Feminist Philosophy of Language

First published Fri Sep 3, 2004; substantive revision Mon Aug 21, 2017

Feminist philosophy of language has come a long way in a very short time period. Initially, most work in the area was critical, calling for changes either to language itself or to philosophy of language. More recently, however, the dynamic has changed, with the advent of several major positive research programmes within philosophy of language. In this entry, we first discuss the critiques that constitute the first phase of feminist work in this area, before moving onto the positive research programmes that have recently come to the fore. Our focus in this entry will generally be on the analytic tradition. For continental approaches, see the entries on feminist approaches to the intersection of analytic and continental philosophy, feminist approaches to the intersection of pragmatism and continental philosophy.

1. Critical work on language and philosophy of language

1.1 False gender-neutrality

There has been a great deal of feminist concern over the supposedly gender-neutral use of terms like ‘he’ and ‘man’. It is commonly said that these terms have both gender-specific meanings, as in sentences (1) and (2), and gender-neutral ones, as in sentences (3) and (4).

  1. He drank the wine.
  2. A man went into a bar.
  3. When a student comes into the room, he should pick up a handout.
  4. Man is a primate.

Feminists, however, have pointed out that even the supposed gender-neutral meanings of these terms are not really gender-neutral. Janice Moulton (1981a) and Adele Mercier (1995) provide examples in which there is no doubt that a gender-neutral meaning is intended, but this meaning seems unavailable. As a result, the sentences seem ill-formed:

  1. Man has two sexes; some men are female.
  2. Man breastfeeds his young.

We are, then, making a classificatory error if we claim that ‘man’ and ‘he’ are gender-neutral terms. In order to avoid such a classificatory error, we need to do more careful work on what the meanings of these terms actually are. Perhaps the meaning of ‘he’ that has been called ‘gender-neutral’ is not really gender-neutral, but something much more complex. Mercier suggests, for example, that we should understand the ‘gender-neutral’ use of ‘man’ as referring to either (a) a person or persons of unknown sex; or (b) males or a combination of males and females. This explains why ‘men’ in (5) and ‘man’ in (6) are anomalous: these terms are being used to refer exclusively to persons known to be female.

The supposed ‘gender-neutral’ meaning of these terms, then, is not truly gender neutral. But, on its own, this does not show that there is a problem with those uses that have traditionally been classified as gender-neutral, as in sentences (3) and (4). (Discovering that we have misclassified an adjective as an adverb would not show anything wrong with actual uses of the term in question.) Further reasons are needed in order to object to the use that is made of these terms.

1.2 Invisibility of women

Feminist concerns, however, go beyond mere classificatory ones. Feminists have also argued that terms like ‘he’ and ‘man’ contribute to making women invisible—that is, to obscuring women’s importance, and distracting attention from their existence. Fighting the invisibility of women is an important feminist project in many areas,[1] and language that makes one less likely to think of women clearly contributes to this invisibility. There is good psycholinguistic evidence that those who encounter sentences (like (3) and (4)) using the terms ‘he’ and ‘man’ think more readily of males than of females.[2] If this is right, then the use of these words can be seen as contributing to the invisibility of women. This gives feminists a good reason to object to the ‘gender-neutral’ use of these terms.

1.3 Maleness as norm

If one’s only worry concerned the obscuring of women’s presence, however, it would be difficult to object to certain other terms to which feminists do commonly object: gender-specific occupational terms like ‘manageress’ (still common in the UK, though not in the US) or ‘lady doctor’. These terms certainly do not contribute to the invisibility of women. Instead, they call attention to the presence of women. Moreover, they call attention to women’s presence in positions of authority—doctor and manager. Nonetheless, most feminists who think about language find these terms objectionable.

The clearest reason for objecting to ‘manageress’ and ‘lady doctor’ is that the use of these terms seems premised on the idea that maleness is the norm, and that women filling these jobs are somehow deviant versions of doctors and managers. This is also a key objection to the use of ‘he’ and ‘man’. Moulton (1981a) understands these terms on the model of brand names, like ‘Hoover’ or ‘Scotch tape’ that become generic terms for a product type. The message of such terms, she suggests, is that the brand in question is the best, or at least the norm. According to Moulton, terms like ‘he’ and ‘man’ work in the same manner: they are gender-specific terms for men whose use has been extended to cover both men and women. This, Moulton argues, carries the message that maleness is the norm. As a result, the use of these terms as if they were gender neutral constitutes a sort of symbolic insult to women. Laurence Horn and Steven R. Kleinedler (2000) have disputed the details of this, noting that ‘man’ did not begin its life as gender-specific and then get extended to cover both women and men. Rather, ‘man’ actually began its life as ‘mann’, a gender-neutral term, which only later acquired a gender-specific meaning. The temporal sequence, then, cannot support the claim that a gender-specific term has been extended to cover both genders. Nonetheless, Horn and Kleinedler agree that the use of terms like ‘he’ and ‘man’ as if they were gender-neutral perpetuates the objectionable idea that men are the norm for humanity.

1.4 Sex-marking

English, like most—but not all—languages, requires a great deal of what Marilyn Frye calls ‘sex marking’ (Frye 1983). For example, one cannot use pronouns to refer to a particular individual without knowing their sex. (Frye, in common with most feminists of the early 1980s, does not consider trans issues. She also does not consider the possibility that pronouns like ‘he’ and ‘she’ might be a matter of gender, not sex.) Frye notes the absurdity of this.

If I am writing a book review, the use of personal pronouns to refer to the author creates the need to know whether that person’s reproductive cells are the sort which produce ova or the sort which produce sperm. (Frye 1983: 22)

Singular personal pronoun usage, Frye argues, is impossible without knowing the sex of the person one is discussing, and in many cases sex would otherwise be utterly irrelevant. Frye takes this to be an instance of a general tendency to make sex relevant where it need not be, which she takes to be a key feature of sexism. In addition, she suggests, the constant need to know and indicate sex helps to perpetuate the conviction that sex is a tremendously important matter in all areas. For Frye, this is a key factor in perpetuating male dominance: male dominance requires the belief that men and women are importantly different from each other, so anything that contributes to the impression that sex differences are important is therefore a contributor to male dominance.

1.5 Encoding of male worldview

The idea that some terms encode a male worldview is initially a puzzling one. One thing that is meant by it is, roughly, that the meanings of certain terms seem to divide the world up in a way that is more natural for men than for women. Good examples of this come from the terms ‘foreplay’ and ‘sex’. ‘Sex’ is generally taken to refer to an act that is defined in terms of male orgasm, while the sexual activities during which many women have their orgasms are relegated to secondary status, referred to by terms like ‘foreplay’. These terms, then, can be seen as based in a male perspective on sex. (It is worth noting that the ‘male perspective’ claim need not rest on the (implausible) idea that this perspective is shared by all men. Rather, it can rest on claims about what is typical for men, or on the claim that the only perspective from which certain understandings make sense is a male one.) As a result, these terms may serve as a barrier to accurate communication or even thought about women’s experiences of sex (Cameron 1985; Moulton 1981b; Spender 1980 [1985]). Catharine MacKinnon and Sally Haslanger also discuss legal definitions of ‘rape’ as (among other things) involving more than ‘the normal level of force’, an understanding that seems committed to the idea that some level of force is acceptable in sexual relations (Haslanger 1995: 109; MacKinnon 1989: 173).

Languages may also lack words for things that matter a great deal to women. This sort of gap is another way that a language can be seen as encoding a male worldview. The term ‘sexual harassment’, for example, is a recent feminist innovation. Women’s discussion of their experiences led them to see a certain common element to many of their problems, and as a result they invented the term ‘sexual harassment’. Once the problem was named, it became much easier to fight sexual harassment, both legally and by educating people about it (Farley 1978; Spender 1985).

Miranda Fricker (2007) calls gaps such as that before the invention of the term ‘sexual harassment’ a form of hermeneutical injustice. Roughly speaking, this is what occurs when “some significant area of one’s social experience [is] obscured from collective understanding owing to” (2007: 155) a gap in communal linguistic/conceptual resources that is more damaging to those from a socially disadvantaged group (to which one belongs). In her Epistemic Injustice, Fricker connects this up with issues in both ethics and epistemology, especially epistemology of testimony. We discuss this more fully in 2.4, below.

1.6 Reform efforts: successes and limitations

Problems like those we have seen so far are relatively easy to discern. Moreover, it may seem that they would be relatively easy to correct—new terms can be invented, or alternative words can be used. Much feminist effort has been devoted to this endeavour, and a huge variety of reforms have been proposed (see, for example, Miller and Swift 1976, 1980, and the papers in part two of Cameron 1998a).

One especially successful reform effort has been the increasingly accepted singular use of the third-person gender-neutral pronoun ‘they’ (in place of ‘he’) as in the sentence below:

Somebody left their sweater behind.

A key reason for the success of this reform is perhaps the history of the singular ‘they’. As Ann Bodine has noted (1975 [1998]), the singular use of ‘they’ has a long history. It did not begin to be criticized until the 19th century, and despite all the efforts of prescriptive grammarians it has remained very popular in speech. Due to feminist work on the effects of ‘gender-neutral’ use of ‘he’, even prescriptive grammarians are now becoming more accepting of ‘they’. In very recent years, it is also becoming increasingly widespread to use ‘they’ as one’s chosen personal pronoun, or, less frequently, to use another gender-neutral option such as ‘ze’ (Bennett 2016; Dembroff and Wodak 2017).

Other reform efforts have met with greater difficulties. Even some that have caught on seem to have backfired. Susan Erlich and Ruth King (1992 [1998]), for example, discuss the case of ‘chairperson’, intended to serve as a gender-neutral replacement for ‘chairman’. Instead, in many places it is often used to indicate women who fill the post of chair, while men are referred to as ‘chairman’. They take this to show that reforms cannot succeed unless attitudes change as well.

Moreover, feminist work on language has also indicated that there may be problems which are simply not amenable to piecemeal linguistic reforms. Some difficulties that have been raised go well beyond a handful of problematic terms or gaps. Deborah Cameron offers striking examples of writing that take males as the norm without using any particular terms to which one might object, such as the following, from The Sunday Times:

The lack of vitality is aggravated by the fact that there are so few able-bodied young adults about. They have all gone off to work or look for work, leaving behind the old, the disabled, the women and the children. (Cameron 1985: 85)

Clearly, in the above example, ‘able-bodied young adult’ is being used in such a way as to exclude women. Moreover, examples like this (and others Cameron provides) pass unnoticed by newspaper editors and many readers. There is clearly a problem, but it is not a problem that can be pinpointed by picking out some particular term as objectionable and in need of reform. Eliminating language use that takes males as the norm, then, must involve more than changing a few terms or usage rules.

1.7 Maleness of language

Some feminists (e.g., Penelope 1990; Spender 1985) argue that English is, in some quite general sense, male. (Corresponding arguments are also put forward about other languages.) One thing that is meant by this is that English can be said to be male in a manner similar to that in which particular terms can be said to be male—by encoding a male worldview, by helping to subordinate women or to render them invisible, or by taking males as the norm. One sort of argument for this begins from the examination of large quantities of specific terms, and the identification of patterns of male bias, and proceeds from this to the conclusion that the male bias of English is so widespread that it is a mistake to locate the problem in a collection of words, rather than in the language as a whole. The first stage of this sort of argument is, obviously, a lengthy and complex one. The sorts of claims (in addition to those we have already seen) cited include (a) that there are more words for males than for females in English, and that more of these words are positive (Spender 1985: 15, citing Julia Stanley 1977); (b) that a “word for women assume[s] negative connotations even where it designated the same state or condition as it did for men” (Spender 1985: 17), as with ‘spinster’ and ‘bachelor’; (c) that words for women are far more frequently sexualized than words for men, and that this holds true even for neutral words, when they are applied to women. Dale Spender, citing Lakoff (1975), discusses the example of ‘professional’, comparing ‘he’s a professional’ and ‘she’s a professional’, and noting that the latter is far more likely than the former to be taken to mean that the person in question is a prostitute. The sexualisation of words for women is considered especially significant by the many feminists who take sexual objectification to be a crucial element, if not the root, of inequalities between women and men. (For more on such examples, see also Baker 1992.)

This widespread encoding of male bias in language is, according to theorists like Spender, just what we should expect. Males (though not, as she notes, all of them) have had far more power in society, and this, she claims has included the power to enforce, through language, their view of the world. Moreover, she argues, this has served to enhance their power.

There is sexism in language, it does enhance the position of males, and males have had control over the production of cultural forms. (Spender 1985: 144)

This, Spender claims, provides circumstantial evidence that “males have encoded sexism into language to consolidate their claims of male supremacy” (Spender 1985: 144). Spender takes the evidence for this claim to be far more than circumstantial, however, and to support it she discusses the efforts of prescriptive grammarians. These include, for example, the claim that males should be listed before females because “the male gender was the worthier gender” (Spender 1985: 147, emphasis hers), and the efforts (noted earlier) to establish ‘he’ as the gender-neutral third-person English pronoun.

According to theorists like Spender, men’s ability to control language gives them great power indeed. We have already seen ways in which what one might call the maleness of language contributes to the invisibility of women (with respect to words like ‘he’ and ‘man’). If one takes the maleness of language to go beyond a few specific terms, one will take language’s power to make women invisible to be even stronger. We have also seen ways that what might be called maleness can make it more difficult for women to express themselves. Where we lack words for important female experiences, like sexual harassment, women will find it more difficult to describe key elements of their existence. Similarly, where the words we have—like ‘foreplay’—systematically distort women’s experiences, women will have a difficult time accurately conveying the realities of their lives. If one takes such problems to go beyond selected particular terms, and to infect language as a whole, it is natural to suppose that women are to a large degree silenced—unable to accurately articulate key elements of their lives, and unable to communicate important aspects of their thoughts. Spender and others also suggest that the maleness of language constrains thought, imposing a male worldview on all of us, and making alternative visions of reality impossible, or at least very difficult to articulate. These arguments often draw upon the so-called Sapir-Whorf hypothesis (Sapir 1921; Whorf 1956). It is generally formulated very vaguely, but seems to amount to roughly the hypothesis that “our worldview is determined by the structures of the particular language that we happen to speak” (Cameron 1998b: 150).

(There is substantial controversy about what this means, and about the accuracy of attributing it to either Sapir or Whorf, but this controversy is not very relevant to the present entry.)

Some suggest that male power over language allows men to shape not just thought, but also reality. For example, Spender claims that men “created language, thought, and reality” (1985: 143). This is a very strong version of what Haslanger has called discursive constructivism.[3] She defines this view as follows:

Something is discursively constructed just in case it is the way it is, to some substantial extent, because of what is attributed (and/or self-attributed) to it. (Haslanger 1995: 99)

Feminists like Spender and Catherine MacKinnon (1989) argue that male power over language has allowed them to create reality. This is partly due to the fact that our categorizations of reality inevitably depend on our social perspective: “there is no ungendered reality or ungendered perspective” (MacKinnon 1989: 114). Haslanger (1995) discusses this argument in detail.

In general, the solution suggested is not to attempt to create a neutral language that can accurately capture reality in itself, a goal they would take to be nonsense. Instead, we must aim to create a new reality more congenial to women. Some feminists have argued that the only way to achieve this is for women to create their own language, either by redefining terms already in use, or by inventing a new language, with new words and new rules. Only in this way, they suggest, will women be able to break free from the constraints of male language and male thought, to articulate a competing vision for the world, and to work toward it (Daly and Caputi 1987; Elgin 1985; MacKinnon 1989; Penelope 1990; Spender 1985). Lynne Tirrell (1993) offers an especially sophisticated and complex discussion of this idea.

The claims discussed above concerning the maleness of English, its causes, and its effects, are far from uncontentious. First, the extent of male bias in language is debatable. Although it is right that there is much to worry feminists about a wide variety of specific terms and usages, it is far from clear that it is appropriate to claim that English is male-biased in some sweeping sense. It is also unclear exactly what the claim being made is. If this claim is taken to be that every term is male-biased, then it is highly implausible: it is very unlikely that there is a male bias present in ‘piano’ or ‘isotope’. If the claim is simply that there is much for feminists to object to, then it is almost certainly right—but it is far from obvious that it is useful to focus on such a general claim rather than on specific problems, their complexities and their possible solutions (Cameron 1998b).

Next, the power that men have undeniably exercised in society (though, importantly, some groups of men have been vastly less powerful than others) by no means translates to a general power over language. Language is a difficult thing to control, as those who have attempted to create languages have learned. The main power men have had has concerned dictionaries, usage guides, and laws. While these are enormously important in shaping reality, and in shaping our thoughts, it is quite a leap to move from this power to the claim that men ‘created language, thought, and reality’.

The claimed effects of the maleness of language are also problematic. We have already seen problems for the idea that men control language. The idea that men also control or create thought and reality faces further problems. The ability of feminists to successfully point out ways in which elements of language have obscured women’s experiences counts strongly against the claim that men control thought (Cameron 1998b); and, as Haslanger (1995) has argued in detail, discursive constructivism about reality is unsustainable. Nonetheless, it does seem right to notice that problems with specific terms can render it more difficult for women to communicate about important elements of their lives, and probably also more difficult to reflect upon these elements (Hornsby 1995). These difficulties could perhaps be described as partial silencing, partial constraint of thought, or hermeneutical injustice (Fricker 2007), which we discuss more fully in 2.4.

If the criticisms above are right, then women certainly do not need to create their own language. Many welcome this conclusion, worried that a women’s language would doom women’s thoughts to marginality and impede feminist progress. Moreover, the idea that women could craft a common language that allowed the articulation of all their experiences seems to ignore the fact that women differ enormously from one another (Crenshaw 1991; Lugones and Spelman 1983; Spelman 1988; see the section on feminism and the diversity of women in the entry on topics in feminism). If women cannot use the same language as men, why should we suppose that women can successfully share a language?

1.8 Metaphor

Feminists have also devoted attention to another aspect of language—the use of metaphor (see the section Feminist Critiques and Conceptions of Objectivity in the entry on feminist epistemology and philosophy of science; and the entry on feminist approaches to the intersection of pragmatism and continental philosophy). In particular, feminists have discussed the use of gendered metaphors in philosophy and in science.[4] Emily Martin (1991 [1996]) offers particularly vivid examples in her discussion of the use of gendered metaphors in discussions of human reproduction.

At its extreme, the age-old relationship of the egg and the sperm takes on a royal or religious patina. The egg coat, its protective barrier, is sometimes called its ‘vestments’, a term usually reserved for sacred, religious dress. The egg is said to have a ‘corona’, a crown, and to be accompanied by ‘attendant cells’. It is holy, set apart and above, the queen to the sperm’s king. The egg is also passive, which means it must depend on the sperm for rescue. Gerald Schatten and Helen Schatten liken the egg’s role to that of Sleeping Beauty: ‘a dormant bride awaiting her mate’s magic kiss, which instills the spirit that brings her to life’. Sperm, by contrast, have a ‘mission’ which is to ‘move through the female genital tract in quest of the ovum’. One popular account has it that the sperm carry out a ‘perilous journey’ into the ‘warm darkness’, where some fall away ‘exhausted’. ‘Survivors’ ‘assault’ the egg, the successful candidates ‘surrounding the prize’… (Martin 1996: 106)

The vision of reproduction suggested above is an inaccurate one. The sperm fails to behave in the single-minded manner suggested. Instead, the

sideways motion of the sperm’s tail makes the head move sideways with a force that is ten times stronger than its forward movement…in fact, its strongest tendency, by tenfold, is to escape by attempting to pry itself off the egg. (Martin 1996: 108)

Nor is the egg passive: adhesive molecules on its surface play a crucial role in overcoming the sperm’s tendency to pry itself away (Martin 1996: 108). Martin argues that scientists have been slow to discover these facts, partly due to the metaphors they employed; and that even as they have learned these facts they have been slow to update their metaphors. Gendered stereotypes, Martin suggests, can impair our understanding of reproduction—by leading scientists to employ misleading metaphors that conceal the truth. The use of gendered stereotypes in scientific imagery can also help to perpetuate damaging stereotypes, for example by reinforcing the tendency to see females as passive. Martin’s account has, however, been challenged by Paul Gross (1998), who argues that scientists were not nearly so slow to these discoveries as Martin claimed. If Gross is right, then the problematic metaphors did not affect scientists’ work in the ways suggested by Martin (though they do seem to have affected popular writing on the subject.)

Gendered metaphors have been used at many levels of discussion, including the most general. An important topic of feminist concern has been the historical tendency to conceive of the scientific endeavour in gendered ways. A particularly clear example comes from Francis Bacon, discussed by both Evelyn Fox Keller and Genevieve Lloyd:

For Bacon, the promise of science is expressed as ‘leading you to Nature with all her children to bind her to your service and make her your slave’. (Keller 1996: 36.)

The tendency to describe nature in feminine terms is a long-standing and widespread one, well-documented in Lloyd (1984). Lloyd links this to a tendency to describe reason and the mind as male, and to contrast these with supposedly feminine emotions and bodies. She argues that these metaphors play a powerful role in the history of philosophy, shaping and often distorting our views both of reason, mind, emotion, and body and of men and women. Other important discussions of gendered metaphors in philosophy include Irigaray (1974 [1985a], 1977 [1985b]), Le Dœuff (1980 [1990]), and Nye (1990, 1992).

1.9 Philosophy of Language

In the early days of feminist philosophy of language, much attention was devoted to ways that philosophy of language was problematic from a feminist point of view. One sort of criticism was that philosophy of language, like English, displays a male bias. Another was simply that philosophy of language is ill-equipped to further feminist aims. Those making these criticisms did not suggest that philosophy of language be abandoned, but rather that it should be reformed—purged of male bias and turned into a discipline that can help in the attainment of feminist ends.

What reasons were given for supposing that philosophy of language is ill suited to achieving feminist ends? There were a variety of reasons (Hintikka and Hintikka 1983; Hornsby 2000; Nye 1996, 1998), but one common thread involves the idea that philosophy of language is excessively individualistic. Criticism of individualism in philosophy is widespread in many areas of feminism. Exactly what ‘individualism’ comes to varies depending upon the area of philosophy under discussion, and depending also on the concerns of the particular critic. (For more on what feminists mean by ‘individualism’, see Antony 1995.) Because of this, we will not attempt a general definition of ‘individualism’, as used by those raising these concerns. However, we will sketch what seems to be at issue in concerns over philosophy of language. Some claim that philosophy of language focuses excessively on the states of mind of individual speakers—in particular on their intentions (Hornsby 2000). Jennifer Hornsby’s central example of this tendency is the work of H. P. Grice, which does indeed analyse speaker meaning in terms of speaker intentions. (Although it is worth noting that that Grice’s analysis of sentence meaning incorporates social elements, and that both speaker and audience are essential to his notion of conversational implicature. For more on this, see Saul 2002.) Others suggest that semantics assigns too important a role to the notion of reference to discrete individuals (Hintikka and Hintikka 1983). Their focus is on Alfred Tarski’s truth definitions (Tarski 1956; see also entry on Tarski’s truth definitions) and Richard Montague’s work (Thomason 1974).

Individualism of this sort is said to be problematic for several reasons. One common claim is that this sort of individualism is characteristic of male thinking. Men tend, according to this line of thought, to be interested in separate, discrete individuals; while women are interested in connections and relationships. Thus, it is suggested, an individualistic philosophy of language is one that represents a male way of thinking about the world. For philosophy of language to be true to the experiences and language use of both men and women, then, the individualistic philosophy of language which is characteristic of male thinking will need to be supplemented or replaced by a version more suited to female thinking (Hintikka and Hintikka 1983; Hornsby 2000). As Haslanger (2000a) and others have noted, however, the claims regarding male and female thinking on which this line of thought depends are not well supported. Moreover, differences among women give us reason to doubt the prospects for any supportable generalizations about ‘women’s’ thinking (Ang 1995, Lorde 1983, Lugones and Spelman 1983; Moody-Adams 1991).

Other objections to individualism do not depend upon contentious psychological claims about differences between women and men. Instead, they suggest that the real problem with individualism is its failure to appreciate the importance of the social. The social world is, naturally, an important area of concern when discussing politics and power relations. Understanding how people come to dominate one another, and exactly how this domination functions, are important projects for feminists. Language is an important part of the social world, and understanding the roles that language plays in communicating, manipulating, and controlling (to cite just a few examples) is surely vital to understanding the workings of power (see, for example, MacKinnon’s views on speech in MacKinnon 1993). So, many feminists suggest, a philosophy of language that is appropriate to understanding communicative interactions in the social world could be a valuable tool for feminists. However, they insist that the individualism of philosophy of language (as it is now) prevents it from serving this function (Hornsby 2000).

The general charge that philosophy of language pays little attention to the social world is not one that all feminists would agree with. Indeed, it is a difficult one to sustain in light of the prominence of—to give a few examples—Saul Kripke’s causal theory of reference (1972; see also Section 2 of the entry on reference), Hilary Putnam’s arguments for a social element (the division of linguistic labor) in the working of kind terms (1975; see also Section 3 of the entry on reference), H.P. Grice’s theory of conversation (1975 [1989]), David Lewis’s work on convention (1969), and J.L. Austin’s speech act theory (1962 [1975]). Nonetheless, one might well suggest that philosophers of language have generally attended only to aspects of the social world that are not of particular interest to feminists. While causal theories of reference undeniably involve social elements, these social elements don’t seem to be of the sort that concern feminists; while Putnam’s division of linguistic labour arguably involves some power relations (experts have a special sort of linguistic power that non-experts lack), the political aspects of these power relations—if any—have been ignored. Andrea Nye criticizes mainstream philosophy of language on roughly these grounds, arguing that work on radical translation has not been sufficiently sensitive to political concerns (for the notion of radical translation, see the section on Meaning and Truth in the entry on Donald Davidson).

…a highly technical and professionalized English-speaking philosophy of language was addressing problems of the possibility of ‘radical’ translation from one language community to another, of alternate and incommensurable conceptual schemes, of the difficulty of establishing singular reference across ‘different worlds’, but with virtually no reference to actual failures of communication or problems of gender. (Nye 1998: 266)

More recently, Louise Antony has argued that it is a mistake to suppose that there is any particular approach to philosophy of language that is distinctly feminist or anti-feminist, taking as her particular target Hornsby’s work—but her arguments apply more broadly. She argues that such strategies are “disrespectful to and exclusionary of feminists who support alternative views” (2012: 277).

2. Positive research programmes in philosophy of language

Things have changed a great deal in recent years, and it is now widely accepted that philosophy of language has something to offer feminists, and even (though less widely) that feminists have something to offer philosophy of language. Feminist philosophy of language is now becoming a well-established area of the larger field, with several substantial positive research programmes.

2.1 Feminism and Speech Act Theory

The first substantial analytic research programme in feminist philosophy of language began with Rae Langton’s and Hornsby’s use of speech act theory to make sense of Catharine MacKinnon’s suggestion that pornography silences and subordinates women. It has now, however, evolved well beyond those beginnings. To give some flavour of this initial work, we briefly summarise Langton’s discussion of silencing.

According to Langton (1993), pornography helps to bring about rape by perlocutionarily and illocutionarily silencing women. Following Austin, Langton distinguishes between locutionary, illocutionary, and perlocutionary acts. A locutionary act is, roughly, the act of uttering words that have particular meanings; a perlocutionary act is, roughly, the act of uttering words that have a particular effect; and an illocutionary act is the act done in uttering the words. Consider, for example, Jennifer Saul’s utterance one day of the sentence ‘I pledge my allegiance to Her Majesty the Queen and all her heirs’. The locutionary act she performed was simply the utterance of a sentence with a particular meaning. This act had many perlocutionary effects: it made it possible for her to get a British passport, it made her feel slightly disturbed at having expressed such monarchist sentiments, and it made her wonder whether a republic, should it succeed the Queen, would count as an heir. The illocutionary act she performed was that of becoming a British citizen.

Langton proposes that there are forms of silencing corresponding to each of these sorts of speech act. A person is locutionarily silenced if she is prevented from speaking, or intimidated into not speaking. A person is illocutionarily silenced if she is unable to carry out the acts that she intends to carry out in speaking. A person is perlocutionarily silenced when her speech cannot have its intended effects. Langton is particularly concerned with the role that perlocutionary and illocutionary silencing may play in rape. A woman’s refusal to have sex is perlocutionarily silenced if—even though she is recognized as refusing—she is forced to have sex. Her (attempted) refusal to have sex is illocutionarily silenced if it is not even recognized as a refusal. (For an exploration of the role of conventions in this illocutionary silencing, see Wyatt 2009.) In such a case, according to Langton, it isn’t a refusal. She suggests that pornography plays a key role in making men less able to recognise women’s refusals as refusals and more willing to rape women even when they recognise women’s refusals. This means, she argues, that pornography illocutionarily and perlocutionarily silences women. And this silencing is an important one, as it results in rape.

This example can also help us to see that some elements of individualism may be indispensable to feminism (for more arguments to this effect, see Antony 1995). Assuming that Langton’s arguments are sound, we can see an important role for individualistic philosophy of language in feminism. Although it is right that focusing exclusively on individual speakers’ intentions would prevent us from seeing some important facts (as Hornsby 2000 argues), it also vital to recognise the importance of paying some attention to an individual speaker’s intentions. In order to understand what has gone wrong in the illocutionary silencing described above, one needs to understand that the woman intended to be refusing sex. In order to understand what has gone wrong in the perlocutionary silencing example, one needs to understand that the woman intended her refusal to bring it about that she did not have sex. More generally, not being understood properly is an important element of life in a subordinate position, as many feminists have noted. In order to make sense of not being understood properly, one needs to attend to what the speaker intended and how the audience understood the speaker, and how these things differ. To do this, one needs to look at individual states of mind.

These discussions have inspired a now substantial literature. Below, we give some very non-comprehensive pointers to this literature.

  1. Some critics (e.g., Dworkin 1991, 1993; Jacobson 1995) have argued that any silencing which may result from pornography is not of the sort that free speech law should attempt to protect. (Responses to these criticisms can be found in Hornsby and Langton 1998; Langton 2009a; and West 2003.)
  2. Others, such as Leslie Green (1998), have argued that pornography does not have the sort of authority needed to carry out acts of subordination and silencing. Langton (2009b) has responded to this criticism; and Mary Kate McGowan (2003) has argued that the sort of authority needed for the acts in question is really quite a modest and ordinary sort of conversational authority. Nellie Wieland (2007), like McGowan, thinks that there is no need for the sort of authority that worries Green. However, she argues that Langton’s account runs the risk of absolving rapists from culpability for their crimes. (Jacobson 1995 also raises this culpability worry.) McGowan and Maitra (2010) have responded to this, as do McGowan, Adelman, Helmers, and Stolzenberg (2010).
  3. Jennifer Saul (2006a) worries about Langton’s claim that pornography itself is a speech act, arguing that only utterances in contexts can be speech acts. Moreover, she suggests that if Langton’s claim is revised to be one about acts of viewing or showing pornography it loses its plausibility. Claudia Bianchi (2008) criticizes this, and Mari Mikkola (2008) responds.
  4. A further concern about context comes from Tirrell (1999). Tirrell argues that MacKinnon assigns pornography an authority so strong that women would be unable to successfully articulate their own experiences. She suggests that MacKinnon’s picture needs revising to make room for the successful communication that takes place between feminists.
  5. Alexander Bird (2002), Daniel Jacobson (1995) and Ishani Maitra (2009) all raise worries about the Austinian distinction between illocution and perlocution and its role in the silencing argument (in particular, about the requirement that illocutions must be understood to be successful). For Bird and Jacobson this leads to a rejection of the silencing argument, but Maitra instead re-frames it in Gricean terms. Angela Grünberg (2014) argues that the silencing argument should be reconceived to focus not on illocutionary silencing, but on locutionary or rhetic silencing. She suggests that this allows a satisfying response to criticisms like those from Bird and Jacobson. Mikkola (2011a) also defends Langton-Hornsby against Bird and Jacobson.
  6. Judith Butler (1990) objects to the silencing argument on several grounds, chief among them (a) that it assumes an implausible picture of language use; and (b) that silencing does not matter in the way that Langton and Hornsby think that it does. Langton (2009c) has responded to this worry.
  7. Alex Davies (2016) argues that pornography may not just alter the illocutionary force of women’s utterances, but also block her from making utterances with the content that she desires. Davies’s central example is the way that rape myths, perpetuated by pornography, may make it impossible for women in courtroom cross examinations to express the truth about their experiences.

This use of speech act theory was one of the first developments of feminist philosophy of language to gain mainstream currency, and it has become widely taught and studied. Recently, however, sharply critical feminist voices have started to emerge. Separately, and for different reasons, Nancy Bauer (2015) and Lorna Finlayson (2014), have both argued that the feminist literature on speech acts and pornography is deeply misguided. Bauer objects on several grounds. She thinks it is misguided to treat pornography as speech, and she (like other critics noted above) argues that pornography should not be seen as authoritative. Her more fundamental critique, though, is that this literature fails to take seriously the realities of both pornography and women’s subordination—by not engaging sufficiently with the phenomenology of pornography use; by not attending to all the ways that the broader culture is involved in subordinating women; and by focusing on just women’s verbal acts of refusal, thereby failing to appreciate the fuller dehumanization involved in sexual assault. This is part of a broader critique, for Bauer, of both analytic philosophy in general, and widespread understandings of Austin. Finlayson goes even further, arguing not that Austin’s work was misused by feminists but that it never should have been used at all. She suggests that the feminist foray into speech act theory was entirely unnecessary, and also that the focus on pornography was misguided.

But there have also been very substantial developments broadening and building upon the feminist use of speech theory—extending it to issues like racist speech, and hate speech more generally. McGowan (2009a) argues for the existence of a different sort of silencing due to pornography; and in her 2009b she argues that speech may be counted not just as silencing or subordinating, but also as oppressing. Moreover, she suggests that oppressive speech is likely to be a very widespread phenomenon. These ideas are developed further in McGowan (2012), which takes as its focus racist speech, and in Simpson (2013). Maitra (2012) also applies ideas from feminist work on subordinating speech to racist speech. Langton also turns her attention to hate speech more broadly, including in her 2012. This paper is also notable for its focus on the role of pragmatics in shaping attitudes other than belief. Rachel McKinney (2016), “Extracted Speech”, builds on this literature by exploring the ways that speech may be unjustly extracted rather than silenced (as in, for example, the paradigm case of the Central Park Five’s false confessions). Rebecca Kukla introduces the notion of discursive injustice, in order to discuss a broader range of ways that “members of a disadvantaged group face a systematic inability to produce a specific kind of speech act they are entitled to perform” (2014: 440), which often takes the form of performing a different speech act from the one that they intend. Although she draws on Langton and Hornsby, she abandons their focus on illocution and perlocution, focussing instead simply on performative force. Also considering the role of pragmatics in politics (though developed independently from Langton and Hornsby), Marina Sbisà (1999) explores the role of presuppositions in political persuasion. Finally, Jason Stanley (2015) draws heavily on Langton and Hornsby’s work in developing his account of propaganda (focused, but not exclusively, on racist propaganda).

2.2 On the Meaning of ‘Woman’

In her ground-breaking paper “Gender and Race: (What) Are They? (What) Do We Want Them To Be?” (2000b), Haslanger aims to provide an account of the nature of gender, as well as an account of the meaning of ‘woman’. She assumes the classical distinction between sex and gender, where sex is supposed to refer to biological or anatomical properties distinguishing males from females (although as she argues, this distinction is flexible and permeated by social and political factors too), and gender is supposed to refer to social or cultural factors distinguishing men from women (see the entry on feminist perspectives on sex and gender). One of the main virtues of Haslanger’s article is that she makes explicit the methodological approach that she endorses, to wit: she famously distinguishes between a descriptive project, which aims to reveal the concept that we actually use or the property that we actually track with our usage of the term, and an analytical project (or an ameliorative project, as she calls it in Haslanger 2006), which aims to reveal the concept that we should use or the meaning that we should associate to the corresponding term, given our purposes and aims in that inquiry. As she makes clear, she is following the analytical or ameliorative approach, with the explicit aim of providing an account of the meaning of ‘gender’ and ‘woman’ that could be a useful tool in order to fight sexism and help to achieve social justice. With this purpose in mind, she comes up with the following definition of the term ‘woman’, as one particular type of gender:

S is a woman iffdef S is systematically subordinated along some dimension (economic, political, legal, social, etc.) and S is “marked” as a target for this treatment by observed or imagined bodily features presumed to be evidence of a female’s biological role in reproduction. (2000b: 39)

As we can see, the main idea of Haslanger’s account is that gender is a hierarchical social structure, where some members are situated in a position of privilege and some other members are situated in a position of subordination along social, economic, political, legal, or cultural dimensions, in virtue of their real or imagined biological role in reproduction. And more particularly, being a woman corresponds to occupying a specific position of subordination with respect to this social structure, due to one’s perceived or imagined biologically female bodily features.

Haslanger’s proposal gave rise to a rich debate about the virtues of an ameliorative approach, and the advantages and problems of this particular account. For instance, Saul (2006b) argued that this proposed usage of the term ‘woman’ could have some problematic consequences, such as feminists having to advocate for the eradication of women, since feminists advocate for the eradication of the subordination of people in terms of their biological role in reproduction. For this reason, Saul argued, this might not be the most advantageous way of using the term ‘woman’. In addition, Saul argued that the folk or ordinary concept of ‘woman’ does not really distinguish between sex as a biological feature and gender as a social or cultural feature. Following up on this, Mikkola (2011b) argued that it might be very costly to revise the ordinary meaning of ‘woman’ in considerable ways as Haslanger suggests, since this might jeopardize communication, in addition to the fact that gender identity and the label ‘woman’ might be a source of identity and pride for many women. Therefore, to characterize being a woman in terms of being subordinated, as Haslanger does, might not be politically useful for the aims of feminism. Mikkola (2011b) put forward an alternative account of ‘woman’ that does not endorse the sex/gender distinction: rather, she proposed a trait/norm covariance model, according to which there are different traits that are assigned to men or women (or males or females) at a certain context, and that are expected to be followed and instantiated. However, the different traits that are assigned to men or to women are heavily context-dependent and flexible, and it is possible to revise both the assignment of traits and the norms and expectations involving them, in virtue of many kinds of factors, including moral and political considerations.

More recently, several feminists have argued that an account of ‘woman’ along the lines of Haslanger’s proposal might fail to do justice to the aims of trans women, which should be central for the purposes of feminism. For example, Saul (2012) argues that neither standard sex-based accounts nor standard gender-based accounts are automatically going to be inclusive of trans women, since (at least some) trans women could arguably turn out to be excluded from the extension of the term ‘woman’ when defined in terms of biological features, or in terms of certain social and cultural factors that are usually attributed to biologically female individuals. Saul put forward a possible alternative view, namely, a contextualist view of the meaning of ‘woman’, as follows:

X is a woman is true in a context C iff X is human and relevantly similar (according to the standards at work in C) to most of those possessing all of the biological markers of female sex. (2012: 201)

According to this account, an individual will fall under the extension of ‘woman’ in a certain context when she is sufficiently similar to those who are biologically female, given the standards of similarity that are relevant in such context, where these standards can vary from context to context. Saul argues that at first sight, this view seems to give the right results, since it would classify trans women as women in most contexts where, say, self-identifying as a woman is what is deemed relevant, but on further reflection, she argues, the view can give unwanted results. For example, in a conservative community where most speakers take for granted that trans women should not be allowed to use women’s toilets, their usage of ‘woman’ would be such that trans women would not fall under the term, since the relevant criterion of similarity in that context that those conservative speakers have in mind seems to be something like having certain chromosomes or certain anatomical features, which some trans women lack. In response to this worry, E. Diaz-Leon (2016) has argued that we can understand the contextualist view in a way that avoids this objection. In particular, she argues, we can understand the relevant standards of similarity at work in each context as those criteria that are the most politically useful, given the aims and purposes that are morally salient in that context. For example, in the context of a conservative community where trans women are not allowed to use women’s toilets, there are moral reasons for focusing on criteria such as self-identifying as a woman, rather than having certain biological features, and this is what makes this criterion the relevant one in that context, and hence what fixes the extension of ‘woman’ in that context, as required.

Talia Bettcher (2013) has also argued that ameliorative accounts of the meaning of ‘woman’ should take into account the aims of trans women. She argues that “single-meaning” views, according to which ‘woman’ has a unique meaning that is shared by all speakers, cannot do justice to those aims. Instead, she puts forward a “multiple-meaning” account, according to which there are several co-existing meanings of the term ‘woman’ in our society, but where some of those meanings embed world-views that are not only morally and politically problematic, but also factually misguided, such as using ‘woman’ in a trans-exclusionary way. Because of this, we have good reasons for using the term ‘woman’ in our speech with the trans-inclusive meaning that trans-friendly communities already associate with the term. She also argues that although it is methodologically useful to rely on intuitions, “it is inappropriate to dismiss alternative ways in which those terms are actually used in trans subcultures; such usage needs to be taken into consideration as part of the analysis” (2013: 235).

More recently, Katharine Jenkins (2016) has argued that Haslanger’s original proposal excluded trans women from the extension of the term ‘woman’, which is morally and politically problematic. As Jenkins argues, trans women who do not pass as cis women (that is, those women who were assigned female at birth) do not occupy a position of subordination in virtue of their perceived or imagined bodily features presumed to be evidence of a female biological role in reproduction, since they are not presumed to have a female biological role in reproduction (given that they do not pass as cis women). For this reason, Haslanger’s account cannot capture the self-identity of those trans women as women, and the ways in which they are subordinated in virtue of their gender identity. In order to solve this problem, Jenkins proposes an ingenious account of gender in terms of two elements, namely, gender as a social class, and gender as social identity, where the former is similar to Haslanger’s notion of gender as social structures, and the latter has to do with our own perceptions of our own positioning within those social structures. Following Haslanger’s (2005) account of racial identity, Jenkins suggests an account of gender identity in terms of mental maps that serve to guide our own behavior, norms and expectations within the social niches that we live in. (For criticism of Jenkins’ account as insufficiently inclusive of trans women, see Andler 2017.)

In this section we have focused on semantic accounts of the meaning of ‘woman’, although recently there has also been an explosion of work about the related questions of the metaphysics of gender as a social class, and biological sex as a contested category. Some of these discussions have implications for the meanings of the corresponding terms of ‘woman’ and ‘female’. For example, Saray Ayala and Nadya Vasilyeva (2015) provide an account of biological sex in terms of extended, flexible biological features, where which features count for being male or female can change from context to context, depending on our aims and purposes, and where those extended biological features can be taken to incorporate features of the environment, artificial bodily features, and so on. On the other hand, Helen Daly (2015) has argued that we should favour accounts of ‘female’ and ‘woman’ that do not assume a sharp cut-off point between those who fall under the term and those who do not, since this is morally and politically problematic. In addition, Jennifer McKitrick (2015) has argued that an account of gender in terms of dispositions to behave in certain ways can be politically useful, and can capture the aims of trans women. Finally, Haslanger (2016) has defended a context-sensitive account of ‘sex’, where the term can have different meanings, depending on the aims and purposes of the inquiry in that context.

2.3. Ameliorative Projects and Conceptual Engineering

As we saw in the previous section, Haslanger (2000b) brought attention to the need for revisionary or ameliorative approaches in feminist philosophy, as opposed to purely conceptual or descriptive approaches, which focus on the concept we have or the objective type that we actually track. The idea of a revisionary or ameliorative approach to the analysis of our concepts has been a very influential one in philosophy, but Haslanger’s work has served as a kind of reminder of the significance of aiming for the concepts that would best serve our purposes and aims, rather than merely revealing the ordinary concepts that we happen to have, which is the task that many projects in recent mainstream analytic philosophy seem to have paid attention to. Haslanger’s work has inspired a lot of interesting ameliorative projects in philosophy of gender and race and social philosophy more in general (see for instance Glasgow 2006, 2009 and Mallon 2006 on ‘race’, Barnes 2016 on ‘disability’, Dembroff 2016 on ‘sexual orientation’, as well as many of the papers on ‘woman’, ‘sex’ and ‘gender’ cited in the previous section). As suggested above, the notion of an ameliorative project in philosophy is not new, but in our view the impetus that this methodological approach in philosophy has experienced recently owes much to the centrality that this notion has played in recent developments in philosophy of gender and race over the last two decades.

As ameliorative projects are becoming more common in mainstream analytic philosophy, they have given rise to a careful examination of the methodological foundations and the metaphysical, semantic and epistemic aspects of the ameliorative approach, as well as its moral and political implications. Alexis Burgess and David Plunkett (2013a,b) have usefully surveyed these and related issues pertaining to ameliorative projects in philosophy, and have coined a new label: conceptual ethics. They intend this new term to refer to the philosophical reflection about the terms and concepts that we ought to use in different areas, given our best normative reasoning, as well as the methodological and philosophical issues to which these projects give rise. Examples include the nature of the values and normative considerations that should guide our choice of terms and concepts, as well as semantic questions about the nature and possibility of conceptual change and conceptual revision, among many others. One of the advantages of having this new label is that discussions on these normative issues about our talk and thought that were formerly scattered can now be more unified and more systematic.

Another term that is becoming prominent in this area is that of conceptual engineering, which is supposed to refer to ameliorative projects that aim to revise our current concepts and engineer new concepts that can better serve our main purposes. This term originates from discussions about Carnap’s methodological insights (see for instance French 2015 for a useful overview), but is now being used in a more general, encompassing sense. Several philosophers have recently argued that we could understand many traditional debates in philosophy as debates in conceptual ethics or conceptual engineering (see for instance Floridi 2011 and Plunkett 2015).

2.4 Hermeneutical Injustice

As we saw above, Fricker (2007) argues that there is a distinctive kind of injustice that has to do with the inability to properly understand and communicate important aspects of one’s social experience: she calls this hermeneutical injustice. According to Fricker, people in a position of marginalization are prevented from creating concepts, terms and other representational resources that could be used in order to conceptualize and understand their own experiences, especially those having to do with being in that position of marginalization. People in a position of power will tend to create concepts and linguistic representations that help to conceptualize the experiences and phenomena that matter to them, rather than the experiences and phenomena that matter the most to people in a position of marginalization. Because of this, members of marginalized groups might suffer from a lacuna in the representational resources that are available to them, and in particular might lack the concepts and terms that would allow them to understand and communicate their experiences. In order to illustrate this phenomenon, Fricker (2007) focuses on several examples, such as the articulation of the term ‘sexual harassment’: before the term was coined, victims of sexual harassment lacked the language to explain their experiences of receiving unwanted sexual advances at work in a way that would make clear why those interactions wronged them.

In the growing literature on hermeneutical injustice, philosophers have mainly focused on the following two central questions: first, how to properly understand the phenomenon of hermeneutical injustice (namely, what is distinctively epistemic about it, and what makes it unjust); and secondly, how to resist this kind of injustice and how to fill in the corresponding conceptual and linguistic gaps in our collective understanding of situations of marginalization.

Regarding the first question, Laura Beeby (2011) has argued that the relevant notion of hermeneutical injustice is one that focuses on the epistemic situation of lacking the relevant concepts and terms, rather than on one’s position within the background social conditions that give rise to it. She argues that, for example, in the case of sexual harassment both the victim and the harasser suffer from hermeneutical injustice since they both have similar epistemic situations, that is, they both have similar gaps in their collective understanding of what is going on. As Beeby argues, if we offer a characterization of hermeneutical injustice in terms of the epistemic situation of the subject, and in particular in terms of their conceptual gaps, then both the harasser and that harassee will be in a situation of hermeneutical injustice, but this seems to be in tension with Fricker’s claim that only the victim suffers from hermeneutical injustice. However, as Beeby also emphasizes, one could respond, following Fricker, that people in a position of power are epistemically advantaged in another sense, namely, they do have the ability to create concepts and terms that are useful in order to understand and communicate their own experiences and the social interactions that matter the most to them. This contrasts with the situation of the marginalized, who lack this ability.

However, the idea that the marginalized lack the ability to conceptualize and communicate their own experiences has also been contested by philosophers such as Rebecca Mason (2011), Kristie Dotson (2012), Gaile Pohlhaus (2012) and José Medina (2013). For example, Mason (2011) and Medina (2013) have both argued that although Fricker is right that people in a situation of marginalization might not have access to publicly shared terms in order to communicate their experiences to those in a position of power, they might nonetheless be able to make sense of their own experiences in a useful way, even before those public concepts are introduced in the dominant language. For example, in the case of sexual harassment, some victims of sexual harassment were able to attend women’s consciousness-raising meetings and talk to each other about their similar experiences, that is to say, they were able to understand their experiences and communicate them to people in the same predicament, even before they had a term like ‘sexual harassment’. Therefore, Mason (2011) argues, it seems plausible to say that members of marginalized groups already have some conceptual resources that enable them to understand their own social experiences, and what they actually lack is the power to introduce these meanings into the collective understanding, which is unjust, and which results in the fact that dominant groups have a distorted understanding of the social experiences of non-dominant groups. Relatedly, Pohlhaus (2012) has argued that marginalized subjects are in a better position to notice gaps in our collective epistemic resources in order to properly describe and conceptualize the experiences of those who are socially oppressed. Moreover, these subjects could work cooperatively with other subjects in the same predicament so as to develop new epistemic resources that can deal with those spheres of the social world that people in a position of domination do not usually pay attention to. However, as Pohlhaus argues, it will be difficult to convince the privileged to employ those new epistemic resources developed by the marginalized. She calls this phenomenon of dismissive ignorance willful hermeneutical ignorance.

Furthermore, Dotson (2012) has introduced a new kind of epistemic injustice, in addition to testimonial injustice and hermeneutical injustice, namely, what she calls contributory injustice. This kind of epistemic injustice has to do not only with the phenomenon of willfully ignoring the epistemic resources developed by the marginalized, but also with the continuous use of distorted epistemic resources developed by those in a position of power, without paying attention to the experiences of the marginalized. This use of faulty conceptual resources acts to block the uptake of the new conceptual resources developed by the marginalized, which leads to further misunderstandings. In addition, Medina (2013) has argued that the fact that members of non-dominant groups have the ability to understand their own experiences and communicate them to each other is a prior and necessary step in order to bring new, more sophisticated concepts and terms into our shared language. According to Medina, this can also help with our second question above, namely, how to resist hermeneutical injustice: he suggests that members of dominant groups should be more sensitive to inchoate attempts at communication by people in a position of subordination, even before they have access to shared concepts to properly conceptualize those aspects of our social interactions. Finally, Derek E. Anderson (2017) distinguishes a new kind of epistemic injustice, namely, conceptual competence injustice, which occurs when a marginalized subject is not considered to be a competent user of a concept, because of a lack of linguistic or conceptual credibility, when in fact they are perfectly competent. This is different from hermeneutical injustice, Anderson argues, since in cases of hermeneutical injustice marginalized subjects lack access to some important concepts due to structural reasons, whereas in cases of conceptual competence injustice they fully possess the concepts but are regarded as incompetent speakers. However, this kind of injustice is closely related to Dotson’s notion of contributory injustice, since in cases where privileged subjects use distorted or biased hermeneutical resources, they will be more likely to doubt the conceptual competence of marginalized subjects (even if these are in fact more fully competent), which amounts to conceptual competence injustice, and hence the conceptual resources of the marginalized will in turn be less likely to get uptake, which amounts to contributory injustice.

Finally, regarding the question of what kinds of conceptual resources might be needed in order to fill in the hermeneutical gaps in our collective understandings, Komarine Romdenh-Romluc (2016) argues that what is needed are new terms and concepts that have the correct evaluative component, in addition to the right descriptive component. For instance, introducing the term ‘sexual harassment’ was very useful because the new term somehow implies that sexual harassment is wrong, whereas previous terms such as ‘harmless flirting’ did not connote the appropriate negative evaluative component. Likewise, as Medina (2013) argues, the appropriation of terms such as ‘gay’ and ‘queer’ by the LGBT community can be seen as a strategy for overcoming a situation of hermeneutical injustice, since these terms came to express new, positive conceptions of same-sex desire, in contrast to old conceptions of it as something pathological or perverse. In addition, George Hull (forthcoming) argues that consciousness-raising is very important, not only as a means to overcoming hermeneutical injustice, but it “can itself constitute the overcoming of hermeneutical injustice” (2016: 13). He focuses on the case of black South Africans during apartheid, and he argues, drawing on the work of Black Consciousness theorists such as B.S. Biko and N.B. Pityana, that they were liable to experience a mismatch between their experiences of racism and oppression, and the collective hermeneutical resources available to them. Because of this, consciousness-raising can help to correct false or distorted conceptions and images of themselves, and to develop new conceptual tools in order to make sense of those aspects of their lives. Furthermore, Charlie Crerar (2016) has argued that the injustice associated with lack of hermeneutical resources does not occur only in cases of conceptual absence (i.e. conceptual lacunas) or conceptual inadequacy (i.e. lack of concepts with the appropriate connotations), but also in cases where there is a rich conceptual repertoire but taboos or other social practices prevent marginalized subjects from discussing some matters of interest to them. Therefore, he argues, “we require access to an expressively free environment in which to put these concepts to work: an open and receptive social context in which a particular experience that individuals or groups have a significant interest in coming to understand can be discussed in hermeneutically conducive ways” (2016: 205).

2.5 Generics

Generic statements are ones such as “cats are furry”, or “a cat has fur”, which are neither universal generalizations (there are furless cats) nor existential generalization (the claim being made is clearly stronger). They give rise to many puzzles, which have for some time interested both linguists and philosophers. For a fuller discussion of generics, see the entry on generics. Our focus here is the social and political import that has recently been suggested for generic statements about social groups, on which there is a growing literature. This literature takes as its starting point Sarah-Jane Leslie’s work (Leslie 2015; Wodak, Leslie, and Rhodes 2015). Of key interest here are examples such as “boys don’t cry” or “women place their families before their careers”. These sentences can be used to express merely descriptive claims—describing, for example, crying as something not that many boys do. But they can also be used to make normative claims about what boys or women should do. Wodak, Leslie, and Rhodes (2015) suggest that “we can understand the difference between normative and descriptive generics in terms of the different concepts picked out by the noun phrase in the generics themselves” (Wodak et. al. 2015: 629). ‘Woman’ may pick out a normative concept—an ideal, which might include such things as a focus on family over career; or, alternatively, it may pick out a descriptive concept, and refer to women regardless of whether they focus on family over career. Leslie uses this as a foundation for explaining utterances like “Hillary Clinton is the only man in the Obama White House”, suggesting that ‘man’ here refers to the ideal of manliness. It is also a part of a more general project of arguing that generic utterances have harmful effects on social cognition. Leslie (forthcoming) also discusses what she calls “striking property generics”, statements that attribute dangerous properties to groups generically specified—like “black people are dangerous” or “Muslims are terrorists”. She argues that striking property generic claims may not require many instances to be accepted as true (assuming some other conditions are also met) allowing them to serve as a key mechanism in perpetuating and exacerbating prejudice. (For some criticisms of Leslie on striking property generics, see Saul forthcoming and Sterken 2015a,b.)

Haslanger (2011) has built on Leslie’s work, arguing that generic claims often carry conversational implicatures about natures, and that these help them to serve as a key mechanism for perpetuating the ideologies that hold unjust social structures in place. She suggests that—whatever their truth conditions (one understanding of Leslie’s view would make striking property generic claims very easily true)—one should deny them via the mechanism of meta-linguistic negation (Horn 1985) which allows the denial of a claim because it carries a false implicature. By this method, we can start to disrupt the ideologies that have us in their grip. (For criticism of this, see Saul forthcoming).


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We are very grateful to David Braun, Ray Drainville, Sally Haslanger, Chris Hookway, Jules Holroyd, and Nancy Tuana for their invaluable help with this entry. We would also like to thank Kathrin Gluer-Pagin for spotting some misidentified sentences in an earlier version of this entry, and Erik Tellgren for alerting us to Paul Gross’s response to Emily Martin. Special thanks are due to Mary Kate McGowan for her extremely helpful advice on the 2010 update to this entry, and to Ann Garry and Heidi Grasswick for their very useful comments on the 2017 update.

Copyright © 2017 by
Jennifer Saul <j.saul@shef.ac.uk>
Esa Diaz-Leon <esadiazleon@gmail.com>

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