First published Tue Sep 8, 2009; substantive revision Fri Sep 1, 2017

Attention is involved in the selective directedness of our mental lives. The nature of this selectivity is one of the principal points of disagreement between the extant theories of attention. Some of the most influential theories treat the selectivity of attention as resulting from limitations in the brain’s capacity to process the complex properties of multiple perceptual stimuli. Other theories take the selectivity of attention to be the result of limitations in the thinking subject’s capacity to consciously entertain multiple trains of thought. A third group of theories account for attention’s selectivity in ways that need not make any reference to limitations in capacity. These latter theories relate the selectivity of attention to the selectivity required to maintain a single coherent course of action, to the weighting of sensory information in accordance with its expected precision, or to competition between mutually inhibitory streams of processing.

The instances of attention differ along several dimensions of variation. In some of its instances attention is a perceptual phenomenon. In other instances it is a phenomenon related to action. In some instances the selectivity of attention is voluntary. In other instances it is driven, quite independently of the subject’s volition, by the high salience of attention-grabbing items in the perceptual field. The difficulty of giving a unified theory of attention that applies to attention’s voluntary and involuntary instances, and to its perceptual and enactive instances, makes attention a topic of philosophical interest in its own right.

Attention is also a topic of philosophical interest because of its apparent relations to a number of other philosophically puzzling phenomena. There are empirical and theoretical considerations suggesting that attention is closely related to consciousness, and there are controversies over whether this relationship of consciousness to attention is one of necessity, or sufficiency (or both or neither). There are also controversies – thought to be important to the viability of representationism about consciousness – over the ways in which the phenomenal character of a conscious experience can be modulated by attention. Different considerations link attention to demonstrative reference, to the development of an understanding of other minds, and to the exercise of the will. Some work in the tradition of virtue ethics takes attention to be morally important, since there are at least some virtues that require one to attend appropriately.

The controversies concerning attention’s relation to these other phenomena often include debates about the philosophical significance of theories that have been developed through the empirical study of attention at the neuropsychological level, and at the cognitive level.

1. Historical Overview

1.1 Descartes: Attention and Epistemology

In the early modern period a variety of explanatory roles were assigned to attention by a number of different writers. Descartes’ Meditations provides one prominent example. The result of Descartes’ First Meditation—that everything can be doubted—is in apparent tension with the Third Meditation’s claim that clear and distinct ideas are beyond doubt. Descartes introduces a claim about attention to resolve the apparent conflict. He claims, in reply to the seventh set of objections, that it is only when we pay attention to them that clear and distinct ideas provide a place where doubt does not take hold:

So long as we attend to a truth which we perceive very clearly, we cannot doubt it. But when, as often happens, we are not attending to any truth in this way, then even though we remember that we have previously perceived many things clearly, nevertheless there will be nothing which we may not justly doubt so long as we do not know that whatever we clearly perceive is true. (‘Replies to Objections’, 309)

This passage is usually cited for the point that it makes about memory, but the picture that Descartes is here outlining is also one in which attention has an important epistemic role to play: clarity and distinctness realize their epistemic potential only when attention is paid to the ideas that have them. Those ideas can be doubted, as, in accordance with the policy of the First Meditation they must be, but that doubt cannot be maintained by a properly attentive thinker. The crucial first move in Descartes’ epistemology—the move from radical doubt to certainty about the truth of particular clear and distinct ideas—is, therefore, a transition that is mediated by attention.

1.2 Berkeley: Attention and Abstraction

A quite different explanatory role is assigned to attention in Bishop Berkeley’s Principles of Human Knowledge, although here again we find that it is in order to remove an epistemological glitch that the notion of attention is brought in. In the Introduction to Principles of Human Knowledge Berkeley rejects Locke’s claim that there exist such things as Abstract Ideas. But Berkeley retains Locke’s commitment to the core empiricist claim that the thinking of thoughts is always a matter of handling ideas received from experience. This would seem to lead to the conclusion that it is not possible to think about abstractia, but Berkeley realizes that that conclusion is unacceptable. It is, as he says, perfectly possible to think about the properties of triangles in general.

In the second edition of the Principles Berkeley added a couple of sentences to the Introduction that make it clear that it is attention and, in particular, the withholding of attention, that is supposed to explain the possibility of thinking about abstractia without the need to postulate Abstract Ideas. These added sentences tell us that:

[It] must be acknowledged that a man may consider a figure merely as triangular, without attending to the particular qualities of the angles or relations of the sides. So far he may abstract, but this will never prove that he can frame an abstract general, inconsistent idea of a triangle. (1710, Introduction to 2nd edn. §16. emphasis added)

In these sentences Berkeley is not attempting to elaborate a theory of attention. He says nothing more about the idea that attention might enable thought about abstractia. It is nonetheless clear that he requires attention to play an important role in his picture of the mind.

Berkeley’s idea that attention and abstraction are linked was taken up in the second half of the nineteenth century by William Hamilton. Hamilton did not, however, think that the link between attention and abstraction provided the starting point for an explanation of attention, nor of abstraction. That is because he took it that the relationship between the two phenomena was too intimate to be explanatory. He writes that:

Attention and Abstraction are only the same process viewed in different relations. They are, as it were, the positive and negative poles of the same act. (1876, 88)

1.3 Locke: Attention as a Mode of Thought

Descartes and Berkeley treat attention very briefly, but each assigns attention to a particular explanatory role. Locke’s treatment of attention is also brief, but he has his own theory of the explanatory role that attention plays, and he goes further than either Descartes or Berkeley in giving us a positive account of what attention is. The account is given as part of the catalogue of ‘Modes of Thinking’ that Locke sets out towards the beginning of Chapter Nineteen of Book Two of the Essay Concerning Human Understanding:

[W]hen ideas float in our mind without any reflection or regard of the understanding, it is that which the French call reverie; our language has scarce a name for it: when the ideas that offer themselves (for, as I have observed in another place, whilst we are awake, there will always be a train of ideas succeeding one another in our minds) are taken notice of, and, as it were, registered in the memory, it is attention: when the mind with great earnestness, and of choice, fixes its view on any idea, considers it on all sides, and will not be called off by the ordinary solicitation of other ideas, it is that we call “intention,” or “study.” (1689, II, 19 §1 emphasis added)

In addition to providing these quick theories of ‘reverie’, ‘attention’ and ‘intention or study’, the very same sentence of Locke’s Essay provides theories of ‘remembrance’, ‘recollection’, ‘contemplation’, ‘sleep’, ‘dreaming’ and ‘ecstasy’. It is significant that Locke’s account of attention is given so briefly, and that it goes by as part of a crowd of theories of these various other mental phenomena. Locke is not here engaging in an uncharacteristically slapdash piece of rapid-fire theorizing. His intention in going through this catalogue is to establish that these are topics for which no new substantive theory is needed. These are, in Locke’s theory, simply ‘modes of thinking’: ‘reverie’, ‘study’ etc. are not names for independent phenomena, existing in their own right. Instead they are the various names that thinking is given when it takes place in various ways.

One consequence of Locke’s treatment of attention as a mode of thinking is that, once we have a theory of thinking before us, we need no further theory to account for how attention, contemplation, study, etc. are possible. (Just as, to use the classic example of ‘modes’, we need no substantive independent theory, once we have a theory of walking, to explain how limping, pacing or ambling are possible.) We need to say something in giving an analysis of the nature of modes, but—once the thing-to-be-modified has been accounted for—the thing that we say can be something brief, along the lines indicated by Locke. We do not need to give a theory that postulates any substances or processes specific to the explanation of attention.

Locke’s modal view of attention has the consequence that no very substantive theory of attention is needed once our theory of thinking is in place. It also entails, and for the same reason, that attention cannot figure in the explanation of how thinking itself is possible (for any explanation in which it did figure would be analogous to an explanation of walking that takes strolling to already be possible; it would get its explanatory priorities backwards).

1.4 The Eighteenth and Nineteenth Centuries: Attention in Perception, in Action and in Reflective Thought

Locke viewed attention as an explanatorily slight phenomenon—a mode of thought that is not in need of much explanation, nor capable of providing much. Theories of attention moved away from that view over the course of the eighteenth century. Attention was increasingly treated as a phenomenon with explanatory work to do, and so as a phenomenon for which a substantive independent theory needed to be given. The attempt to provide such a theory got properly underway in 1738, when Christian Wolff’s textbook on psychology was the first to devote a whole chapter to the topic of attention (see Hatfield, 1995, for an excellent discussion).

During this period the explanatory remit for theories of attention broadened in two directions. The first move was away from the idea that attention acts on already-received ideas and towards the idea that attention is involved in the initial reception of those ideas. Locke had characterized attention as the registration of already-received ideas into memory. But by 1769, when Henry Home Kames added the appendix of ‘Terms Defined or Explained’ to his Elements of Criticism, attention’s role as a regulator of cognitive input was regarded as definitive of it:

Attention is that state of mind which prepares one to receive impressions. According to the degree of attention objects make a strong or weak impression. Attention is requisite even to the simple act of seeing. (1769, 18)

As well as beginning to assign to attention a role in the explanation of the reception of ideas, eighteenth century theories also moved towards including a role for attention in the production of behaviour. This is particularly clear in Dugald Stewart’s 1792 Elements of the Philosophy of the Human Mind. Stewart retains Locke’s view that attention has an essential role to play in determining which things get stored in memory. He adds to that view the claim that attention has a role in determining which particular memories get recalled, writing that “Some attention [is] necessary for any act of memory whatever.” (1792, 53). Stewart also claims that attention has a role in the explanation of the development and deployment of at least some skilled behaviours. The example that Stewart gives here is that of ‘the dexterity of jugglers’ which, he says, “merits a greater degree of attention from philosophers than it has yet attracted” (62).

In the century between Locke’s Essay and Stewart’s Elements, then, attention ceases to be seen merely as a certain mode of idea-handling, and comes to be seen as a phenomenon in need of its own explanation, and with a role to play in the explanation of perception, in the explanation of memory (both in its storage and in its recall), and in the explanation of skilled action.

In the century after Stewart’s Elements the diversity among the phenomena that attention was expected to explain continued to grow, and it continued to include phenomena from across the psychological spectrum from perception, to thought, to action. By the end of the nineteenth century, in what was a crucial period in the development of scientific psychology, there were some psychologists, such as E.B. Titchener, who took the role of attention in perception and in ‘sensory clearness’ to be its most essential feature (see Titchener, 1908, 1910); others, such as Alexander Bain, who thought that the essential feature of attention was its role in action, (Bain, 1888); and a third group, of whom G.F. Stout was the most prominent example, who argued that the primary job for a theory of attention was to explain attention’s role in reflective thought (see Stout, 1891).

As a result of this diversity in their conceptions of attention’s explanatory remit (and as a result of the lack of an established methodology for empirical psychology) the debates between exponents of these various psychological theories of attention got themselves into what was acknowledged to be a ‘chaotic state’ (Pillsbury, 1906).

1.5 William James and His Contemporaries: Deflationary Theories

The diversity of explanatory roles assigned to attention in the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries meant that theorizing about attention at the end of the nineteenth century was in a chaotic state. The ambition for theorists of attention writing at the end of the nineteenth and the beginning of the twentieth centuries was to get this chaos into order. The theories of attention proposed in this period therefore tended to take the form of attempts to reveal attention as something less mysterious and less complex than earlier writers had supposed. This ambition to give a ‘nothing but…’ reduction of attention can be seen in the most influential work from this period: William James’ The Principles of Psychology (1890).

One aspect of James’ approach is to play down the more complex perceptual aspects of attention. His chapter on attention includes a discussion of experiments into what we now call ‘subitizing’—that is, into the ability to perceive the cardinality of small stimulus sets without needing to count their members—but James writes of these experiments that it “is obvious that such observations decide nothing at all about our attention, properly so called” (407).

Although James plays down attention’s role in complex perceptual phenomena, he does assign attention to an important explanatory role in the production of behaviour. He claims, for example, that ‘Volition is nothing but attention’ (424). But when James makes such claims it is as part of a general project that seeks always to be deflationary where possible. When James associates attention with volition it is as a way of suggesting how volition could be given a deflationary treatment, not as a way of inflating attention’s explanatory role.

This deflationary approach to attention’s explanatory remit means that, when it comes to giving an account of the ‘intimate nature of the attention process’, James can identify two fairly simple processes which, he claims, ‘probably coexist in all our concrete attentive acts’. and which ‘possibly form in combination a complete reply’ to the question of attention’s ‘intimate nature’ (1890, 411). The processes that James identifies are:

  1. The accommodation or adjustment of the sensory organs, and
  2. The anticipatory preparation from within of the ideational centres concerned with the object to which attention is paid. (411)

The first of these processes is reasonably familiar. By ‘the accommodation or adjustment of the sensory organs’ James means such processes as pointing one’s ears in the right direction, bringing one’s eyes into focus, taking a sniff, and so on.

James’s talk of ‘anticipatory preparation’ of ‘ideation centres’ is a little less clear, but the point is again a quite straightforward one. What James has in mind here is simply imagination. His claim is that when attention does not involve adjusting one’s sense organs it consists in imagining the things or actions that one is attending to, or looking for.

James illustrates his claim about attention’s link to imagination with an example from Hermann von Helmholtz. The example is an important one for James, and it illustrates some important features of attention that subsequent theorists have tended to neglect. The example involves the variety of attention that needs to be paid when trying to discern the overtones in a note played on the piano. Helmholtz asks us to sit at the piano and to play a G, then, imagining the sound that we have just heard, to play a low C. Doing this, it is claimed, enables one to hear that G is discernibly there (as the third overtone) within the sound produced when C is played. Helmholtz’s claim, which James endorses, is that the kind of attention that is paid when listening for an overtone is constituted by the imagining of what that overtone would sound like. James goes onto claim that there is a wide range of cases in which paying attention to what one is doing consists in this same sort of preparatory imaginative engagement.

Here, as in his more frequently discussed treatment of emotion, it is distinctive of James’s approach that he tries to account for a large-scale personal-level psychological phenomenon in a realist but somewhat revisionary way, so as to be able to give his account using relatively simple and unmysterious explanatory resources. An alternative deflationary approach—one which James explicitly contrasted with his own—is the approach taken in 1886 by F.H. Bradley.

Bradley advocated a view according to which attention is not the sort of phenomenon for which an independent and substantive theory can or needs to be given. Bradley does not develop this point in much detail, and it is a point on which he would later change his mind, but in his 1886 article, ‘Is there a special activity of attention?’, Bradley was concerned with arguing that a project such as James’s one of identifying particular processes as the attention-constituting ones was wrongheaded. He claims that no particular attention-processes can be identified since:

Any function whatever of the body or the mind will be active attention if it is prompted by an interest and brings about the result of our engrossment with its product. There is no primary act of attention, there is no specific act of attention, there is no one kind of act of attention at all. (1886, 316)

Although Bradley does not use the Lockean vocabulary, (and although James himself does not seem to have taken Bradley in this way) Bradley’s position here has much in common with Locke’s claim that attention is a mode. Bradley’s position, like Locke’s, is that what is essential to an instance of attention is not the matter of which processes are taking place, but the facts about how the things that happen happen. He therefore takes the ennumeration of processes to be the wrong form for a theory of attention to take.

Other writers who were contemporary with Bradley and James took different approaches to the project of giving a deflationary explanation of attention. In Theodule Ribot’s 1888 book La Psychologie De L’Attention the attempt to explain attention took an approach that we would now classify as behaviourist. In 1888 behaviourism had not yet been established as a general approach in philosophical or psychological theories of the mind, but Ribot’s suggestion that attention’s behavioural manifestations are essential to it is nonetheless recognizable as an early articulation of behaviourism in a strong form:

Are the movements of the face, the body, and the limbs and the respiratory modifications that accompany attention, simple effects, outward marks, as is usually supposed? Or are they, on the contrary, the necessary conditions, the constituent elements, the indispensable factors of attention? Without hesitation we accept the second thesis. (1888, 19)

A somewhat more moderate version of this behaviour-centred approach was taken by Alexander Bain, who identified attention, not with its behavioural manifestations themselves, but with truncated versions of the motor-control processes that typically bring about those behavioural manifestations: processes ‘stopping short of the actual movement performed by the organ’ (Bain, 1888, 371). Much as Ribot’s view can be seen as an early version of behaviourism, Bain’s view can be seen as an early version of the motor-based approaches to attention that can be found in the literature of the present century (see Section 2.8 below).

1.6 The Twentieth Century: Locating Attention at a Bottleneck in Information Processing

The variety among the deflationary explanatory approaches that characterized the theories of attention offered in the nineteenth century gave way in the early twentieth century to a period in which one such explanatory tactic was dominant: the tactic of behaviourism. Behaviourists tended to neglect attention, but they did not ignore it entirely. John Dashiell’s 1928 Fundamentals of Objective Psychology, for example, is a behaviourist work that attempts to account for attention “as a form of posturing” (Ch. 10, §3). The project of identifying a behaviour with which to explain attention was, nonetheless, an understandably unpopular one. As Gilbert Ryle notes, it is not only attention, but also ‘heed concepts’ more generally, that resist simple behaviourist analysis:

[W]hen a man is described as driving carefully, whistling with concentration or eating absent-mindedly the special character of his activity seem to elude the observer, the camera and the Dictaphone. Perhaps knitted brows, taciturnity and fixed gaze may be evidence of intentness; but these can be simulated, or they can be purely habitual. (1949, 133)

In the middle of the twentieth century behaviourism’s dominance waned, cognitive psychology established itself, and a new theoretical approach to the explanation of attention was developed. These three developments were intimately related to one another. Instrumental to all three was the publication in 1958 of Donald Broadbent’s Perception and Communication.

The year prior to Perception and Communication’s publication had seen B.F. Skinner’s attempt, in Verbal Behaviour (1957), to apply a behaviourist explanatory approach to distinctively human aspects of cognition. Skinner’s project in that book failed, and Noam Chomsky’s famous 1959 review of the book made its failure conspicuous. Chomsky’s own work in Syntactic Structures (1957) went some way towards establishing the new cognitive paradigm for psychology by showing how internal processing could be theorized by describing transformations on representations in abstraction from the question of how those representations were realized. Donald Broadbent’s distinctive contribution to the overthrow of behaviourism was to show how the move from behavioural data to the postulation of a particular cognitive architecture could be disciplined by the then-new strategy of importing into psychology the intellectual resources used in thinking about information technology. The year in which Broadbent’s book was published was an important year for the development of such technologies, being the year in which (inter alia) the integrated circuit chip was invented (see Mole, 2012). It was also the year in which Subscriber Trunk Dialling was introduced to UK telephone exchanges. The technology of the telephone exchange was what most naturally suggested itself as a metaphor for attention at the time when Broadbent was writing.

Towards the end of Perception and Communication Broadbent explicitly sets out the claim that the theoretical resources developed in thinking about the transmission of information through telephone exchanges provide the basis for an alternative to behaviourism. He also attacks the positivistic methodological principles that had given many behaviourists their motivation. But the central lesson from Broadbent’s work, so far as the theory of attention goes, is a lesson that he takes to be independent of this attack on behaviourism and its positivistic foundations. At an early stage in Perception and Communication Broadbent remarks that:

Perhaps the point of permanent value which will remain in psychology if the fashion for communication theory wanes, will be the emphasis on problems of capacity. […] The fact that any given channel has a limit is a matter of central importance to communication engineers, and it is correspondingly forced on the attention of psychologists who use their terms. (1958, 5)

This introduction of the notion of capacity limitations into discussions of perception and attention was, as Broadbent here predicted, hugely and permanently influential.

Broadbent claimed not only that the human brain is subject to capacity limitations of the sort that communications engineers had learnt to theorize, he claimed also that these limitations are clustered so that there is a single bottleneck in capacity that is especially critical to the brain’s handling of perceptual information. This bottleneck was said to occur at the junction of two systems operating in series; the first system having a large capacity for information processing, and operating automatically on all of the stimuli with which the subject is presented; the second having a much smaller capacity, and so needing to be deployed selectively.

Those who followed Broadbent took it that the bottleneck that results from the connection of these two systems corresponds to attention in the sense that, when a representation of a stimulus passes through that bottleneck, the stimulus ipso facto counts as one to which attention is paid.

Broadbent himself was cautious about presenting his claims about capacity-bottlenecks as a theory of attention. The word ‘attention’ occurs rarely in Perception and Communication. Broadbent’s later book, Decision and Stress (1971), does describe his earlier experiments as ‘studies of attention’, but here too Broadbent prefers to talk about the phenomenon observed in the lab as ‘selective perception’ (chapter V) or ‘vigilance’ (chapters II and III). In an article from 1982, entitled, ‘Task Combination and Selective Intake of Information’, he admits that: “The topic of this paper is one that is often termed ‘attention’, and it may seem unduly artificial to have given it a more cumbrous title.” But he goes on to reassert his qualms:

‘Attention’ is a word in ordinary language, that can reasonably be used as a label for experiments in a particular area. Yet it has also been used as a theoretical concept, a mysterious asset or energy which is sometimes attached to human functions and sometimes not. This use of attention […] is not very helpful, and avoiding the word in the title is a step towards clarity. (1982, 253)

When Broadbent does use the word ‘attention’ it is mostly in discussions of attention shifting. His view, at least in his early work, seems to have been that where there is a bottleneck in our information processing capacity there need to be additional mechanisms that control how our limited capacity resources will be deployed. These additional mechanisms of bottleneck-control seem to have been what Broadbent thought of as the attention mechanisms. He never took himself to have given a theory of them, only to have given a theory of where they would be needed. Nor were these mechanisms the topic that was at issue in the debates about attention that Broadbent prompted. Those debates were concerned with questions about the nature and location of the bottleneck itself, not about the factors that determine what, on any particular occasion, gets to pass through it.

In the decades following Broadbent a great many psychologists devoted themselves to the task of locating the attentional bottleneck that he had postulated. Almost all psychologists writing at this time were guided to some degree by Broadbent’s two-serial-systems-and-a-bottleneck picture of perceptual processing. The question of whether a given task is attention demanding was therefore understood to depend on the question of whether the performance of that task requires the engagement of the small-capacity system that comes after the bottleneck of attention, and so research into the attention-related demands of particular tasks became another way by which to approach the issue of where the attentional bottleneck is located. Broadbent’s two-systems-and-a-bottleneck model was frequently questioned, but for most research into attention in the second half of the twentieth century it was very much the orthodox view. This has now changed. In psychology’s current paradigm, only a few aspects of Broadbent’s picture remain orthodox.

2. Theories of Attention

2.1 Capacity-Limitation Theories

Psychologists attempting to produce a theory of attention in the nineteen sixties and seventies were highly influenced by Donald Broadbent’s picture of attention as corresponding to a bottleneck in information processing capacity resulting from the connection of two seperate perceptual processing systems. The first piece of business for these psychologists was to locate this attentional bottleneck by determining which sorts of processing are done by the large capacity, pre-bottleneck system, and which by the small capacity, post-bottleneck system. Debates between these psychologists gave rise to various theories in which the selectivity of attention was characterized with a claim about the location of this bottleneck.

2.1.1 Early Selection Theory

Broadbent’s own account of the distribution of processing between the pre-attentional system and the post-attentional system defines the ‘early selection’ theory of attention. He claimed that only very simple properties are detected by the large capacity system, and that any semantic properties, or properties relating to the particular identity of a stimulus, are detected only after representations of the stimulus have passed through the attentional-bottleneck and into the smaller capacity system.

The personal-level consequences of this early selection theory are that we can recognize what things are and what they mean only if we are paying attention to them, but can detect the simple physical properties of things even when paying no attention to them. The theory can be thought of as a communication-theoretic rendering of two intuitive ideas. The first is that one has no immediate control over one’s awareness of simple features of one’s environment, such as the fact that there are people talking in the next room. Whatever one is paying attention to, one will continue to hear some chatter to be going on, if any is. The second idea is that the details of things—such as the semantic content of that chatter—can be detected only for the one or two things to which one is paying attention: If one wants to know what the chatter is about, one has to listen.

The early selection theory also entails, more problematically, that the semantic properties of an unattended item must remain unrepresented in the nervous system, and so it entails that those properties can have no psychological effects. According to this view the semantic features of unattended items cannot explain why those items attract attention to themselves, on the occasions when they do. It was to this aspect of the theory that its opponents most frequently objected.

2.1.2 Late Selection Theory

The chief rivals of Broadbent’s early selection theory were the ‘late selectionists’, who claimed that all (or almost all) perceivable properties are detected automatically, by a large capacity system that operates on all of the stimuli with which the subject is presented. According to this late selection theory of attention the consequences of passing through the bottleneck of attention into the post-attentive small capacity system are only (1) that the subject comes to be conscious of the contents that the large capacity system has already succeeded in encoding and (2) that those contents come to be stored in working memory (Deutsch and Deutsch, 1963).

Although it was originally proposed against the background of Broadbent’s now superseded theoretical framework, it would be too quick to dismiss the late selection theory as an obsolete one. The theory has much in common with some plausible and empirically well-supported views found in the current literature. Jesse Prinz, for example, shares the late selectionists’ view that attention’s primary role is not in managing limited perceptual processing resources, but in projecting already-processed representations to working memory. Prinz’s view, varying a theme from the work of Stanislas Dehaene, is that this projection to working memory is what makes it the case that the content represented comes to conscious awareness. (Prinz, 2005, 2012, Dehaene et al., 2006).

It should be noted that Prinz’s main philosophical business is with the explanation of consciousness. Objections have been raised as to whether the process of projection to working memory—which Prinz refers to as ‘attention’—can adequately account for the various things that attention does (Wu, 2014, §6.3.2). If it cannot then Prinz is willing to allow that this process is not the sole referent of the English word ‘attention’, writing that ‘other researchers may choose to define attention differently’, and that ‘those who disagree with my analysis of attention could simply drop the term “attention”’ (Prinz, 2012, p. 95).

The central component of the late-selection theory, as it was originally understood, was that the effect of withdrawing attention from a stimulus is to make it the case that the stimulus is processed without the subject’s awareness, rather than not being processed at all. This component of the view has, to some extent, been vindicated. The claim that unattended stimuli are subjected to some processing of which the subject lacks awareness, including some processing of those stimuli’s semantic properties, is now uncontroversial. Since we know that the semantic properties of unattended stimuli can, for example, produce negative priming effects (Tipper and Driver, 1988), we know that unattended stimuli are processed in a way that allows at least some of their semantic properties to be encoded. The semantic properties of unattended items have such effects despite the fact that subjects are typically unaware of what those properties are.

The traditional late selection theory is right in taking it that inattention can lead to properties being encoded without our awareness, rather than not being encoded at all, but that theory is also committed to the claim that attention’s only effects are in determining what gets remembered and experienced, and so that the direction of attention has no effects on the initial perceptual processing to which stimuli are subjected. These claims we now know to be false. An important experiment by O’Connor et al. used fMRI to compare neural activity in subjects who, in various task conditions, were presented with high and low contrast checkerboard patterns in one or other half of the visual field (O’Connor et al. 2002). In some conditions the subjects had to perform a task involving these checkerboard patterns. In other conditions the patterns were irrelevant to the task that the subjects were performing (and in a third condition no pattern was presented, but the subjects were attending to the screen in anticipation of a pattern that was about to be presented). The results of these comparisons revealed that even in the first parts of neural circuitry through which information from the retina passes, on its way to the visual cortex—the Lateral Geniculate Nuclei—there is a difference in the baserate of neural activity, and a difference in the response that stimuli elicit, depending on what the subject is attending to. These findings indicate that attention’s effects are not limited to cortical loci that are upstream from a late process of attentional selection. They therefore refute any version of the late-selection theory according to which the selectivity of attention is entirely a ‘late process’, occurring after initial perceptual encoding is complete.

The findings of O’Connor et al. create fewer problems for some recent theories in which elements of the late selection view are retained. Nilli Lavie and her collaborators have proposed one such theory, which attempts to combine some aspects of the late selection theory with some aspects of its early selectionist rival. According to Lavie’s ‘load theory’, attention does correspond to a capacity bottleneck—much as Broadbent thought—but the differing demands of the task that is at hand lead to differences as to when that bottleneck restricts the processing of a stimulus: in conditions of where the processing demands of perception are high the bottleneck will operate at an early stage, with the result that unattended stimuli will be processed rather little; in conditions where the processing load of perception is lower it will operate at a later stage, with the result that unattended stimuli will be processed rather more (Lavie & Tsal, 1994, Lavie et al. 2004). This load theory predicts that peripheral stimuli will elicit less neural activation, and will be less distracting, when the subject’s task is a perceptually demanding one. The theory’s predictions have been borne out by behavioural and neurological observations (Lavie, 2005). Its theoretical apparatus has provided a useful framework for the philosophical treatment of attention’s relationship to consciousness (Hine, 2010). It is perhaps for reasons of fashion that few psychologists have been persuaded to follow Lavie’s rehabilitation of the Broadbentian framework’s basic terms.

Other recently proposed theories also retain the idea that attentional selectivity is the result of capacity limitations, but do so while retreating further than Lavie does from the picture of attention that Broadbent introduced. These theories reject the terms of the debate between early and late selectionists because they reject the idea that the capacity limitations responsible for attention are clustered into a single bottleneck. In some cases this is because the selectivity of attention is taken to be the result of multiple bottlenecks in processing capacity (see, e.g., Johnston and McCann, 2006). In other cases it is because the current theorists see capacity limitations as occurring throughout the processing stream, and not as clustered into bottlenecks at all (see Driver, 2001, for a suggestion along these lines, and Allport, Antonis & Reynolds, 1972, for an earlier indication of it).

2.1.3 Other Capacity-Limitation Theories

The early and late selection theories dominated discussions of attention in the decades following Broadbent’s seminal work, but by the beginning of the nineteen nineties it had become clear that the debate between advocates of the early selection theory and advocates of the late selection theory had become fruitless. Those debates were therefore taken to have been predicated on some sort of mistaken assumption. Several diagnoses have been proposed as to what that mistaken assumption might have been. Little consensus has been reached as to which of these diagnoses is correct, with the result that some theorists—such as those discussed at the end of the preceding section—retain ideas from the early and late selection theories, while others regard this as a wrong-headedly retrograde step.

One diagnosis is that the early/late debate was fruitless because the terms ‘early’ and ‘late’ are themselves problematic. If perceptual processing occurs in a parallel processing architecture without any prevailing direction of information flow then there is no sense in labeling one part of that architecture as earlier or later than any other. If the attentional bottleneck is located in a system that has such an architecture then it may be this that explains why there was no satisfactory answer to the question of whether attentional selection is early or late. It was with this thought in mind that several writers suggested that the failure of the debate between early and late selection theories was owing to the fact that that debate requires us to make an assumption about the linearity of the processing stream in which selection occurs (see, e.g., Prinz and Hommel, 2002, 3). This is a thought that needs to be treated with care.

The claim that it was a problematic assumption about linearity that led the early/late selection debate into fruitlessness received its most influential treatment in an important paper by Alan Allport (Allport, 1992). Allport identifies several problematic assumptions that the early/late selection debate requires. His characterization of what he takes to be the problematic assumption about linearity is as the claim that:

[T]he processing of nonsemantic attributes (i.e. the processing of attributes other than symbolic or categorical identity) occurs earlier in a logical/causal sequence of operations than does any semantic or categorical processing. (1992, 187)

This assumption about linearity does not seem, on the face of it, to be a problematic one. There is nothing to be objected to in the claim that the situations in which we encounter a written word and come to be in a position to know what that word means are situations in which our sensory transducers respond firstly to simple nonsemantic properties of the word. In order for creatures like us to detect the semantic properties of written words, it is necessary for our information processing systems to first encode some information about the simple spatial properties of the lines on the page. This information does then get passed on to subsequent processing stages in which more complex properties, concerned with semantics and stimulus identity, get processed. If this sort of linearity is what Allport was taking issue with then it seems he must have been mistaken, since there is nothing problematic about the idea that there is this much linearity in the processing that any given stimulus is subjected to.

Nor is there anything unscientific about that idea. It continues to be entirely normal for neuroscientists to refer to the processing that takes place in occipital brain areas as ‘early’ and the processing in frontal areas as ‘late’. In a much-cited review of neuroimaging work on attention Sabine Kastner and Leslie Ungerleider, for example, speak of:

… an increase in the complexity of processing as activity proceeds anteriorly through the ventral stream into the temporal lobe. Whereas posterior regions in cortex are preferentially activated during the processing of object attributes, such as colors or scrambled objects and faces, more anterior regions are activated selectively during the processing of intact objects and faces. (2000, 319)

The orthodox view expressed by Kastner and Ungerleider is subject to differing interpretations. Those who think that perception and cognition are best thought of as arising from a hierarchical Bayesian process might reject the idea that information progresses through the nervous system in a bottom-up fashion, with the detection of simple properties happening at an early stage, and the detection of more complex properties happening at a later one. Current advocates of such hierarchical Bayesian theories place great emphasis on the idea that the prior hypotheses required by a Bayesian inference can be generated in a top-down fashion, and can then be tested against incoming signals which contain information only about the ways in which the predictions generated by these hypotheses are in error (Hohwy, 2013). Such theories break from the tradition of thinking about the information flow in the brain as being largely one-way, but they retain the idea that information is organized into a structure with earlier and later stages, with these stages now being understood as corresponding to the more or less abstract layers in an hierarchically organized Bayesian inference. They therefore retain the idea that there are earlier and later stages in the processing of any given stimulus, while rejecting the idea that there is one predominant direction of information flow in the brain. Since this much linearity remains in our current thinking about the architecture of perceptual processing, we cannot coherently blame an assumption about this much linearity for the troubles that led to the fruitlessness of the debate between early and late selectionists.

That is not to say that the early/late selection debate was entirely free of problematic assumptions relating to linearity—only that psychology has not yet settled upon a satisfactory account of the way in which assumptions about linearity led the early/late debate into trouble.

One reason why assumptions about linearity may have been problematic is that when, following Broadbent, we think about hierarchical perceptual processing while bearing in mind the communications engineer’s concerns about capacity limitations, it then becomes natural to make additional assumptions about the way in which this hierarchically organized architecture supports personal-level cognition. The early/late debate’s problems are more plausibly blamed on these additional assumptions, rather than on any assumptions about hierarchical organization per se. Given that some physical properties of a thing must first be represented in order for the semantic properties of that thing to be detected by the subject, it is natural for the communications engineer to suppose that no further representation of these physical properties needs to be generated in order for the subject to become aware of them, so that a subject who is experiencing the semantic properties of a stimulus must have been through a process that already gives him an experience of that stimulus’s simple spatial properties. This additional supposition would be a mistake. In fact, the brain represents the physical properties of stimuli in multiple, parallel, somewhat overlapping systems, only some of which put the subject in a position to think about the properties that they represent. In order to get to a representation of the meaning of the word on a page, the subject’s brain must represent that word’s physical properties, but it turns out that the brain’s representation of these physical properties need not put the subject in a position to form thoughts about them. The subject’s access to those properties might require that they be represented all over again, in some parallel system. From the point of view introduced by Broadbent – that of a communications engineer who is concerned with the management of limited capacity channels – this seems strangely profligate. It is this—not an assumption about linearity per se, but an assumption about the linearity of the processes that support personal level thinking—that created problems for the early/late debate.

Once the problematic assumption about linearity has been made precise, however, we see that it cannot be satisfactory to credit the entire collapse of the early/late debate to this assumption. The falsity of the assumption about the linearity of the processes supporting personal-level awareness does not undermine the very idea that the early/late debate is a meaningful one. The problems it creates are largely methodological. The falsity of that assumption means that one cannot make an inference from a lack of personal-level awareness of some content to the absence of representations encoding that content. It also means that Broadbent was wrong to suppose that the psychological effects of unattended stimuli can only depend on those properties of which the inattentive subject can be aware. But these are methodological problems. They do not, by themselves, imply that the debate between the early selection theory and the late selection theory must have been misconceived. The situation that we find ourselves in is, then, a somewhat unhappy one. Everybody agrees that there was something misconceived about the debate between the two theories of attention that dominated the decades following Broadbent’s reintroduction of attention to the psychological agenda. The ongoing influence of Broadbent’s selection theory, and of the early/late debate, is often noted and sometimes lamented (Driver, 2001, 56). But nobody is clear about whether the elements of those theories that are retained in current theorizing are problematic ones.

2.2 Feature Integration Theory

In the early nineteen eighties, Anne Treisman and her collaborators identified the existence of ‘the binding problem’, and described a process that could solve that problem. Treisman proposed that attention be identified with this process. This proposal is known as the Feature Integration Theory of attention. The theory has been hugely influential, not only as a theory of attention, but also as the framework that introduced and regimented research into the independently interesting question of the binding problem (for more on which, see ‘The Unity of Consciousness’ esp. §2.2).

Treisman describes the way in which the binding problem arises like this:

Sensory information arrives in parallel as a variety of heterogeneous hints, (shapes, colors, motions, smells and sounds) encoded in partly modular systems. Typically many objects are present at once. The result is an urgent case of what has been labelled the binding problem. We must collect the hints, bind them into the right spatial and temporal bundles, and then interpret them to specify their real world origins. (2003, 97)

We can illustrate this problem with an example. Suppose we have a subject who is presented with a red tomato and a green apple, both at the same time. This visual input is, as Treisman says, initially broken up for specialized distributed processing—so, for example, one part of the brain is responsible for detecting the shapes of things, a different part is responsible for detecting their colours. The shape-detecting centres represent the fact that a tomato-shaped thing is present, and they represent the fact that an apple-shaped thing is present. The colour-detecting centres represent the fact that a red thing is present, and the fact that a green thing is present. But the subject, if he is a normal human, knows more than is implied by these four facts: He knows that the red thing is the tomato-shaped thing and the green thing the apple-shaped thing. To know this he must have a way of ‘binding’ the representation of red in the colour centre with the representation of the tomato shape in the shape centre. The binding problem is the problem of knowing how to put together the properties that are detected in seperate specialized detection centres.

Treisman’s proposed solution exploits the fact that spatial representations are ubiquitous, and the idea that there is only one thing to be seen in any one place at any one time. If the centre for detecting colours detects red at place one and green at place two, and if the centre for detecting shape detects a tomato shape at place one and an apple shape at place two, then, given the principle that there is a maximum of one visible object per place per time, the binding problem can be solved. Treisman therefore proposes that we achieve a correctly bound representation by moving a variously sized ‘window’ from one location in the perceptual scene to another. This window blocks out the information from all but a single location, and all the features found at that location can then be ‘bound’ as being features of the same object. The area covered by the window within which features are bound is taken to correspond to the region to which attention is being paid.

There is more than one way to understand the explanatory import of Treisman’s claim that the window of attention corresponds to the window within which features are bound. Treisman’s early work presents that claim as an attempt to identify the processes of attention (by telling us that they are the processes of feature integration). In her later work the explanation being offered is no longer simply one in which it is attention that occupies the role of explanadum and the binding processes that occupy the role of explanans. Her later claim is that solving the binding problem is one role for the kind of selectivity that attention enables.

In some work the Feature Integration Theory has been pressed into the service of more ambitious explanatory goals. The theory plays an important role in John Campbell’s 2002 attempt, in Reference and Consciousness, to use attention to explain how the reference of demonstrative expressions gets fixed by their producers and understood by their consumers (see section 3.2). Treisman herself suggests, albeit tentatively, that descendants of the Feature Integration Theory may provide part of the explanation for “the bound, unitary, interpreted, personal view of the world of subjective experience” (Treisman, 2003, 111). She goes on to suggest, again tentatively, that the sort of explanation that such a theory provides “should give us all the information there is about the conditions that create consciousness” (op cit).

Opposed to those who think that a theory of feature binding will be a large component in our theory of attention, or of the unity of consciousness, or of anything else, are a number of philosophers (and a smaller number of psychologists) who deny that feature binding creates a problem that needs serious cognitive apparatus to solve it. Such claims have been made for various reasons. They are generally made as part of large-scale revisionary proposals for the conceptual framework of cognitive neuroscience. Kevin O’Regan and Alva Noë’s rejection of the binding problem ‘as, in essence, a pseudo-problem’ (O’Regan and Noë, 2001, 967) comes as part of their general attack on the idea that perception requires the representation of the thing perceived. Vincent Di Lollo has suggested that the assumptions about neural coding that generate the binding problem have been superceded, with the result that the binding problem is an ill-defined one (Di Lollo, 2012). And M.R. Bennett and P.M.S. Hacker, in their book-length critique of the philosophical foundations of neuroscience, claim that the notions of representation and information that enjoy currency in neuroscience are subject to various confusions, and that these confusions lead to it being ‘widespread’ for neuroscientists to make “confused statements of the so-called binding problem” (Bennett and Hacker, 2003, 14). These debates about the status of the binding problem (reviewed by Plate, 2007) turn on foundational issues for the cognitive sciences generally. They have ceased to be specifically concerned with the explanation of attention.

2.3 Coherence Theories

The view that the function of attention is the management of limitations in the brain’s information processing capacity has been an orthodox one among psychologists since Donald Broadbent introduced it in the nineteen fifties, but it has sometimes been called into question. The theories of attention that have been proposed by philosophers have tended not to endorse any straightforward version of the capacity-limitation view, and there are empirical reasons to think that the simplest versions of such a view are mistaken. In the nineteen seventies Ulric Neisser and his collaborators carried out a series of experiments showing that, when appropriately trained, a subject can perform two attention-involving tasks concurrently, without much interference between them (Hirst et al., 1980, Neisser, 1976). Neisser interpreted these experiments as suggesting that, insofar as there is a bottleneck that attention is needed to manage, it must often be a bottleneck in behavioural coordination, rather than in information processing capacity. Simple bodily limitations are what prevent us from looking in two directions at one time, or from throwing a ball and writing with the same hand. Neisser’s suggestion was that in many cases cognitive processing was selective, not as a result of limitations in processing capacity, but only in so far as such bodily limitations required it to be.

In two papers from 1987, authored individually but published in the same volume, Odmar Neumann and Alan Allport developed a similar idea. Whereas Neisser emphasized the constraints that are imposed on cognition by the need to manage a single body, Neumann and Allport both emphasized the constraints that are placed on cognition by the need to maintain a coherent course of action. They describe their position as a ‘selection-for-action’ theory.

If we think of ‘action’ as here referring to bodily behaviour then the selection-for-action theory is very similar to Neisser’s view. But Neumann and Allport’s point retains its force if we extend the notion of action to include deliberate mental activities, such as puzzle-solving, for which no bodily limitations are in play. There is here an “analogy between practical and theoretical and activity”, which was noted in an 1891 paper by G. F. Stout:

Thinking is action directed towards intellectual ends. Intellectual ends are attained by an appropriate combination of movements of attention just as practical ends are attained by an appropriate combination of movements of the body. If, therefore, we desire to explain the process of Thinking, we must clearly determine the nature of active Attention. (Stout, 1891, p. 23)

As Stout and the later generations of action-oriented theorists indicate, the need to select among several possible sources of information, and to select among several possible things that might be done with the information that has then been selected, is a characteristic of almost all deliberately executed thoughts and actions, whether those actions are bodily or intellectual. This ubiquitous need for selectivity has most recently been emphasized in a series of works by Wayne Wu, where it is referred to as the “many many problem”(Wu, 2011a, 2014).

In Wu’s handling of it, the idea that Neumann and Allport emphasized becomes part of a larger attempt to understand the essential connections between attention and agency (Wu, 2011b). For Wu, attention’s role in action is more fundamental than its role in perception. Stout is not the only precedent for this idea. The same connection was noted by William James when he claimed that “Volition is nothing but attention.”, (see Section 1.5, above). As with these earlier authors, Wu’s point is not just that, by treating attention as a purely perceptual phenomenon, we ignore many of its other instances. Instead Wu wants to suggest that any division we might attempt to draw between perceptual attention and the attentional selectivity required by agency would be an artificial one. Even the involuntary capture of attention by perceptually salient stimuli should, Wu thinks, be understood as involving a kind of readiness to act on the things to which we involuntarily attend (op cit, §3). Wu’s selection-for-action theory of attention is therefore intended as a step towards a unification of our philosophical account of ourselves as agents and our philosophical account of ourselves as perceivers.

According to selection-for-action type views the function of attention is not the management of capacity limitations. It is, instead, the management of capacity excess. It is because we can process multiple stimuli that we can be distracted by them, and because we can be distracted by them, not because we cannot process them, that we need mechanisms of attention to provide selectivity and focus. Attention, on this view, serves to lend coherence to, and to prevent interference between, the activity of several components in a system that has the capacity to handle far more stimuli than those pertaining to the subject’s current task. Such a view contrasts sharply with Broadbent’s conception of attentional selectivity as capacity-bottleneck management.

2.4 General-Purpose Prioritization

In the tradition that is perpetuated by Wu, the selectivity of attention is understood as providing a solution to one particular problem, created by the fact that there are multiple courses of action that might be taken at any time, with the taking of any one of these actions requiring the others to be suppressed. The solving of this particular problem is not the only cognitive need that could be served by an operation of selectivity, even in a mind without bottlenecks of processing capacity. The selection-for-action is therefore not the only alternative to Broadbent’s theory. Other functions for attentional selectivity might also be proposed. Alternatively—rather than electing any one of these functions of cognitive selectivity as being the function that is essentially served by attention—we might instead characterize attention as a quite general process of selectivity, recruitable on any of the various occasions when one thing needs to prioritized over another; whether this prioritization is required by the presence of a processing bottleneck, required in order for a particular action-plan to be executed, or required for some quite different reason. The recent work of Sebastian Watzl develops the idea that attention might be such a non-specific process of prioritization (Watzl, 2017).

In Watzl’s treatment of it, this idea places particular emphasis on the fact that, just as a binary ‘is greater than’ relation can introduce a partial ordering on a set, so a set of binary prioritizations can be considered in sum, as introducing a prioritization structure on the several items that together constitute one’s mental life. For Watzl, attention is the process by which one’s life comes to have such a structure.

Watzl also claims that a mind which lacked such a structure would therefore be lacking a particular perspective on the world, and so would not be the mind of a creature with the subjective point of view that is characteristic of conscious experiences. From this he derives the claim that every conscious creature is attentive. Carolyn Jennings has suggested that certain kinds of highly engaged expert performance may be a counterexample to this (Jennings, 2015).

2.5 Precision Optimization Theories and Prediction Error Coding

The idea that there might be reasons for attentional selection that have nothing to do with processing bottlenecks has also been a theme in the work of psychologists hoping to understand perception as a process of Bayesian inference (Friston et al. 2006, Summerfield & Egner, 2013), and in the work of those philosophers who have been influenced by them (Hohwy, 2013; Clark, 2013, 2017).

In what has come to be the most developed version of this Bayesian approach to the mind (Hohwy, 2013, Clark, 2013), cognition as a whole is understood to be a process of Bayesian updating, in which a hierarchically-organized series of hypotheses is constantly being tested, with each hypothesis being updated in the light of evidence coming from the level below. Advocates of this theory attempt to find room within this hierarchical framework for all aspects of cognition, including perception, thought, and action. A central claim of this theory is that the information that gets passed up through this hierarchy is encoded in the form of signals representing the errors in the predictions that are made by the hypotheses at the hierarchy’s next level up, with the content of one’s experience at any time being given by whichever hypothesis makes the least erroneous predictions. (Different versions of the theory use different techniques to calculate the relative size of these prediction errors.) Given their commitment to prediction-error coding, a central claim of these theories is that the role of our sensory encounter with the world is to provide information about the way in which our prior hypotheses get things wrong: instead of providing us with the information that it has started to rain, our senses provide only the information that it is more rainy than we had expected.

Advocates of this theory claim that it “allows us to see attention in a new light and to provide alternative conceptualizations of its functional role in our overall mental economy” (Hohwy, 2014, p. 191). According to these ‘alternative conceptions’, attention adjusts the weighting of incoming prediction error signals, in accordance with their expected precision (Hohwy, 2012). ‘Precision’ is understood here in a sense that contrasts precision with accuracy. ‘Accuracy’, in the intended sense, is a measure of the difference between the value indicated by a signal and the actual value, whereas ‘precision’ is a measure of the random fluctuation in that signal, even when the actual input is held constant. A miscalibrated instrument might, in this sense, be highly precise, without being especially accurate.

Various empirical results make it plausible that the brain takes account of expected precisions, when processing perceptual signals. In the ventriloquist illusion, for example, it is plausible that expectations of precision play a role: It is because vision is expected to give a more precise indication of location than audition that sounds are heard to come from the location where their source is apparently seen. Other considerations make it equally plausible that attention plays a role in accommodating the variations in these expected precisions, as we move from one context to another. If we expect that the signal from vision is likely to be a noisy one—perhaps because a thick fog has started to descend—then we may place more weight than usual on the information that is present in the signal coming from audition. It seems likely that there is a role for attention in bringing about this change of weighting. It is more controversial to claim, as the advocates of this theory do, that “attention is nothing but precision optimization in hierarchical inference.” (Hohwy, 1014, p.244, citing Feldman & Friston, 2010). Ransom et al. have suggested that, by taking attention always to be precision optimization, this theory struggles to account for certain forms of voluntary attention (Ransom et al. 2017).  Clark has suggested that this challenge can be met if the sources of voluntary attention are identified with beliefs, rather than desires (Clark, 2017).

2.6 Competition Theories and Cognitive Unison

Like the precision-optimization theories that have been advocated by Hohwy and Clark, from within the framework of the prediction-error coding theory, the Coherence theories advocated by Neisser, Neumann, Allport, and Wu have also suggested that there are functions for attention other than the management of limitations in processing capacity. Despite the availability of these non-Broadbentian conceptions of attention’s function, the Broadbentian idea that attention’s selectivity serves to manage limitations in processing capacity continues to be regarded by many psychologists as incontrovertible. The claim that “Because the visual system does not have the capacity to process all inputs simultaneously, there must exist attentional processes that help the visual system select some inputs” continues to be treated as a platitude of the sort that can be used as an uncontroversial opening sentence when introducing one’s research. (The example just given comes from the beginning of Vecera (2000), but many more examples of the same claim can easily be found.)

For those who reject this platitude, and think that the function of attention is something other than the management of limitations in processing capacity, it is natural to think that the mechanisms of attentional selection will be something other than capacity bottlenecks.

The clearest non-bottleneck mechanisms for achieving selectivity are competitions. Since well organized competitions can always select one winner, however good and however numerous the competitors, the selectivity of a competitive mechanism need not have anything to do with bottlenecks, or with any other limitations of processing capacity.

Competition based mechanisms for achieving selectivity come in at least two varieties: In a simple race mechanism each of the competitors independently completes a process that is comparable, along some dimension of variation, with the processes completed by the other competitors. The competitor that achieves the highest value on the relevant dimension of variation is selected as the winner. In a struggle the competitors do not just get on with their own processing in the hope that they will do it better than each of the other competitors. Instead the active suppression of other competitors is a part of the process that each competitor carries out. Simple race models of attention have been proposed (Shibuya and Bundesen, 1988, Bundesen, 1987) but our best current theories supplement the simple race mechanism with some components of mutual struggle, or with additional processes of top-down control (see Bundesen and Habekost, 2008).

One suggestion for a supplemented-competition mechanism for attentional selectivity is the biased-competition model, elaborated in several works by Robert Desimone, John Duncan and John Reynolds. The biased-competition model accounts for various attention-involving effects, at the personal and at the sub-personal level, as being effects that arise from numerous struggles between the different stimuli that fall within the variously sized receptive fields of neurons throughout the perceptual processing hierarchy. Each one of these struggles is hypothesized as being biased, although not settled outright, by a top-down attention-specific signal (Desimone and Duncan, 1995, Reynolds and Desimone, 2001).

We have said that competitions are selective in ways that do not involve limitations in capacity, and that competition-based theories of attention’s underlying mechanisms are therefore natural accompaniments to selection-for-action type views of attention’s function (Section 2.3), and perhaps of other views that involve a break from the Broadbentian view, according to which the function of attention is the management of capacity limitations. Competition views of attention’s mechanisms do not, however, require us to take a non-Broadbentian view of attention’s function. Although the biased competition view sits naturally with a non-Broadbentian view of attention’s function, Reynolds and Desimone continue to introduce the biased competition theory as an attempt to understand attention in recognizably Broadbentian terms, writing that:

The visual system is limited in its capacity to process information. However, it is equipped to overcome this constraint because it can direct this limited capacity channel to locations or objects of interest. (2001, 233)

Some advocates of the biased competition view emphasize the particular importance of the top-down biasing signals that the theory postulates (e.g. Beck and Kastner, 2009, p. 1156), taking the source of these signals to be the true locus of attentional selection. Others have suggested that the biased competition theory is better understood as a theory that refuses to identify any such locus, and that it should instead be read (as suggested in Duncan’s original presentation of the theory, (Duncan 1996)) as attributing the selectivity of attention to the totality of an integrated competition, involving processes of various sorts at various levels, any part of which can bias any other (Mole, 2011, §6.7, 2015).

When it is understood in this second way the biased-competition theory accords with the proposal that attention should be taken to have a metaphysical status analogous to that of unison in an orchestra. According to this view it is always a mistake to identify any one process as the attention process (or any set of processes as the attention processes); attention requires the unified activity of whichever processes happen to be relevant to the subject’s task, but it does not require any particular processes to be taking place. Such a view has been advocated in work by Christopher Mole, who dubs it the ‘Cognitive Unison Theory’. Metaphysically speaking, such a theory can be understood as a revival of John Locke and F.H. Bradley’s view that attention is a mode of thinking (see Section 1.3 above), and phenomenologically the view has a precedent in Ribot’s suggestion that attention be identified with ‘monoideism’ (Ribot, 1889, p. 10). It also draws on an idea that was sketched in a 1964 monograph by Alan White.

Because operating in unison requires an absence of task-irrelevant processing, the most straightforward version of the unison theory entails that attention is a rare achievement, with most cases of attentiveness involving what is, strictly speaking, only partial or divided attention. Mole (like Ribot) accepts this implication. Work by Philipp Koralus has suggested that a view along these lines could give a more satisfactory treatment of divided attention if the attentive pursuit of a task were understood to share certain formal properties with the answering of a question (Koralus, 2014). This characterization of attention as “the means by which we answer questions about the environment” has been argued for on phenomenological and epistemological grounds, by Naomi Eilan (Eilan, 1998). (Eilan credits the thought to Rowland Stout, whose treatment of it can be found in Chapter 9 §5 of Stout 2006.) Koralus draws on Hamblin’s 1958 semantics of questions to provide a formal model of such questioning (Hamblin, 1958).

2.7 Spotlight Theories

Whereas bottleneck metaphors have traditionally guided the theories that attempt to locate the cognitive resources that operate only on attended stimuli, it has been spotlight metaphors that have guided the theories that attempt to say which features of a stimulus determine whether attention is being paid to that stimulus at any given moment. The idea suggested by the spotlight metaphor is that a stimulus’s location ultimately determines whether or not that stimulus receives attention: the point here is not to deny that one can pay attention to something on account of it being brightly coloured, or on account of it being interesting. The point is, instead, that one pays attention to brightly coloured things by directing one’s attention to the location of those things.

One can easily see why the spotlight metaphor is appealing. If we are presented with an array of differently coloured shapes, appearing and disappearing in various places, then there will be various attention demanding tasks that we might perform regarding that array. Some tasks might require us to attend to whatever is going on at the top of the screen, others might require us to attend to all the red shapes, or to all the triangles, or to something else. Some of these ways of attending seem to be more basic than others. It seems, for example, that attending to things in the top part of the screen might be a primitive task, whereas attending to the triangles could not be primitive in the same way: we cannot simply attend to the triangles. If we want to attend to the triangles, we need first to work out where the triangles are. If, on the other hand, we want to attend to the things in the top part of the screen we do not need to work out whether they are triangles. It is therefore plausible that when we attend to the triangles we do so by attending to their locations. In this sense attending on the basis of location seems to be more basic than attending on the basis of shape.

The idea that attending to a location is more basic than attending to a shape might tempt one to think that attending on the basis of location is absolutely basic, so that attention is always and only allocated on the basis of location. If that were right then a theory of the spatial allocation of attention—a theory about the moving and focusing of an ‘attentional spotlight’—would be a large and central component in an account of how attention works. This would be good news for those who want to give a single unified theory of attention, and it would be good news for the scientific project of explaining attention more generally, since attention’s spotlight-like behaviours are some of its best understood aspects (see Logan, 1996).

There are reasons to think that location does play a special role in the allocation of attention, as the spotlight metaphor suggests. But the role of location in the allocation of attention is probably not as straightforward as would be required by the most parsimonious of spotlight-based theories. Location does have a special role to play in the allocation of attention, but (1) location is not the only property to have such a role, and (2) the role of location is more complicated than a simple spotlight metaphor suggests.

Empirical debates about the direction of the spotlight of attention have focussed mostly on the second of these points. An important source of data here is case studies contrasting the different patterns of attention failure that are shown by different unilateral neglect patients. Such studies suggest that various frames of reference are involved in the spatial allocation of attention (Behrmann and Tipper, 1999). This indicates that there is no single map of locations determining which items get attention: attention is sometimes allocated on the basis of location in egocentric space, sometimes on the basis of location in more complex frames of reference (a point that was among those raised by Allport, in his influential critique of the Broadbentian debates (see Allport, 1992, p. 197)).

There are also some well-known experimental effects suggesting that attention is allocated, not on the basis of straightforward spatial coordinates, but in ways that are constrained by the distribution of objects in space. The classic work in this area is John Duncan’s demonstration that attention shifts more readily between two locations that fall within the bounds of a single object than between equidistant locations that are separated by an object boundary (Duncan, 1984). Equally important here are findings from experiments using three-dimensional stimuli, and using virtual three-dimensional displays. These studies suggest that subjects are unable to differentially attend to depths in an empty space, but that subjects can shift their attention forwards and backward (to a place in front of or behind the point that their eyes are fixating) when the relevant locations are ones in which there are objects (see Yantis, 1998).

These converging sources of data indicate that the spotlight of attention is not allocated simply on the basis of coordinates in any single spatial frame of reference. That is an important finding for those attempting to localize mechanisms for the allocation of attention within the brain (since different brain areas differ in their mapping of space, and in their representation of spatial information about the objects within it). It has been influential in leading psychologists to turn away from simple spotlight metaphors. It should be noted, however, that these findings do not threaten the core of the idea that was suggested by the spotlight metaphor: The facts about what a person is attending to might still supervene on the facts about where that person is attending, even if quite numerous and sometimes complex factors are responsible for determining which location that is.

Other effects are somewhat more damaging for a pure spotlight view, although they stop short of refuting it entirely. The more-than-merely-spatial complexity of the way in which attention is allocated has been nicely demonstrated in a series of experiments by Dwight Kravitz and Marlene Behrmann (Kravitz and Behrmann, 2011). The subjects in these experiments have their attention cued by a brief stimulus that is presented at one end of a shape that is shown on a computer screen. This shape might be a simple rectangle, a rectangle with bulbous ends, or a more complex ‘H’ or ‘h’ shape. It is presented alongside another shape, which in some cases has the same shape and colour, and in some cases is different. The resulting allocation of attention is then probed by measuring the reaction times to stimuli that are presented on and near these objects. Kravitz and Behrmann find that all the different properties of their stimuli interact to determine the way in which attention is allocated to the screen on which these stimuli appear. Most strikingly of all, they find a difference in the allocation of attention between the case in which the shapes on the screen are an upper and a lower case ‘H’, and the case in which the shapes are an upper case H and number 4, even though this number 4 shape is exactly the same as the lower case h, but presented upside down. Such findings suggest that attention, even when triggered by a simple spatial cue, is not allocated merely on the basis of location, but also on the basis of shape, colour, and arbitrary learned meaning.

The discovery that attention can preferentially modulate the processing of stimuli on account of their colours, shapes, and meanings does not prevent us from maintaining that the location of a stimulus has a special role to play in the process by which attention is allocated to it. More than one line of research in psychology has sought to identify some one representation in the brain in which items are encoded in a way that determines the extent to which attention will be allocated to them. In the longest established of these lines of research—beginning with the work of Koch and Ullman (1985)—this representation has been taken to be a map, in some quite literal sense of ‘map’: the representation is taken to be one in which every location in some region is represented, and the representation of these locations is taken to be in some format that immediately encodes the spatial relations between them. Every object that is represented is taken to represented as being at some location, and the properties assigned to these located objects are taken to determine the likelihood that attention will be paid to the location that the objects occupy. According to the theory that postulates these ‘salience maps’, location does play a unique role in determining the way in which attention is allocated, despite the fact that other properties contribute to that allocation.

In more recent treatments of this idea (Pessoa, 2013) such maps are taken to include representations, not merely of the objective properties that give an item salience, but also of subjective properties, such as emotional-valence and current-motivational-relevance. The more we think of these maps as being augmented with additional, non-spatial information, the less spotlight-like the allocation of attention represented in them will seem to be, but, provided the representation in question is still understood to be map-like, location can still be understood to have an important role (and perhaps even a uniquely important one).

Debates about the role of such maps, and about the variety of subjective and objective properties that are represented within them, may have some wide-ranging philosophical consequences, concerning more than just the aptness of the spotlight metaphor. Aaron Henry has suggested that the viability of some recent philosophical theories depends on the outcome of these debates. Since the recent philosophical theories of attention have tended to emphasize the role of agency in attention, they face potential counterexamples from instances of involuntary attention. Henry suggests that the threat of such counterexamples can be defused if the mechanisms of involuntary attention capture are understood to involve attention being allocated on the basis of a map in which the agent’s priorities for action are represented (Henry, 2017).

Although the psychological debates about salience maps are ongoing, an argument against pure spotlight views can also be made on more traditional, phenomenological grounds. A pure spotlight theory, according to which attention is always allocated on the basis of location, seems unable to account for the sort of case that Hermann von Helmholtz and William James were concerned with (see section 1.5). There is, as their example suggests, a difference between attending to the pitch of a note and attending to its timbre, or to its overtones. This difference in attention does not seem to correspond to a difference in the location attended. Nor does a purely location based theory of attention allocation seem able to account for the sort attention that one must pay in order to perform a time-based task, such as finding out which of a group of shapes appears on screen for longest. Such temporal aspects of attention have tended to be neglected, but they are emerging as an important topic in psychology (see the papers collected in Nobre and Coull, 2010). Some philosophical work has been devoted to their exploration (see Phillips, 2011).

Since some shifts of attention are not shifts in the location attended, a theory of the factors that determine which locations a subject is attending to cannot tell us the whole story about the allocation of attention. It might nonetheless be a central component in a theory of some of attention’s forms (see Wright and Ward, 2008).

2.8 Motor Theories

Work in which electrodes are used in vivo to stimulate areas of the macaque brain known to be associated with eye-movement coordination has provided compelling evidence for the existence of an anatomical overlap between brain areas involved in eye-movement control and those involved in determining which stimuli elicit the strongest responses in visual cortex. There is evidence that this anatomical fact has some functional significance. One suggestive finding is that the links between frontal eye-movement control areas and attention-like effects in occipital visual areas are spatially specific: An electrode that is placed so that it elicits an eye movement to a particular part of the visual field when activated at one level will, if activated at a lower level, elicit changes in neural responsiveness that are exactly similar to the changes seen when attention is shifted to that same location (Moore and Armstrong, 2003, Armstrong and Moore, 2007).

These facts are suggestive of a ‘motor theory’ of attention, according to which the processes underpinning attention are, in at least some cases, truncated versions of the processes underpinning the coordination of movements of sensory orientation.

The central idea of such a motor theory is that “the program for orienting attention either overtly or covertly is the same, but in the latter case the eyes are blocked at a certain peripheral stage” (Rizzolatti et al, 1987, 37).  Advocates of motor theories (such as Moore, Armstrong and Fallah, 2003) have characterised their work as a revival of the picture that Alexander Bain proposed at the end of the nineteenth century. Bain (as we saw in Section 1.5, above) identified attention with truncated versions of the motor-control processes that typically bring about attention’s behavioural manifestations — processes “stopping short of the actual movement performed by the organ” (Bain, 1888, 371).

These versions of the motor theory should be distinguished from theories that regard attention and motor control as intimately linked, but that place no emphasis on the fact that the motor control processes that have been implicated in attention are processes that control the movement of sensory organs. In these theories (which are natural but not obligatory concomitants of the ‘selection-for-action’ views discussed in section 2.5) attention stands in an intimate relation to motor control more generally. One line of experimental evidence in support of such a connection comes from work by Heiner Deubel and his collaborators, in which various changes to the way in which an object figures in action are shown to have an attention-indicating influence on the perceptual discrimination of stimuli that are presented on or near that object. In one striking example of this Deubel and Schneider found that the way in which attention is allocated to the space around a 6.5cm wooden X shape depended on whether the subject was reaching with her left hand to grasp the shape by the top-left and bottom right arms, or reaching with her right hand to grasp the shape by the arms at its top-right and bottom left (Deubel & Schneider, 2004). In each case attention was allocated not only to the shape, but to the to-be-gripped parts of it. For other evidence of interactions between attention and action-targeting, see (Tipper, Howard, and Houghton, 1998).

Motor theories and other action-based theories give a plausible account of some of attention’s instances, but they have limitations that prevent them form applying with full generality: Since movement of the eyes, or of the limbs, is always movement to a location motor theories will struggle to account for the allocation of attention on the basis of anything other than location. They therefore face the limitations that we saw when considering pure spotlight theories, of being unable to account for shifts in attention that do not correspond to differences in the location attended. Nor is it clear how motor theories should be applied to spatial attention in those sensory modalities where the orientation of the sense organs is less straightforward than it is in the visual case. The motor theory does, nonetheless, provide a plausible and well-supported account of the location based variety of visual attention displayed in typical attention-lab experiments.

The success of motor theories in accounting for the sorts of attention that are found in some typical attention-lab experiments can be given either an optimistic or a pesimistic interpretation. The optimistic interpretation sees the motor theory as providing a successful account of the processing underpinning some of attention’s simpler and more central varieties. The pessimistic interpretation sees the motor theory as revealing a problem with our usual experimental paradigms. In typical laboratory tasks subjects direct their attention to different parts of their visual field while keeping their eyes fixated on a central spot. The behavioural signatures of attention in such tasks are usually reductions in reaction time to the attended stimuli. The neural correlates of these behavioural signatures are certain biases as to which stimuli most strongly drive the neural circuitry that processes them. The central finding of the motor-theorists is that these neural and behavioural effects can result from attenuated versions of the activity responsible for directing eye movements. The pessimistic interpretation of this finding is as revealing that the signs that were traditionally taken to indicate the direction of attention are actually no more than consequences of the truncated eye-movements that our experimental paradigms induce. If that is right then the phenomenon studied in attention labs may not be the psychologically important one that it has been taken for.

3. Explanatory Roles for Attention

3.1 Attention and Consciousness

3.1.1 Is Attention Necessary for Consciousness?

The question of whether attention is necessary for consciousness can be answered in various ways. One answer is given by those who think that lots of unattended items appear in consciousness. A different answer is given by those who think that only some unattended items figure in consciousness. A third answer is given if we think that unattended items figure in consciousness only in special circumstances. There is some evidence that, independently of any philosophical commitments, people differ as to which of these views they find plausible (Schwitzgebel, 2007). There are also views in which attention is necessary for consciousness in the sense that every conscious creature must be an attentive one. Such views need not entail that attention to an object is necessary for consciousness of that object.

At one extreme end of this spectrum is the view according to which attention is strictly necessary for consciousness, so that the things to which we are not paying attention do not figure in our consciousness at all. A number of psychologists endorse this view (e.g. Cohen et al. 2012), as do some philosophers (e.g. Prinz, 2012, Carruthers, 2015, Montemayor & Haladjian, 2015). There is some historical precedent for this view in James’s remark, at the beginning of his chapter on attention, that “my experience is what I agree to attend to”(James, 1890, ch. 11), and in Kames’ remark that “Attention is requisite even to the simple act of seeing” (see Sect 1.4, above).

The evidence that is proffered in support of the view that attention is strictly necessary for consciousness comes from a range of experiments showing the surprising extent to which subjects are ignorant of the items to which they have paid no attention. In Mack and Rock’s ‘inattentional blindness’ paradigm, for example, subjects who are given an attention demanding task pertaining to a stimulus in one part of the visual field frequently fail to notice shapes or words that are flashed up elsewhere (Mack & Rock, 1998). In Rensink et al.’s ‘change blindness’ paradigm subjects need to see an alternating pair of pictures between ten and twenty times before they can identify a large but narratively inconsequential difference between them (Rensink et al., 1997, Rensink, 2002). In the most memorable of these experiments a large number of subjects fail to notice the central appearance of a man in a gorilla suit when their attention is taken up with the business of counting the number of passes made by one of two teams in a concurrent basketball-type game (Simons & Chabdris, 1999).

No single one of these experiments can establish the claim that attention is always necessary for consciousness—that claim is a universally quantified one, and is not entailed by any one of its instances. Nor is it clear that what we see in these experiments really are instances in which unattended objects drop out of consciousness altogether. The subject’s ignorance of the gorilla’s appearance, for example, is compatible with its being the case that the presence of the gorilla does make a phenomenal difference for the inattentive subject. To explain the subject’s ignorance we need only say that any phenomenal difference that the unattended gorilla makes is a difference that the subject is unable to use in answering the experimenter’s question about whether anything strange happened in the scene. It may be that it is a phenomenal difference that is epistemically unusable because it is immediately forgotten (see Wolfe, 1998) or it may, alternatively, be a difference that is unusable because it is too unstructured and inchoate to be epistemically mobilizable. In that case the effect of inattention would be inattentional agnosia, rather than inattentional blindness (see Simons, 2000).

Absolute amnesia for unattended items, or thoroughgoing agnosia for them, may be indistinguishable from inattentional blindness, both behaviourally and from the point of view of retrospective introspection. For that reason it is not a straightforward matter for the advocates of any of these interpretations of the inattentional blindness and change blindness effects to rule out the alternative interpretations. Subpersonal sources of data (such as experiments using neuroimaging) may be the only sources of data that we have to go on. (See Rees, et al. 1999 for an example in which fMRI data is used to argue against the amnesia interpretation of inattentional blindness effects involving written words).

It is only narratively insignificant differences that go unnoticed in the change-blindness paradigm. The change blindness effects might therefore be taken as showing, not that there is no consciousness in the absence of attention, but that there is consciousness in the absence of attention, the contents of which are restricted to the scene’s overall gist. There are difficulties in adjudicating between these two interpretations experimentally. When the features of gist do seem to be perceived, in the apparent absence of attention, the defender of the claim that attention is necessary for consciousness may reply by claiming that attention is paid to these items, either in a dispersed, non-focal way (Prettyman, 2013), or because these features are briefly and involuntarily attention-catching (Prinz, 2012, p. 119). Without an experimental operationalization of complete inattention, these rival interpretations cannot be ruled out, with the result that empirical debates about the extent of consciousness beyond attention are currently in something of deadlock, with experimenters being able to claim only to have demonstrated perception in the ‘near absence’ of attention (Li et al., 2002, Reddy et al., 2004, Reddy et al., 2006), and so providing only weak support to the hypothesis that attention and consciousness are dissociable (Koch & Tsuchiya, 2007).

The methodological puzzle that we face when trying to settle the dispute between different interpretations of the inattentional blindness effects raises the question of whether our commonsense beliefs about the conscious status of unattended items are well founded. Such beliefs seem to vary from person to person (Schwitzgebel, 2007), and to vary with certain features of the context in which they are probed (De Brigard, 2010). To the extent that we find it natural to suppose that unattended items do figure in consciousness, this may simply being owing to a version of the ‘refrigerator-light illusion’: If our reason for believing that we are conscious of the things to which we pay no attention is a reason that depends on our finding that we are conscious of those things whenever we check on them, then that belief is on shaky ground. A checking procedure cannot provide us with good evidence about the status of unattended items since the act of checking is itself an act that involves a shift in attention to the things checked.

Since a direct checking procedure is ruled out we need a more theory-driven way of assessing the dispute between those who claim that the consequence of not attending to an item is that the item drops out of conscious experience and those who claim that inattention simply puts the subject in a poor epistemic position vis-à-vis the unattended items. The current state of our theories is such that it would be premature to try to settle this dispute by an inference to the best explanation since neither side of the dispute has a theory of the attention/consciousness relation that has been worked out to a degree that would allow the different explanations to be compared. We can, however, see some of the considerations that the two sides in this debate might invoke. Those who endorse the idea that attention is necessary for consciousness can point to the fact that this view accords well with theories in which attention features prominently in the explanation of consciousness (e.g. Prinz, 2005, 2012). They may also be able to develop arguments based on theories of the way in which consciousness and attention evolved (Montemayor & Haladjian, 2015). Those who prefer the epistemic-deficit interpretation of the inattentional blindness effects (Mole, 2011, §7.3.7) can point to the fact that that interpretation flows naturally from the view according to which attention to an item provides the sort of acquaintance that is needed for the use of a demonstrative concept that refers to that item (a view advocated by Campbell, 2002, and discussed in section 3.2 below): If attention to the gorilla is necessary for the forming of a demonstrative-involving thought (such as ‘That’s a gorilla’) then there is an immediate explanation, consistent with the idea that unattended items nonetheless feature in the subject’s consciousness, for the fact that inattentive subjects are unable to answer questions such as ‘Was there a gorilla?’.

The difficulty in the case of the unnoticed gorilla is to discern whether unattended items are present to consciousness, but not as individuated items to which a demonstrative reference could be directed, or whether those unattended items are instead absent from consciousness altogether. Part of this difficulty originates in the fact that, although most people give no attention to the gorilla, they could attend to him, and would have done so if anything had prompted them to do so. More data may be available, both to introspection and to laboratory measurement, in cases where our failure to attend has some more systemic explanation. Ned Block has suggested that one such case is found in our perception of peripheral stimuli, when these are subject to the phenomenon of ‘identity crowding’ (Block, 2013a). An individual ‘T’ or ‘F’ can be seen reasonably clearly, even when presented in a peripheral part of the visual field. But if additional characters are presented alongside this individual character, then the properties of these charaacters are prone to perceptul confusion. Attention seems to bind together properties from all of the characters in the vicinity of the one individual that we are trying to pick out. It therefore seems that, in the perceptual periphery, attention cannot be directed onto a region that fits an individual character tightly. Due to this ‘crowding’ effect, individual letters or shapes become impossible to individuate from the others with which they are clustered, when they fall in parts of the visual field that are outside of the high-definition centre. The properties of objects that are crowded in this way can nonetheless be seen, and the fact that several items are present can be reliably reported. On the basis of empirical and introspective considerations, Block claims that, even in cases where the crowded characters share all of their features with the others by which they are crowded, these crowded characters are consciously discriminated from their surroundings. He claims that these characters figure as objects in consciousness. Since attention cannot be allocated to anything more fine-grained than the crowd of which these characters are a part, these characters are not objects to which attention is paid. Block therefore takes ‘identity crowding’ to give counterexamples to the claim that we are conscious of objects only when paying attention to them.

His claim that the crowded character figures in consciousness as an individuated objects, rather than as a part of some feature-rich texture, has been contested (Taylor, 2013, Richards, 2013). In response, Block has suggested that an inference the best explanation of several related phenomena favours his interpretation of the effect (Block, 2013b).

Inference to the best explanation is always a hazardous business, especially in the vicinity of an explantory gap. In the interpretation of identity crowding, as in the interpretation of inattentional blindness, the inescapability of abductive considerations suggests that our answer to the question about whether attention is necessary for consciousness may have to wait until we have a better understanding of the relation of attention to demonstrative reference (of the sort that is involved in thinking ‘That’s a gorilla’), and of attention’s role in epistemology more generally.

3.1.2 Is Attention Sufficient for Consciousness?

In addition to disputes about whether we are conscious of only those things to which we attend there are also disputes about whether we are conscious of everything to which we attend. If we were then a complete theory of attention might be given by giving an account of the way in which attention modulates consciousness.

Declan Smithies has argued in favour of a position according to which everything that is attended to is consciously attended to. He claims that all instances of attention must be consciousness-involving, on the grounds that (1) all such instances must have a connection with their subject’s ‘rational-access’ to the contents of her experience, and (2) there is no connection to rationality in the case of processing that is wholly unconscious. Smithies’ view is, therefore, that attention is essentially involved in the ‘rational-access’ of consciously experienced contents (Smithies, 2011). The nature of any such connection between attention to experience and the justificatory force of that experience is itself a source of ongoing controversy: Johannes Roesller has argued that McDowell’s theory of perceptual experience’s reason-giving force cannot account for the role played by attention in experience (Roessler, 2011); Susanna Siegel and Nicholas Silins have claimed that the doxastic influence of an experience can be an instance of rational access even when the experience is not attended (Siegel & Silins, 2014); Terry Horgan and Matjaž Potrč have argued that the justification of beliefs by experience must outrun both the contents of attention and the contents of consciousness (Horgan and Potrč 2011). Here, as above, one’s understanding of attention and one’s understanding of epistemology constrain one another, and may provide a theory-driven route to theses about the possibility of unconscious attentiveness.

The claim that all attention is conscious attention sits uneasily with certain empirical results indicating that those psychological processes that are responsible for the effects that are usually taken to be signatures of attention are processes that do not require consciousness for their operation. In an experiment by Yi Jiang et al., (2006), for example, subjects are presented with attention-attracting stimuli in such a way that, thanks to an arrangement of mirrors, these stimuli are given to just one eye. Because a more vivid stimulus is presented to the other eye, and because this more vivid stimulus wins the competition for consciousness that occurs in such cases of binocular rivalry, subjects do not consciously experience the less vivid stimulus. The unconsciously processed stimuli in these experiments include erotic photographs. These unseen erotic photographs do seem to elicit shifts of attention, as evidenced by the fact that the consciously experienced stimuli presented in the same location as these unseen attention-grabbers are more accurately responded to in an attention demanding task (involving detecting the orientation of gabor-patches). One striking finding from Jiang et al.’s experiments is that the way in which the unseen photographs attract and repel the attention depends on the sexual orientation of the experimental participants.

A natural interpretation of these experiments is as showing that the erotic pictures capture the subject’s attention, despite the fact that the subject has no conscious experience of them. This suggests—although it does not conclusively demonstrate —that one may be attending to a thing without being conscious of it. The same conclusion is suggested by a quite different set of experiments involving blindsighted subjects. In these experiments we see that, even though the blindsighted subject has no experience of cues presented in his scotoma, those cues can elicit the same facilitation of processing and reduction of reaction times that are usually taken to be the signatures of attention (Kentridge & Heywood, 2001, Kentridge et al., 2004).

One complaint against both these lines of evidence is that they do not enable us to distinguish between attention to a thing and attention that is merely directed to a part of space, and so cannot demonstrate attention to a thing in the absence of consciousness of it (Mole, 2008a). Research by Liam Norman, Charles Heywood and Robert Kentridge goes some way to addressing this complaint. Norman, Heywood and Kentridge present normal subjects with a screen showing an array of small, rapidly flickering Gabor patches. Objects the boundaries of which were defined by changes in the orientations of these patches are not consciously experienced: Subjects merely see the whole screen as a flickering array of patches. Cues that direct the attention of these subjects nonetheless do seem to draw attention to these unseen objects, as indicated by differences in the response times to items that are subsequently presented in and outside of their boundaries (Norman, Heywood & Kentridge, 2013).

Such experiments show that there is an influence operating between unconscious processing and the direction of attention, and perhaps indicate that attention can be paid to objects that make no showing in conscious experience (Mole, 2014a). They therefore place a limit on the closeness of the relationship that can be claimed to exist between attention and consciousness.

The disputes about whether attention is sufficient for consciousness, necessary for consciousness, or both, are related to questions about attention’s metaphysics. The claim that attention is not sufficient for consciousness is typically made as part of a defence of the idea that attention and consciousness are underpinned by two distinct brain processes (see, e.g., Koch and Tsuchiya, 2007). The claim that attention is sufficient for consciousness but not necessary for it is required by those who, like Locke (see Section 1.3), think that attention is a mode of conscious thinking without any particular process that serves as its underpinning. The claim that attention is sufficient for consciousness and necessary for it is required by those who think that the process by which things come to consciousness is identical to the process by which attention is allocated (Prinz, 2005, 2011).

3.1.3 How Does Attention Modulate Phenomenology?

Whether or not one thinks that attention is always responsible for bringing things into our consciousness, there are good reasons to think that changes in the direction of our attention can make some difference to the character of conscious experience. Phenomenologists and Gestalt psychologists have characterized this difference in various ways, with Maurice Merleau-Ponty emphasizing the way in which attention can configure the figure ground structure of space (Merleau-Ponty, 1962, Chp.3–4), and Aron Gurwitsch (Gurwitsch, 1964) elaborating a theory in which the configuration given by attention has a more complex, three-part structure (explained in Arvidson, 2006). In the second half of his 2017 book, Sebastian Watzl develops a similar suggestion, on the basis of his claim that the role of attention is to impose a priority structure on our mental lives (see above §2.4), (Watzl, 2011, 2017).

There is currently some dispute about whether the differences made by shifts of attention can be adequately characterized as differences in the content of the attended experience. If, as Watzl contends, they cannot, then phenomena of attention create a serious difficulty for any fully general attempts to explain the character of conscious experience by reference to the contents represented in it (Chalmers, 2004), although such explanations might still be viable in circumscribed domains (Speaks, 2010).

A series of studies by Marisa Carrasco and her collaborators have examined the influence of attention on the character of conscious experience. These have revealed that the phenomenal differences produced by shifts of attention include differences of perceived brightness, contrast, and saturation of colours, but do not include differences of hue (Carrasco, Ling & Read, 2004, Fuller & Carrasco, 2006). Ned Block has suggested that these perceived differences should not be thought of as differences in the content of experience, since to characterize them in that way would be to take it that attending to an item creates an illusion as to its brightness, contrast, etc.; a result which he takes to be implausible. He therefore takes Carrasco’s findings as indicating an aspect of experience that cannot be accounted for with a theory of that experience’s content (Block 2010).

There have been similar disputes, transacted on the basis of more introspective considerations, concerning the effects of attention on the perception of ambiguous figures. In response to some considerations that were first raised by Fiona Macpherson (Macpherson, 2006), Bence Nanay has suggested that the effects of attention on the perception of such figures can be explained by those who maintain that every difference in consciousness is a difference of content (Nanay, 2010, 2011). His contention is that the effects of attention on the character of conscious experience be understood as including a modulation of the specificity of an experience’s content, in which the representations of determinable properties are made more or less determinate. The issues here are similar to those concerning the way in which blur should be thought to enter into visual experience (see “Representational Theories of Conciousness” esp. §4.4).

3.2 Attention and Demonstrative Reference

Consciousness is one philosophically puzzling mental phenomenon that has been thought to be related to attention in ways that may prove to be explanatorily revealing. Demonstrative reference is another. One advocate of the idea that attention contributes to the explanation of demonstrative reference is John Campbell, who writes that:

… the notion of conscious attention to an object has an explanatory role to play: it has to explain how it is that we have knowledge of the reference of a demonstrative. (2002, 45)

A similar idea was explored in the manuscript on Theory of Knowledge that Bertrand Russell abandoned (under the influence of Wittgenstein) in the summer in 1913. In that work Russell gives the following statement of the idea that reference to particulars requires attention to them:

At any moment of my conscious life, there is one object (or at most some very small number of objects) to which I am attending. All knowledge of particulars radiates out from this object. (1913, 40)

In support of the Russellian claim that there is an explanatory relation between attention and demonstrative reference, Campbell develops two lines of thought.

The first line of thought comes from reflection on examples concerning the requirements that have to be met in order to understand demonstrative expressions in conversational contexts where one of the participants in the conversation uses expressions such as ‘that woman’, but where various women are present, all of whom are possible referents for this demonstrative. Knowing which women is meant, according to Campbell, requires attending to the woman in question and knowing that it is to her that the speaker was attending. This is intended to show more than just that the direction of the speaker’s attention is a possible source of evidence for what that speaker means. It is intended as showing that attention and reference stand in a particularly intimate relationship—a relationship that Campbell characterizes by saying that ‘knowledge of the reference of a demonstrative is provided by conscious attention to the object’ (p. 22).

The second line of thought that Campbell develops in support of the view that attention explains demonstrative reference is a line of thought pertaining to deductive arguments in which the premises refer to items that are picked out by demonstratives: Arguments such as ‘(1) That is F. (2) That is G. Therefore (3) That is F and G’. Campbell’s thought here is that such arguments depend for their validity on there being no possibility of equivocating on the meaning of ‘that’, as it occurs in the two separate premises. Such arguments can only figure in rationally-entitling reasoning so long as there is a single fixing of the referent of ‘that’ in both premises. This reference fixing, Campbell thinks, is achieved if and only if there is no redirection of attention between the premises. Again this is intended to show more than just that there is some causal or evidential relation between attending and referring. It is intended to show that the role played by attention in fixing the reference of a demonstrative is analogous to the role played by a Fregean Sense in fixing the reference of a proper name (Campbell, 2002, Chapter 5).

The explanatory approach that Campbell advocates, and that Russell considered, has traditionally been thought to suffer from a problem of circularity. This problem was urged by Peter Geach in Mental Acts (1957). Geach considers the suggestion that we can use attention to explain our ability to make reference to the things that we perceive, but thinks that no such suggestion can provide a genuine explanation of reference because:

… it is quite useless to say the relevant sense-perceptions must be attended to, either this does not give a sufficient condition, or else “attended to” is a mere word for the very relation of judgment to sense perception that requires analysis. (1957, 64)

Geach’s threat of circularity can be avoided if an independently given theory of how attention is constituted can be shown to illuminate the way in which reference is fixed by it. Imogen Dickie has attempted to show just this. In a 2011 paper Dickie shows that cognitive psychology provides us with a theory of the role played by attention in tracking objects over time. She suggests that such a theory can be used to account for the way in which attending to an object removes any knowledge-defeating component of luck from our inferences involving it, and so establishes the attended object as a possible topic of demonstrative thoughts (Dickie, 2011, 2015). This treatment of attention exemplifies some of the central themes in Dickie’s more general attempt to explain how thoughts come to be about ordinary objects (and so how singular terms come to refer to those objects). The explanation that she offers is one in which a thought comes to be about a thing when the justificatory practices in which that thought figures are anchored to the object in question (in a sense of ‘anchoring’ that Dickie spells out in detail (Dickie, 2015)).

Whether or not a theory of attention can be turned into a non-circular explanation of reference, the idea that attention and reference are related does seem to be an idea that casts light on what goes on when we understand referring expressions. Campbell’s examples suggest that what we attend to and what we refer to are often the same, and there is some empirical evidence, coming from developmental psychology, indicating that attention-related abilities play a crucial role in the infant’s development of an understanding of its caregiver’s demonstrative use (see Section3.3). The lesson that has been drawn from this work in developmental psychology is not only about the comprehension of linguistic expressions.  It is also a lesson about our grasp on directly referring thoughts. The idea – here as in the work of Dickie and Campbell – is not only that attention contributes to our production and comprehension of linguistic expressions that have particular referents, but that it also contributes to the establishment of those referents as the contents of our thoughts.

3.3 Attention and Other Minds

There are empirical results, coming from developmental psychology, which are suggestive of an intimate link between the development of various abilities related to attention and the development of various capacities that are involved in understanding the mental states that are being expressed in interactions between the infant and caregiver.

An ability to appreciate what others are attending to appears to be a crucial stage in the normal infant’s development towards understanding of the fact that its caregivers’ utterances have referential intentions behind them. More generally, the development of capacities for attention are important milestones in some distinctively human aspects of infant development (Moore and Dunham, 1995). There is a distinctive developmental pathway in which normal human infants develop an ability and a willingness to attend to the mother, an ability and willingness to attend to the thing that she is attending to, and then, most importantly, an ability and willingness to enter into episodes in which there is a third object that mother and child are attending to jointly, with mutual understanding of the fact that their attention is shared (Reddy, 2010, Trevarthen, 2011). In these episodes infants and caregivers employ complex cues, involving speech, gaze-following, and pointing.

There is good evidence that the child’s progression along this pathway is intimately related to the develop of abilities to respond appropriately to the mental states of others, and to the development of the ability to acquire new vocabulary on the basis of an understanding of what the words used by its mother refer to. A recent longitudinal study suggests that the earlier stages in this pathway are predictive of the age at which infants reach the later ones – thereby providing some evidence for the hypothesis that this sequence is a causal one – with the mastery at 12 months of pointing as a means to direct the attention of others being predictive of false belief understanding at the age of 50 months, even when factors relating to temperament and language are factored out (Sodian & Kristen-Antonow, 2015). Another source of evidence comes from the fact that the arrested development of these attention-involving abilities is a revealing marker of the impairments suffered by autistic children (Kanner, 1943, Hobson & Hobson, 2011), and from the fact that a lack of such abilities is perhaps related to limitations in the mental-state attribution abilities of non-human primates, although this last claim is more controversial (Call & Tomasello, 2005).

Some progress has been made towards extracting philosophical lessons from the empirical work indicating that attention has an explanatory role to play here (see, for several examples, the papers collected in Eilan, et al. 2005, Seemann 2011). One of the points at which philosophical difficulties arise is in characterizing the sharedness of the attention that is implicated in this developmental trajectory. Christopher Peacocke has argued that the way in which joint attention episodes are shared involves a kind of reciprocal recognition of the other’s recognition of one’s own attention, and so that it involves a kind of mutual openness that is analogous to the openness of ‘common knowledge’, as that notion figures in philosophical analyses of communication and convention (See ‘Convention’). Since joint attention is achieved by young children, its achievement cannot plausibly be thought to make any sophisticated intellectual demands. Peacocke therefore argues that awareness of reciprocated openness must be more fundamental than the intellectual achievement of common knowledge, and should instead be understood as a variety of perceptual awareness that makes common knowledge possible (Peacocke, 2005). John Campbell shares Peacocke’s view of joint attention as being a perceptual phenomenon, as opposed to a phenomenon that is achieved when one’s perception is reflected on in a certain way, but Campbell differs from Peacocke in taking the person with whom attention is shared to be fellow subject of the joint experience, not an object who figures in the content of the experience that each joint-attender individually has (Campbell, 2002, Ch. 8).

3.4 Attention and Knowledge

The apparent links between attention and demonstrative reference (see section 3.2) and attention and knowledge of other minds (see section 3.3) might be special instances of a more general connection between attention and the making of epistemic moves. A general connection of that sort may have been what Descartes had in mind when he suggested that attention to clear and distinct ideas is a necessary condition for those ideas to realize their special epistemic potential (see Section 1.1). It might also be what Stewart had in mind when he suggested that “Some attention [is] necessary for any act of memory whatever” (see Section 1.4). Kant’s anthropological writings also cast attention in a crucial epistemic role, as explaining the control that one can exert over representations in thought and in imagination, where this perhaps includes the kind of imagination that Kant thinks is involved in making one’s experiences into experiences of an objective spatiotemporal world (Merrittt & Valaris, 2017).

Although these philosophers have tended to frame the idea in a way that reflects their other theoretical commitments, some version of the idea that attention is always involved in the making of epistemic moves can be made pre-theoretically plausible. The inattentional blindness experiments, in which subjects are visually presented with large changes while attending to something else, show that inattentive subjects can fail to notice all sorts of perceivable things that attentive subjects find obvious. Something exactly similar seems to be true in the a priori domain. Just as no item is so large, so central, and so well lit that no conscious and sighted observer could miss it, so there is no step in reasoning that is so simple, so compelling and so obvious that every thinker, whether attentive or inattentive, can be expected to recognise it. The inattentional blindness effects show that there are attentional demands that a thinker has to meet before his perceptual encounter with things can provide knowledge of them. It is plausible that there are similar attentional demands that have to be met before the thinker’s grasp of a thought gives her a justified belief in the thought’s consequences.

In both the a priori case and the perceptual case the acquisition of knowledge seems to require attention, and in both cases this requirement seems to be a practical one. It may be that knowledge of some propositions is required if one’s experience with a gorilla is to provide one with knowledge of the gorilla’s presence. The propositions here would be of a sort that could serve as a major premise in an inference by which one’s perceptual experience was interpreted, but the requirement on gaining knowledge from experience cannot be that one must be bearing such propositions in mind. The same is true in the a priori domain. What is required before an a priori entitlement can be recognized cannot be that one has to entertain some prior knowledge of a proposition from which the entitlement can be deduced. To suppose that such occurent propositional knowledge is what is necessary for such moves would be to embark on the regress set by Lewis Carroll’s tortoise to Achilles (Carroll, 1895). What epistemic move-making requires is not knowledge of a proposition. The thing that it requires is the right sort of active attention.

The attentional requirements that have to be met before one can acquire knowledge from experience or recognize an a priori entitlement are not requirements merely for alertness. They are not captured merely by saying that, in order to gain knowledge, the thinker has to pay some attention to the relevant ideas. A thinker may be attending to a syllogism, but, if he is attending to its rhythm, he may still be unable to see that the conclusion follows. A non-question begging characterisation of the attentional requirements of knowledge acquisition in general would be an important contribution to epistemology. Current work on attention, focussing as it does on attention as a perceptual phenomenon, may only give us a part of the general theory that we need. Work on purely intellectual forms of attention continues to be scarce.

3.5 Attention and Voluntary Action

Attention’s involvement in voluntary action is a lot harder to study in a controlled way than is its involvement in perception. The theories of attention emerging from experimental psychology have, as a result, focussed almost exclusively on attention’s perceptual instances. In this respect they contrast with theories that were developed in the period before psychology and philosophy split, in which the action-involving aspects of attention were much more prominent. William James, for example, suggests in the Principles of Psychology that ‘volition is nothing but attention’ (James, 1890 p. 424), and at one time (in what might be read as an anticipation of the competition based theories discussed above§2.6) he proposed that “Attention, belief, affirmation, and motor volition, are […] four names for an identical process, incidental to the conflict of ideas alone, the survival of one in spite of the opposition of the others.” (1880).

The issues surrounding attention’s relationship to the voluntariness of action are parallel to some of the issues surrounding attention’s relationship to the consciousness of perception. It seems natural to think that attention is necessary for finely tuned behaviours, much as it seems necessary for the perception of fine detail. But it does not seem natural to think that we must be paying attention to the execution of every act that we voluntarily perform, any more than it seem natural to suppose that we must pay attention in order to be perceiving anything at all. A case could therefore be made, on commonsense grounds, for claiming that attention figures in the production of some but not all voluntary behaviours. One can imagine this view being challenged by a theorist who claimed that attention is necessary for any action to be voluntary, arguing that there is an illusion (analogous to the refrigerator light illusion) that gives us the mistaken impression that our inattentive acts are voluntary too. As in the case of attention and consciousness there is an epistemological puzzle about the sort of evidence that could settle this issue. This may be a topic for future research.

3.6 Attention and Virtue

Attention might also have a role to play in other philosophically interesting phenomena. This has been underexplored, particular with regard to the role of attention in ethics. Simone Weil suggests that attention has an absolutely central role in ethics, and in value theory more broadly, writing that:

The authentic and pure values – truth, beauty and goodness – in the activity of a human being are the result of one and the same act, a certain application of the full attention to the object. (Weil, 1986, p. 214)

Weil’s claims about attention’s import were developed in the work of Iris Murdoch, who suggests that there are some forms of attention that play an essential role in the exercise of the virtues (Murdoch, 1970, see Mole, 2006). More recently they have been taken up by Dorothea Debus, who places particular emphasis on Weil’s claim that it is full attention to which Weil attributes such cardinal value (Debus, 2015). Nicolas Bommarito has developed an account of modesty as a just such a ‘virtue of attention’, arguing that this avoids epistemic difficulties that other accounts of modesty face, if they characterize modesty as requiring false beliefs about the extent of one’s strengths (Bommarito, 2013).


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Other Internet Resources

  • Classics in The History of Psychology, maintained by Christopher D. Green, York University, Canada. Complete text of many classic works in psychology, including William James’s Principles of Psychology.
  • Reference Guide: Inattentional Blindness, maintained by Brian Scholl, Yale University. A comprehensive bibliography of psychological research on inattentional blindness. Also includes a link to online demonstrations of the inattentional blindness effects.
  • Reference Guide: Multiple Object Tracking, maintained by Brian Scholl, Yale University. a comprehensive bibliography of psychological research on multiple object tracking. Also includes a link to online demonstations of multiple object tracking tasks.
  • Attention, Scholarpedia article curated by Lawrence Ward, University of British Columbia, Canada.

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