this line of thought included Fine (1999, 2010), Johnston (2006), Lowe (2011), Koslicki (2008), Rea (2011) and Jaworski (2011, 2012). It is difficult to provide a compact account of these philosophers' positions, as it can seem that all they have in common is a belief in some form of restricted composition and a sense that the Aristotelian label 'hylomorphism' helps to give their theories a pedigree. My strategy here will be to illustrate modern hylomorphism mainly using the examples of Jaworski and Johnston, then citing a major problem for any theory of this general kind, and illustrating this by reference to Marmodoro (2013), where good discussions of Lowe, Koslicki and Rea can be found.

If there is a single notion that plays a role in the rationale of the restriction of composition, it is probably structure. Jaworski probably deploys this notion in the most straightforward way. He and Rea both use the following illustration. If you compact a human being in a machine or waterproof bag, you retain the same matter, but lose the human being, because you have destroyed the structure. Structure is, therefore, a real and essential element in many or most complex objects. He explains his theory as follows.

Hylomorphism claims…[t]hat structure is a basic ontological and explanatory category.(2011; 169)

Structure is also a basic explanatory principle in that it explains why members of this or that kind are able to engage in the behaviors they do. It is because humans are organized as they are, for instance,that they are able to speak, to learn, to engage in the range of activities that distinguish them from other living things and from non-living ones. (2011; 172)

I think all the hylomorphists would agree with these statements, but they each have their own way of stating the theory and it is not easy to fit them together. Johnston's central account is as follows.

A statement of the genuine parts and principle of unity of an item…takes the following canonical form:

What it is for…(the item is specified here)…to be is for…(some parts are specified here) have the property or stand in the relation…(the principle of unity is specified here).

As in: What it is for this hydrochloric acid molecule to be is for this positive hydrogen ion and this negative chlorine ion to be bonded together. … The idea that each complex item will have some such canonical statement true of it might be fairly called ‘Hylomorphism’. For it is the idea that each complex item admits of a real definition, or statement of its essence, in terms of its matter, understood as parts or components, and its form, understood as a principle of unity. (2006; 658)

But Johnston's notion of a ‘principle of unity’ turns out to be so generous that his theory almost collapses into Lewis's.

Consider then all the myriad ways of constructing putative wholes from items gravitationally related to other items. Are they all genuine wholes? Given Hylomorphism, there does not seem to be any happy way to insist that they are not all wholes, even though very few of them will be material objects or stable physical systems...A whole consisting of your eyeglasses and Pluto is too far from [normal physical object] paradigms in respect of compactness and maximality to count as a genuine whole in the ordinary sense. But it is fully, completely and genuinely true that it is a whole. (2006; 697)

One might wonder whether such an apparatus preserves what one might want to save from a common-sense notion of composition.

A general worry about the hylomorphist approach might be put as follows. The modern hylomorphists do not claim to be interpreting Aristotle, but to be inspired by his concept of form. This means that it is out of place simply to argue that they have not interpreted him in a scholarly fashion. Nevertheless, it is relevant to point it out if they have totally misunderstood his deployment of the concept of form, for if this is the case,it might suggest that they are pretending to a solution to the composition problem that they do not possess.Someone who was sceptical about their claim to a solution might start by pointing out that all the moderns reject the 'traditional' Aristotelian idea that form has a role as an efficient cause, actually making a difference to the way that its matter behaves. They deny this because they all want their theories to be consistent with the closure of the world under physics. At the same time, they seem to intend their composites to have full ontological weight, and to have causal efficacy.

Jaworski is particularly clear in emphasizing that he is a causal pluralist and that the structural level is in no sense epiphenomenal or a mere logical construct out of the lower properties (see his 2011; 174). But one might query whether this is consistent with accepting the possibility of closure under physics. Such closure naturally raises the question of the causal claims made for form or structure, and, hence, for their ontological weight. The importance of explanations at the level of complex structures is not disputed, but whether these represent just ways of conceptualizing a fundamental level which we cannot normally access, is another matter. Johnston raises this question (2006; 660–62) but leaves it unresolved. Jaworski insists on causal pluralism, but admits “all forces are operating at a fundamental physical level”: This latter remark seems to concede that what one has in fact is an explanatory pluralism, with causation included in the domain of explanation, but all the brute force is confined to physics. Johnston is keen to deny that explanation is a subjective or psychological phenomenon, but admitting this does not place explanation in the world, in the sense in which the forces that actually make things happen are in the world: it only gives them the Platonic objectivity of propositions or theories.

It seems that modern hylomorphism faces the following dilemma. The following argument has appeal.

  1. The concept of structure is essential to all or most natural sciences.
  2. If something is essential to a valid mode of explanation or understanding, then it should be conceived realistically.


  1. There are real structures in the world.

But the following also has appeal.

  1. It is sufficient for the concept of structure to be applicable that elements be appropriately arranged in the world, and these arrangements can be characterized without employing the notion of structure. This could be done by specifying the spatio-temporal location of the elements and their causal influence on each other.

If (4) is correct, it looks as if, though our structural concepts are well grounded in reality, structures are not part of the basic furniture of the world. This is, in fact, the same issue as whether Kim's exclusion principle applies to the special sciences: that is, if physics gives a sufficient causal account of the location of all matter, are the other sciences merely heuristics, but strictly epiphenomenal? (See Kim (2005) and Robinson (2014)). Perhaps the status of form and structure cannot be solved in a modern context without solving the exclusion issue.

Anna Marmodoro (2013) argues that the modern hylomorphists have misunderstood Aristotle in a radical fashion, in a way that is directly connected with their concern about the unity and hence reality of composites. She claims, with strong backing from the text, that form is not structure, because it is not a combination of parts. The essence of form is its unity, and its unity depends essentially on the fact that the matter that comes to compose it loses its previous identity. By contrast, in any kind of structure of parts this identity is not lost; the parts are merely organized in a certain way.

On this interpretation, Aristotle must deny the core of (4), which is that the behaviour of complexes derives necessarily from the primitive causal powers of the elements and their spatial relations - this is a 'bottom up' atomist principle., and presupposes that the parts retain their identity within composites. But without this core idea in (4), it is difficult to see how there can be ‘closure under physics’, for if the atoms did not retain their identity, how could the nomic structure that rests on them be preserved?

There seems to be, therefore, a tension between two principles the modern hylomorphists seem to want to preserve. The tension is between the role of form as the creator of a genuine, non-conventional unity in composites, and an openness to the modern belief in the closure of the world under physics.

3.5 Substance and teleology

There is one mark of substance which was important to Aristotle which we have not discussed. This is the connection between substance and teleology; that is, the notion that what something is is intimately connected with its natural purpose, end or function. The association with teleology does not naturally recommend itself to the modern mind. Wiggins, for example, says that “it would have been both possible and advantageous for Aristotle to distance [his account of substance] from his concern with final causes…” (2001: 80). The concern with teleology is presumably thought to be too closely connected with Aristotle's theology, or the idea that it is divine design or intelligence that gives natural objects their ends. Nevertheless, it is not easy for an Aristotelian to make a complete break from teleology. Teleology is what distinguishes living things that act for purposes and have organs with functions from lumps and rocks, and it is the former that Aristotelians see as the paradigm substances. It is no accident, therefore, that artefacts, which are generally defined by their function, are often cited as good illustrations—even if not paradigm cases—of substances. So we have a tension developing. On the one hand, lumps and rocks are good paradigm cases of our notion of natural enduring objects. But they are bad cases of objects with purposes or ends. Artefacts are good cases of things with purposes, and are reasonably enduring, but are not natural objects. Living things come near to getting the best of both worlds. They are natural and enduring, and they have purposes, in the sense of natural goals in their behaviour. (Although, according to the modern perspective they do not possess a final end, unlike artefacts: a knife is for cutting, but there is nothing a dog is for, though it has many ends en passant.)

This teleological approach to substance could be expressed as follows.

  1. The substances in a given system are those entities crucial from the teleological or design perspective of that system. ‘Crucial’, here, means that other things exist either to constitute them or to provide a context of operations for them.

The tension between the teleological mark of the substantial and the others we have considered might make it useful to distinguish between descriptive ontological priority and teleological ontological priority. The former is interested in a purely descriptive account of what exists, and it, therefore, rates as the substances those entities which a purely descriptive science would count as basic. The latter, however, counts as substances those things which are deemed fundamental because of the role or function they play in the world. This contrast is most plain in the case of artefacts. An artefact is made of its parts, and, in a sense, they are more basic than it because they constitute it. But if there were not artefacts of the appropriate kind, those parts would never have come into existence: if there were no motor cars, there would be no steering wheels or accelerator pedals. Thus, like Aristotle's severed finger (Metaphysics1035b 23–5), these latter do not count as substances. But it is not true that the parts would not exist without the whole if one takes parts right down to the natural elements and atoms that make the artefact. Then one has a conflict about what is deemed basic between the descriptive and the teleological criteria. It is to avoid this conflict that Aristotle rejects atomism, by allowing that there are no true entities, only stuffs, more basic than those he wants to treat as substances by the criteria of teleological significance. He avoids having to face the problem that one set of things is basic or substantial descriptively, namely the atoms from which everything is constituted, and another set of things—the macroscopic objects of our ordinary lives—are substances by the criterion of teleological importance. Because matter is stuff, not individuals, the objects that are teleologically important are also the descriptively basic objects, because what they are made of are not objects at all.

It could be argued that atomism can be reconciled with treating the things that are significant for us as substances only if one thinks of the atoms as existing only in order to constitute such objects. This would be so if God had created the atoms so as to construct macroscopic objects from them, just as we create the parts of artefacts only for the sake of the artefacts. It might be argued that the same objective could be reached without theism if there is irreducible teleology in nature which gives significance to the rest. Thomas Nagel's view in his (2012) either adopts or comes close to this position.

4. Conclusion

All non-relativist philosophical systems acknowledge substances in the most generic sense of that term, for that is only to acknowledge that there are some fundamental entities in their system. Most, if not all, philosophers acknowledge that we cannot function without using substance concepts in the narrower sense, for the notion of an enduring particular or individual substance is essential to our making sense of the world as we live in it. But three things at least remain controversial. First, it is disputed what kinds of concepts need to be deployed to characterize these enduring things: are they the rich variety of traditional or ‘Aristotelian’ substance concepts, or will various ways of identifying things simply as physical bodies with certain characteristics do the job? Second, it is still unclear how far our substance concepts purport to reflect a component in reality (real or imagined) over and above the bundle of properties that constitute its intelligible aspects. Third, the unclarity of the connection between what a thing is and what it does leaves unresolved the degree of interdependence between substance concepts and notions of purpose and final causation.


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