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### Initial Value Problems

#### Discussion

All the examples we have worked so far have been to find all the solutions. We will now consider how to solve an initial value problem. Consider the example $$ \begin{align} \frac{dy}{dx}=xy-x \\ y(0)=2. \end{align}$$ We know how to find all the solutions to $\displaystyle\frac{dy}{dx}=xy-x$, but we want to find the particular solution that satisfies $y(0)=2$. To do this we just take the general solution, which is $y(x)=ke^{x^2/2}+1$ and plug in the condition $y(0)=2$. This yields $2=k+1$. We solve this equation for $k$ to get $k=1$ and the solution to the initial value problem is $y=e^{x^2/2}+1$. This technique works not just for separable equations but for all initial value problems.#### Paradigm

Solve the*initial value problem*$\displaystyle\frac{dy}{dx}=xy+x^2y,\qquad y(0)=2.$

*FIRST:* Find the general solution

Step 1: $\displaystyle \frac{dy}{y}=x+x^2\,dx$

Step 2: $$ \begin{align} \int \frac{dy}{y}&=\int x+x^2\,dx \\ \log|y|&=x^2/2+x^3/3+C \end{align} $$ Step 3: $\displaystyle y=ke^{x^2/2+x^3/3}$, ($k=\pm e^C$)

Step 4: We divided by $y$ and $y=0$ is a solution, but it is included in the general solution with $k=0$. There are no singular solutions.

*SECOND:* Plug in the initial value and solve for the arbitrary
constant.
$$ \begin{align}
y(0)=ke^0 &{\buildrel\text{set}\over =} 2 \\
k&=2
\end{align} $$
So $y(x)=2e^{x^2/2+x^3/3}$.

#### Example

Solve the initial value problem $\displaystyle\frac{dy}{dx}=xe^y$, $y(0)=1$.FIRST: Find the general solution.

Step 1: $\displaystyle e^{-y}\,dy=x\,dx$.

Step 2: $$\begin{align} \int e^{-y}\,dy&=\int x\,dx \\ -e^{-y}&=x^2/2+C \end{align} $$ Step 3: $y=-\log(-x^2/2-C)$.

SECOND: Plug in initial value and solve for the arbitrary constant. $$ \begin{align} y(0)=-\log(-0^2-C) &{\buildrel\text{set}\over =} 1 \\ \log(-C)&=-1 \\ -C&=e^{-1} \\ C&=-e^{-1} \end{align} $$ So $y(x)=-\log(-x^2/2+e^{-1})$.

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©2010, 2014 Andrew G. Bennett