Max Horkheimer

First published Wed Jun 24, 2009; substantive revision Wed Aug 30, 2017

Max Horkheimer (1895–1973) was a leader of the “Frankfurt School,” a group of philosophers and social scientists associated with the Institut für Sozialforschung (Institute of Social Research) in Frankfurt am Main. Horkheimer was the director of the Institute and Professor of Social Philosophy at the University of Frankfurt from 1930–1933, and again from 1949–1958. In between those periods he would lead the Institute in exile, primarily in America. As a philosopher he is best known (especially in the Anglophone world), for his work during the 1940s, including Dialectic of Enlightenment, which was co-authored with Theodor Adorno. While deservedly influential, Dialectic of Enlightenment (and other works from that period) should not be separated from the context of Horkheimer’s work as a whole. Especially important in this regard are the writings from the 1930s, which were largely responsible for developing the epistemological and methodological orientation of Frankfurt School critical theory. This work both influenced his contemporaries (including Adorno and Herbert Marcuse) and has had an enduring influence on critical theory’s later practitioners (including Jürgen Habermas, and the Institute’s current director Axel Honneth).

1. Biography

Max Horkheimer was born into a conservative Jewish family on February 14, 1895, the only son of Moritz and Babette Horkheimer. A successful and respected businessman who owned several textile factories in the Zuffenhausen district of Stuttgart (where Max was born), Moritz Horkheimer expected his son to follow in his footsteps. Thus Max was taken out of school in 1910 to work in the family business, where he eventually became a junior manager. During this period he would begin two relationships that would last for the rest of his life. First, he met Friedrich Pollock, who would later become a close academic colleague, and who would remain Max’s closest friend. He also met Rose Riekher, who was his father’s personal secretary. Eight years Max’s senior, a gentile, and of an economically lower class, Riekher (whom Max called “Maidon”) was not considered a suitable match by Moritz Horkheimer. Despite this, Max and Maidon would marry in 1926 and remain together until her death in 1969 (Wiggerschaus 1994, p. 41–44).

In the spring of 1919, after failing an army physical, Horkheimer began studies at the University of Munich, and transferred to the University of Frankfurt a semester later. At Frankfurt he studied psychology and philosophy, the latter with the neo-Kantian philosopher Hans Cornelius. He also spent a year, on Cornelius’s recommendation, studying in Freiburg with Edmund Husserl. After an abortive attempt at writing a dissertation on gestalt psychology, Horkheimer, with Cornelius’s direction, completed his doctorate in philosophy with a dissertation titled The Antinomy of Teleological Judgment. Upon completion of the degree he was offered an assistantship under Cornelius, and thus definitively set off on an academic career rather than continuing in his father’s business. In 1925 Horkheimer completed his Habilitation with a work titled Kant’s Critique of Judgment as a Link between Theoretical and Practical Philosophy, and took a position as Privatdozent, or lecturer, at Frankfurt. During this time he would lecture extensively on 18th and 19th Century philosophy, with his research interests moving more in line with Marxian themes (Wiggerschaus 1994, p. 44–47).

The most important moments of Horkheimer’s early academic career would come in 1930. In July he was appointed Professor of Social Philosophy at Frankfurt, and in October made the director of the Institut für Sozialforschung (Institute of Social Research). The Institute began as a Marxist study group started by Felix Weil, a one-time student of political science at Frankfurt who used his inheritance to fund an institution that would support his leftist academic aims. Along with Pollock (who also completed a doctorate in Frankfurt, writing on Marx), Horkheimer became acquainted with Weil, and took part in the activities of the Institute from the beginning. The Institute formally opened in 1924 under the direction of the Austrian Marxist scholar Carl Grünberg, who became ill quickly after taking the post. While Pollock was more closely associated with the Institute during the Grünberg period, he supported his friend for the directorship (on the early history of the Institute, see Jay 1996, ch. 1). On January 24, 1931, Horkheimer delivered his inaugural lecture for the chair of social philosophy and directorship of the Institute, titled “The Present Situation of Social Philosophy and the Tasks of an Institute for Social Research.” This lecture, and several essays written by Horkheimer in the early 1930s, would develop a conception of interdisciplinary social research that was meant to guide the activities of the institute during Horkheimer’s tenure as director.

This program was obstructed from the very beginning by social-political unrest. In the time between Horkheimer’s being named Professor of Social Philosophy and director of the Institute in 1930, the Nazis became the second largest party in the Reichstag. In the midst of the violence surrounding the Nazis’ rise, Horkheimer and his associates began to prepare for the possibility of moving the Institute out of Germany. Shortly after Hitler was named Chancellor in 1933, the Institute in Frankfurt was closed and its building seized by the Gestapo. Horkheimer was also relieved of his professorship and directorship in early 1933, and relocated to Geneva, where the Institute had opened a satellite office. In 1934 Horkheimer moved to New York, where one of Pollock’s assistants had been negotiating an agreement for the Institute with the department of sociology at Columbia University. In July of 1934 Horkheimer accepted an offer from Columbia to relocate the Institute to one of their buildings. Having received American citizenship in 1940, Horkheimer would continue to live and work largely in New York until 1941, when he moved to the Los Angeles area (for a thorough history of the development of Horkheimer’s thought up to this point, see Abromeit 2011). With the Institute splintering between New York and California, Horkheimer concentrated his energies on his own work, including the collaborative efforts with Theodor Adorno that produced Dialectic of Enlightenment.

With the end of WWII, Horkheimer gradually considered moving back to Germany. In April 1948, he returned to Europe for the first time, to lecture in various cities, including as a visiting professor in Frankfurt. His full return to Germany would follow shortly, and in July 1949 he was restored to his professorship at the University of Frankfurt. The following year the Institute would return as well. After returning, Horkheimer would focus on administrative work, reestablishing the Institute and serving two terms as University Rector in the early 1950s. In 1953 he was awarded the Goethe Plaque of the City of Frankfurt, and would later be named honorary citizen of Frankfurt for life. His academic activities also continued throughout the 1950s, and included a period during which he served as a regular visiting professor at the University of Chicago. His work would slow, however, once he retired in 1958 to the Swiss town of Montagnola. Max Horkheimer passed away on July 7, 1973, at the age of 78.

2. Materialism and The Early Program of the Institute of Social Research

The theoretical viewpoint that oriented the work of the Institute of Social Research, most famously known as “critical theory,” was largely developed by Horkheimer in various writings in the 1930s (most of which were published in the Institute’s journal, the Zeitschrift für Sozialforschung).[1] In the earliest works Horkheimer used the term “materialism,” rather than critical theory, to name his philosophical viewpoint. Though his early texts do not directly mention Marx as much as one might expect (perhaps for reasons of political expediency), it is clear that this theory draws great inspiration from Marxian thought (see Borman 2017 for further discussion of Horkheimer’s early materialism and its connection to Marx). Horkheimer’s materialism is not systematically presented in those early essays; rather the epistemological, methodological, and moral concepts that were to orient the work of the Institute are developed through a variety of texts. What follows is an attempt at a reconstruction of Horkheimer’s program for the Institute, which draws on elements from various essays of the early 1930s.

One can begin to piece together Horkheimer’s materialist method by examining the 1931 inaugural address. There he presents most of the main themes of his early philosophy in the context of describing what the Institute was to accomplish under his leadership. As he notes at the beginning, social philosophy must interpret the various phenomena associated with human social life. But along with this fairly obvious point, he asserts that “social philosophy is confronted with the yearning for a new interpretation of a life trapped in its individual striving for happiness” (p. 7). This introduces perhaps the most fundamental element of Horkheimer’s view. Social philosophy must connect with the practical aim of alleviating suffering. But it is, after all, still a theoretical enterprise, and he would emphasize that the work of the Institute would amount to “a reformulation...of the old question concerning the connection of particular existence and universal Reason” (pp. 11–12). Along with the emphasis on suffering, the proper interpretation of reason would play a crucial role in Horkheimer’s thought.

Early in the inaugural address he lays out a quick, and critical, history of modern German social philosophy that fixes on Hegel. Hegelian social philosophy is criticized for “transfiguring” oppression; individual human experience, with all its suffering, is given sense insofar as it is fit within a rational, overarching conception of the movement of the “eternal life of Spirit” (pp. 4–5). Horkheimer rejects this kind of metaphysical view because it seeks to cover over the reality of human suffering. But he is not unreservedly critical of metaphysics. After criticizing Hegelian social philosophy, he notes that in reaction certain strands of social research eschewed philosophy entirely. This leads to Horkheimer’s criticism of the excessive specialization of the (in this case social) sciences. Due to this specialization, scientific researchers omit any broader examination of the social roots, and social meaning, from their inquiry. At least metaphysical thinking recognizes the need to present a comprehensive view that can make sense of the social whole. The twin critiques of metaphysics and science provide a space for Horkheimer to present his own view. The aim of materialist social research is to combine specific empirical studies with more comprehensive theorizing, and thus overcome these problems. Horkheimer finishes by noting that this research will be aimed at the elucidation of the links between economic structure, psychology, and culture, such that the work of various social scientists and theorists can be brought together to forge an empirically informed picture of society that might replace such previous metaphysical categories as Universal Reason or Spirit.

Thus construed, we can use the themes presented in the inaugural address as a guide for the further examination of Horkheimer’s early thought. Four elements become key: the emphasis on suffering and happiness, the role rationality plays in emancipatory movements, the combined critiques of metaphysics and positivism, and the methodology of interdisciplinary social research. Each of these four is examined in more depth in the four subsections below.

2.1. Suffering and the Desire for Happiness

As noted, the rejection of Hegelian social philosophy in the inaugural lecture is tied to a broader rejection of metaphysics, which will be discussed in more detail in §2.2. At the root of the rejection of “transfiguration,” however, is a very basic point. No social philosophy that denies the singular import of suffering, and the corresponding desire to overcome that suffering, can properly grasp human social reality. Thus, in the 1933 essay “Materialism and Metaphysics” Horkheimer writes that “man’s striving for happiness is to be recognized as a natural fact requiring no justification” (p. 44). Prior to any critique of metaphysics, materialism rests on the basic recognition of suffering and the desire for happiness. Suffering and happiness are in some sense “properly basic”; their significance is evident, in no need of justification, and foundational to materialist social theory.

The talk of both “suffering” and “happiness” suggests that Horkheimer oscillated between pessimistic and optimistic renderings of this foundational idea. The pessimistic side of this view, with its conception of human life as shared suffering, was present in Horkheimer’s thought from very early in his life. In the novellas and diary entries written from 1914–1918 and later published as Aus der Pubertät (From Puberty), this pessimism is prominent (see Schmidt 1993, 25–26). This is in part due to the early influence of Schopenhauer’s “metaphysical pessimism” on Horkheimer’s thought, and Horkheimer himself would emphasize that Schopenhauer was his first philosophical role model (Horkheimer 1968, p. ix). It is noteworthy (especially given the link here to Horkheimer’s critique of metaphysics), that for Schopenhauer this “metaphysical” view is tied to the concrete need to interpret the world in a way that can help humans understand and deal with their suffering (on this point, and Horkheimer’s relation to Schopenhauer’s thought in general, see Schmidt 1993). Metaphysical or not, this view is based on the notion that life is marked by pain. The optimistic rendering comes to the fore in the above quote from “Materialism and Metaphysics” insofar as the desire for happiness is emphasized. But the optimism should not be overestimated, because happiness is construed in a solely negative manner. The oppressed are motivated not by some positive conception of happiness, but by the hope of freedom from suffering. This individual desire for happiness can further manifest itself as the moral sentiment of compassion, wherein we desire the happiness of others (Horkheimer 1933b, pp. 34–35).[2] The desire to overcome one’s own suffering, combined with the feeling of compassion, should help motivate the oppressed to join together to work for positive social change. But even this optimistic note is tinged with a pessimistic note, as “the aim of a future happy life for all” arises only “out of the privation of the present” (Horkheimer 1933b p. 34); it is the existence of current shared suffering that could lead to revolutionary social change.

Along with Schopenhauer, Horkheimer’s thoughts on suffering owe a great deal to Freud. The notion that human beings have an inner drive to overcome suffering is taken from Freud’s early libido theory (see Held 1980, pp. 43–44 and 197–198). Horkheimer’s most direct analysis of Freud in the 1930s is found in “Egoism and Freedom Movements” (especially pp. 103–106), and the Freudian conception of inner drives will further mark Horkheimer’s later work, as will be shown in §4.2 below. In the 1930s Horkheimer was also influenced by Erich Fromm, who was a member of the Institute at the time; for example, shortly after the claim in “Materialism and Metaphysics” that the desire for happiness is a natural fact, Fromm’s work is referenced. It is noteworthy in this regard that Fromm’s work from this period aimed to broadly draw together Freudian and Marxian views. This connection can be seen in the link between the desire for happiness and emancipation, as discussed in the next section.

2.2 Reason and Emancipation

When focusing on the affective nature of suffering, happiness, and compassion in Horkheimer’s view, one might get the sense that he is relying on a sort of emotivism that shuns reason. But there is a strongly rationalistic strand present in Horkheimer’s early work that is tied directly to his views on positive social change. In fact, he describes suffering as resulting from a lack of rational social organization, and proposes that any attempt to improve society must involve making it in some way more rational. This view is in turn tied to the broadly Marxian element in Horkheimer’s early work, as capitalism is criticized for creating the irrational social conditions that lead to suffering.

To a large extent, this problem of irrationality is described as a social coordination problem. Insofar as it is individual human beings who suffer, and who desire happiness, individual welfare is a crucial matter. This is made clear by the critique of Hegelian “transfiguration,” which is problematic partly because it subsumes individual suffering and happiness within the absolute. At the same time, individual welfare is still dependent upon a broader social basis, so the life of society as a whole is pertinent to the search for happiness. But capitalism has created a situation wherein people are made to focus on their own individual welfare, without considering anything other than “the conservation and multiplication of their own property” (1933b, p. 19). Social needs are thus handled through various disorganized activities focused on individual needs, which in turn inadequately deals with the social basis of individual welfare, thus detracting from individual welfare. This kind of critique is found in some form in many of Horkheimer’s early essays (see, for example, 1934c, pp. 247–250 and 1935b, pp. 162–170).

Such an argument is made particularly clearly in “Materialism and Morality,” where Horkheimer discusses idealist, and predominantly Kantian, conceptions of morality. One main thread of the rather intricate argument made there is that there is a tension in Kant’s view, insofar as he places a radical emphasis on the individual will, but also makes that will beholden to the universal law described in terms of the kingdom of ends. This tension supposedly comes from the bourgeois socio-economic context in which Kant lived:

The categorical imperative holds up a “universal natural law,” the law of human society, as a standard of comparison to this [bourgeois] natural law of individuals. This would be meaningless if particular interests and the needs of the general public intersected not just haphazardly but of necessity. That this does not occur, however, is the inadequacy of the bourgeois economic form: there exists no rational connection between the free competition of individuals as what mediates and the existence of the entire society as what is mediated...This irrationality expresses itself in the suffering of the majority of human beings...This problem, which only society itself could rationally solve through the systematic incorporation of each member into a consciously directed labor process, manifests itself in the bourgeois epoch as a conflict in the inner life of its subjects. (pp. 19–20)

This passage makes it clear that the coordination problems associated with the “bourgeois epoch” (i.e. the capitalist period) are problems of irrationality. Furthermore, it makes clear that the solution to these problems is to be found in the formation of a more rational social order, which is described in terms of a socialist planned economy. This point, then, provides the space where Horkheimer can link his own materialist theory, and the work of the Institute, to the broadly Marxian aim of emancipation through overcoming the capitalist order. Because “the wretchedness of our own time is connected with the structure of society” (1933b, 24) a social theory that could make that structure’s irrationality explicit could help overcome that wretchedness. Furthermore, that irrationality needs to be made explicit to the classes who suffer the most from it, so they can take proper action. So Horkheimer’s view connects generally to the Marxian view of the proletariat as a critical force in history, but unlike (on certain interpretations, at least) Marx, he does not see history as necessarily moving the proletariat to “critical consciousness” because of the irrationality inherent in capitalist socio-economic arrangements. Rather, various social and economic forces keep the proletariat from recognizing its potential; for example there is a split between the unemployed, who suffer most from capitalism but are disorganized, and the workers who can be organized, but fear losing their jobs (Horkheimer 1934a, 61–65). The proletariat requires the help of the theorist. That theorist must engage in a special kind of activity, however, which (as the next section will show) must steer clear of two opposing errors.

2.3 Critiques of Metaphysics and Science

One can get a sense of what Horkheimer means when criticizing metaphysics by looking at “Materialism and Metaphysics.” There metaphysics is described in relation to Wilhelm Dilthey’s doctrine of “world views.” For Dilthey, human beings engage in metaphysics in an attempt to explain the enigmatic elements of human life. In this attempt, certain characteristics of experience are emphasized and developed into coherent world views that have putatively universal validity, and describe the significance of the world and human life (pp. 10–17). So “metaphysics,” in this sense, amounts to a kind of intellectualized, theoretically elaborated attempt at turning partial, finite experiences into a comprehensive view of nature and human experience.

For Horkheimer, theories of this type are in part problematic because “knowledge of the infinite must itself be infinite” (Horkheimer 1933a, p. 27). But human beings are only capable of finite knowledge, and can only pay attention to changing historical conditions. If insights into the absolute are impossible, there is no known ultimate order of things that grounds all other forms of knowledge. Along these lines Horkheimer criticized Max Scheler’s metaphysical anthropology for holding that all human works and achievements could be described in terms of some basic structure of human nature (Horkheimer 1935b, p. 153). Rather than pursuing an interest in understanding human existence, Horkheimer argues, metaphysics obscures the proper understanding of human life. Many of Horkheimer’s early essays aim to show how the works of various philosophers, past and present, are troubled in this way. For example, along with the criticism of Dilthey in “Materialism and Metaphysics” and the criticism of Scheler in “Remarks on Philosophical Anthropology,” there are (among others) critiques of this type that attack Kant in “Materialism and Morality,” and Henri Bergson in “On Bergson’s Metaphysics of Time.”

In each case, however, Horkheimer was not solely critical, and there is a positive element that Horkheimer finds in metaphysics that serves as a transition to his critique of science. For example, in the 1932 essay “Notes on Science and the Crisis,” he applauds “postwar metaphysics, especially that of Max Scheler” for developing “a method less hindered by conventional narrowness of outlook” (p.6). Similarly, in the 1934 essay “The Rationalism Debate in Contemporary Philosophy,” Horkheimer agrees with Dilthey and Bergson (and also Nietzsche, all three under the aegis of Lebensphilosophie) insofar as they critique scientism and formalistic rationalism. Metaphysics is, in general, right to try to engage in some form of synoptic theorizing, although it takes it too far. But the opposite extreme, of which Scheler, Dilthey, and Bergson are critical, fits with Horkheimer’s conception of the state of the sciences.

The critique of the sciences developed in the early texts moves along two lines. First, the sciences are criticized for being overly specialized. For example, in the inaugural address Horkheimer complains of “chaotic specialization” (p. 9). The danger of focusing on technical minutiae is that researchers become insulated from one another, and lose the ability to use one another’s resources. The result is a lack of unification and overall direction. Just as he favors a planned economy, Horkheimer wants the “setting of tasks” in scientific research to be brought under rational control, so empirical researchers can work together toward broader ends. Second, as noted in “Notes on Science and the Crisis,” science “has no realistic grasp of that comprehensive relationship upon which its own existence and the direction of its work depends, namely, society” (p. 8). All human work, be it in the sciences or anything else, depends on a broader context which supports it, and the activities that are associated with the social interests prevalent at any given time affect the direction of scientific research. There is no “view from nowhere” from which empirical research begins, but only socially situated standpoints. Horkheimer expands on this point to argue that when empirical research misses its social roots, it also misses the effects the “direction of its work” might have on society. Science has a responsibility to society that can only be filled if its various research efforts are knit together within a more comprehensive framework that takes society and its improvement as its object.

This is largely repeated in other works that criticize “positivism.” The fact that the Frankfurt School mounted a strong critique of positivism is quite well known, in part because of the so-called “Positivismusstreit” of the 1960s, and Horkheimer also uses the term frequently, especially in his later works. The critiques of science and positivism make the same basic points.[3] Consider the critique of logical positivism in the 1937 essay “The Latest Attack on Metaphysics.” There Horkheimer argues that insofar as logical empiricism “holds only to what is, to the guarantee of facts” (pp. 133–134), it tries to insulate the individual sciences from broader interpretation. Thus positivism disconnects science from society and robs it of its emancipatory possibilities, because brute facts can only grasp the present, and the possibility for changing the status quo in the future is lost.

The crucial point to note is that the critiques of metaphysics and science work together, and are meant to open up a space between the two where materialist social research should operate. Philosophy maintains metaphysics’ goal of producing a synoptic view of human life, but it does so in a merely provisional way, which is open to empirical research that genuinely follows the contours of history. Science, on the other hand, maintains its rigorous empirical methods, but must open itself up to the role it plays in the broader social framework. In the inaugural address, Horkheimer thus claims that there must be a “continuous, dialectical penetration and development of philosophical theory and specialized scientific practice” (p. 9).

2.4 The Epistemology and Methodology of Interdisciplinary Research

Horkheimer’s conception of interdisciplinary social research is rooted in, broadly construed, both empiricist and realist views. Horkheimer speaks often of such research as aiming at “facts,” as seen in §2.1 when he refers to the desire for happiness as a natural fact. This connects to a kind of realism seen most directly in the 1935 essay “On the Problem of Truth.” “Materialism” he tells us, “insists that objective reality is not identical with man’s thought,” and truth is determined by the “relation of the propositions to reality” (pp. 189, 194). But this realism has to be qualified; materialism is distinguished from idealism through the appeal to an objective reality outside of our thinking, but it is further separated from metaphysical realism by its recognition that our knowing is historically bounded. Along these lines, Horkheimer admits to holding to a correspondence theory of truth, but notes that:

This correspondence is neither a simple datum [nor] an immediate fact...Rather, it is always established by real events and human activity. Already in the investigation and determination of facts, and even more in the verification of theories, a role is played by the direction of attention, the refinement of methods, the categorical structure of the subject matter—in short, by human activity corresponding to the given social period. (p. 190)

Here we find Horkheimer’s epistemological considerations echoing his critique of science. Presumably the “real events and human activity” that grasp objective truth involve empirical research. But because (as discussed in the critique of science) empirical research is always tied to a social context, one must see that the truths it reveals are conditioned by the “human activity corresponding to the given social period.” Knowledge is always affected by the historical changes in our methods noted. But more than theoretical or methodological changes that shift scientific theories, Horkheimer sees knowledge as being marked by our practical interests. This is why a strong metaphysical conception of reality is unavailable to us; all thinking is marked by practical and theoretical interests that are partial and subject to historical change.

But this point cannot be taken too far; truth is neither wholly determined by our practical interests nor by theory-dependent conditions of verification. When it is claimed that truth is dependent on the “relation of propositions to reality,” Horkheimer means both of those to be given equal weight. While the weight put on “propositions” (or better, human conceptual activity) removes the possibility of a metaphysical theory of reality, it does not remove reality. But because all inquiry into truth is historically and socially mediated, it is constantly open to adjustment. This points out why the “continuous, dialectical penetration” of philosophy and science spoken of in the inaugural address is necessary. Objective truths have to be grasped empirically, and the work of the specialized sciences is thus necessary to determine the truth of the current state of society. But “truth is advanced” only when “human beings who possess it stand by it unbendingly, apply it and carry it through, act according to it, and bring it to power against the resistance of reactionary, narrow, one-sided points of view” (Horkheimer 1935a, p. 4). This requires that empirical research be saved from “chaotic specialization,” and interpreted through an adequate theoretical framework. It is noteworthy in this regard that toward the end of the inaugural lecture, Horkheimer states that it is appropriate for the head of the Institute to also hold a chair in social philosophy, as was not the case with his predecessor who worked in the “specific discipline” of political economy. For Horkheimer, it was properly the job of the philosopher to plan out and guide the interdisciplinary work of the Institute.

Historical exigencies kept the Institute’s early researchers from implementing this program. They did press on with their empirical and theoretical efforts during the time of upheaval in the 1930s, producing various small studies in the Zeitschrift für Sozialforschung, and the larger Studies on Authority and the Family. It is clearly the case, however, that there were many difficulties in carrying out the empirical research that was used in those studies (see the historical discussion of this period in Wiggerschaus 1994, 149–156). Even if we set aside the historical difficulties that beset the Institute during this time, there is still reason to question whether Horkheimer’s interdisciplinary program could have been carried out successfully. One might doubt, for example, that the philosophers who formed the core of the Frankfurt School, including Horkheimer himself, were actually open enough to the sciences. Jay 1996 (pp. 130–131), Wiggerschaus 1994 (p. 151), and Wolin 1992 (pp. 56–58), argue that they were not, such that their theoretical works (especially in Studies on Authority and the Family) were not really integrated with the empirical studies. Perhaps more damningly, Bonß 1993 argues that this failure comes from faults internal to Horkheimer’s methodological and epistemological considerations such that “the interdisciplinary claim amounts to no more than an external formula for integration” (p. 118). This seems fair insofar as Horkheimer spent a great deal of energy claiming that empirical and theoretical research should be combined, and explaining why they should be combined, but did very little to explain how they would be so combined. It remains to be shown if one might reactivate Horkheimer’s intentions while providing a better explanation of how such integrated research might actually work. Clearly, however, Horkheimer would come to gradually doubt the efficacy of such a program; one can begin to trace out this shift by examining the 1937 essay “Traditional and Critical Theory” (this separation of the 1937 essay from the earlier “materialist” works roughly follows arguments in Dubiel 1985).

3. “Traditional and Critical Theory”: Summation and Dissolution of the Early Program

To an extent, Horkheimer’s materialist theory is encapsulated in his most famous and widely-read essay from the 1930s, “Traditional and Critical Theory.” The essay is often referred to as being “programmatic,” highlighting the notion that it summarizes the philosophical and methodological views that were meant to guide the work of the Institute (see, for example, Schmidt 1993, p. 34, and Ingram 1990, p. 108). This is not wrong, but can be misleading if overemphasized. At the same time as it summarizes the earlier work, “Traditional and Critical Theory” evinces a transition to Horkheimer’s later critiques of reason and enlightenment (a similar point is made in Benhabib 1986, pp. 149–163). The most obvious change occurs in the name Horkheimer gives to his favored view, as he shifts from “materialism” to “critical theory.” But the changes are more than cosmetic. For example, the critique of “traditional theory” subtly shifts the terms of the critiques of metaphysics and positivism. Also, the role of the theorist vis-a-vis society changes. In part, this prefigures later views.

The titular forms of theorizing correspond (as noted at the beginning of the 1937 “Postscript,” p. 244) to those found in Descartes’ Discourse on Method and Marx’s critique of political economy, respectively. So the overarching point of the essay can be summarized fairly succinctly; it describes a form of “traditional” theory that follows Descartes’ methodology, examines the weaknesses of such theory, and then opposes to traditional theory a superior Marxian “critical” theory. The critique of traditional theory largely follows the earlier critique of the sciences and positivism, and in this sense is a summation. Again, the fact that the sciences do not recognize their presence in a broader social framework is emphasized. Traditional theory misses the fact that that “bringing hypotheses to bear on facts is an activity that goes on, ultimately, not in the savant’s head but in industry” (p. 196). “Savant” is the derisive term Horkheimer uses throughout the text to refer to the traditional theorist, and the savant does not recognize that the economic (and thus currently capitalist) structure of society shapes scientific work. The savant further misses the suffering caused by that social structure, and the fact that science is complicit in this oppression. Critical theorizing, on the other hand, is “a human activity which has society itself for its object” (p. 206); it overcomes the blindness of the savant by openly and purposely examining the way in which theory is immersed in a particular historical and social setting, and it seeks to critique that social setting for emancipatory effect. This relies on a form of immanent critique, tied to the suffering of the oppressed; the theorist must seize on the meaning of the experience of the oppressed and develop it into a coherent critique of existing society. To this end Horkheimer notes that if the critical theorist’s “presentation of societal contradictions is not merely an expression of the concrete historical situation but also a force within it to stimulate change, then [the critical theorist’s] real function emerges” (p. 215).

This general symmetry with the earlier program belies certain important changes to the theory, however. The very beginning of the text, which discusses traditional theory, shows a subtle shift from the earlier work. Traditional theory is first linked with the natural sciences, for which “theory” involves a set of logically linked propositions that are consonant with empirical facts. The logical coherence of such a set of propositions is then emphasized, and connected to Descartes’ method. Horkheimer goes on to suggest that such a conception of theory has an inherent tendency to move toward “a purely mathematical system of symbols.” Formal logic and reasoning thus become a main target of criticism. This is not a radical departure from Horkheimer’s earlier critique of science, since, for example, in “Notes on Science and the Crisis,” he objects to the rigid, mechanistic character of the scientific method. But the earlier texts focus more on a problem that is external to the sciences. There is no coherent “setting of tasks” prior to the engagement in empirical research, and the results of empirical research are not knit into a broader theory that can have emancipatory intent. The earlier essays largely ask for the sciences to go about their normal business within an interdisciplinary setting that would correct these problems. In “Traditional and Critical Theory,” on the other hand, the critique strikes more directly at the formalism inherent in the sciences’ own methodology, such that the problem is internal to the sciences. This provides one clear transitional point, insofar as formalism will be a primary object of critique in Horkheimer’s writings from the 1940s.

Another interesting shift is that the critique of metaphysics largely falls out of the picture. For some commentators, metaphysics is folded, along with science, into traditional theory (see Brunkhorst 1993, 74). But this does not seem entirely correct, because in the midst of criticizing positivism, Horkheimer notes that there is, “lurking” in positivism’s emphasis on facts, “something like a reaction against the alliance of metaphysics and oppression” (p. 232). This claim hearkens back to the notion, described in places like “Materialism and Metaphysics,” that scientific attention to facts, when properly construed within materialist research, can keep philosophy from overlooking actual human suffering. But such references are few, and Horkheimer does shift the discussion of science in such a way that it takes over parts of his earlier critique of metaphysics. For example, he criticizes the sciences, in a manner that is not common in earlier essays, for the way they subsume facts under universal concepts (pp. 224–226). This critique of universal concepts is tied to the critique of formalism; Horkheimer finds fault in the fact that the sciences relate facts to concepts in terms of the “relation of classes to instances” which can be “accomplished by a simple deduction” (p.225). Critical theory is then contrasted with this overly simplified universal-particular relation insofar as it constantly reexamines the relation of facts to universal concepts, and sees them as fitting together in a dynamic relationship that must be carefully charted. The implication is that logical formalism leads the sciences to form static universals into which all particulars can be neatly placed. Since the sciences are attending to facts in engaging in such an operation, the critique does not exactly match up with the criticism that metaphysics turns a blind eye to the world. But as those facts are misconstrued through formalism, the upshot of the critique is the same; actual social existence has not been adequately incorporated into theory because of the creation of a false universal. This formalism is contrasted with the fact that critical theory is “the unfolding of a single existential judgment” (p. 227). Displaying the contradictions inherent in capitalist society, and fixing on possibilities for emancipatory change, does not involve the scientific subsumption of facts within a logically ordered conceptual system. It rather involves unfolding and elaborating on an insight that one initially acquires simply by existing in (with “existing in” taken in the robust sense of living and acting in) that society.

The way this point is construed displays the most crucial difference between “Traditional and Critical Theory” and its antecedents. Horkheimer’s attitude toward the possibility of social change is less optimistic, and the critical theorist is described as having a somewhat antagonistic relationship with the oppressed. This fits with a general shift in the Frankfurt School’s work from the 1930s to the 1940s corresponding to a lack of faith in the possibility of emancipatory social change. In his 1937 essay “Philosophy and Critical Theory,” (which he wrote largely as a response to and counterpart with “Traditional and Critical Theory”) Herbert Marcuse rhetorically asks what happens “if the development outlined by the theory does not occur? What if the forces that were to bring about the transformation are suppressed and appear to be defeated?” (Marcuse 1937, 63) “Traditional and Critical Theory” is worried precisely with these questions. For a variety of reasons, including obvious social and political exigencies, Horkheimer and his associates would become less and less confident that the oppressed classes could become a force for change. Horkheimer clearly did not believe that compassion and the desire to overcome suffering could, on their own, motivate social change. Consider the assertion in “Traditional and Critical Theory” that while the oppressed strive for happiness they do not know how to achieve it, so the theorist must step in and help the oppressed come to critical consciousness. “Even the situation of the proletariat is…no guarantee of correct knowledge” (pp. 211–215); the significance of suffering is not always evident to those who experience it, and it is the job of the social theorist to elaborate on this significance in such a way that it can have practical effect. “Traditional and Critical Theory” holds out the hope that this task is possible, but it is noteworthy that the critical theorist is described as being set over against the oppressed, as “it is the task of the critical theoretician to reduce the tension between his own insight and oppressed humanity in whose service he thinks” (p. 221).

Horkheimer would become less and less confident that the tension could be so reduced. He also ominously notes that while the “commodity economy” might at first usher in a period of progress, “after an enormous extension of human control over nature, it finally hinders further development and drives humanity into a new barbarism” (p. 227). This passage states the main themes that would dominate Horkheimer’s work in the 1940s, which would be marked by an increasing pessimism in the ability of rational, theoretical activity to halt that drive toward barbarism.

4. The Critique of Reason and the Domination of Nature

In the late 1930s, Horkheimer described all of his efforts as working toward a project on dialectical logic (Wiggerschaus 1994, 177). This “dialectics project” would, through many twists and turns, develop into ideas presented primarily in two books published in 1947. Horkheimer was the sole author of Eclipse of Reason, which appeared originally in English. The book incorporates and expands on a series of lectures delivered at Columbia University in 1944, and, as Horkheimer writes in its preface, presents “in epitome some aspects” of his work with Adorno from that time (p. vi). That work with Adorno would also produce Dialectic of Enlightenment, a collaborative text that was first published in 1947, after having been distributed as a limited edition typescript in 1944. It would become the most famous work of the “first generation” of the Frankfurt School, and is surely the work most commonly associated with Horkheimer’s name.[4] The rest of this section will review the major themes of Horkheimer’s work from the 1940s, considering both Dialectic of Enlightenment and Eclipse of Reason together.

4.1 The Critique of Instrumental Reason

It is noteworthy that the text of Eclipse would eventually be published in German as “Zur Kritik der instrumentellen Vernunft” (“On the Critique of Instrumental Reason”). Both Eclipse and Dialectic are nuanced texts that present a number of themes, but if there is one overarching theme to the work from the 40s it is, as that German title suggests, the critical description of how reason collapses into irrationality through its emphasis on instrumental concerns. What is at stake here is made most clear by the first chapter of Eclipse, which is straightforwardly titled “Means and Ends.” Instrumental reason is interested only in determining the means to a goal, without reasoning about ends in themselves. In Dialectic, the Enlightenment is largely equated with the advance of instrumental reason, and through instrumental reason, Enlightenment turns against itself. This is noted in the very beginning of the text: “Enlightenment, understood in the widest sense as the advance of thought, has always aimed at liberating human beings from fear and installing them as masters. Yet the wholly enlightened earth is radiant with triumphant calamity” (p.1).

While the strong emphasis on instrumental reason’s domination of nature (which will be more fully discussed in §4.2) is new to the work of the 1940s, it picks up on themes present in Horkheimer’s earlier work. A prominent component (particularly in Dialectic) of the critique of instrumental reason is a critique of formalistic rationality, which evokes the criticism of the Cartesian mathematical method in “Traditional and Critical Theory.” On the face of it, one might question the necessary link between “formal” and “instrumental.” But Horkheimer and Adorno equate formalism with the drive to make nature calculable, and calculability is assimilated to usefulness. Thus formalistic reason becomes a species instrumental reason. Along similar lines, the critique of positivism is repeated in Eclipse (pp. 40–62). All parts of nature that cannot be calculated and formalized fall out of the Enlightenment’s scientific picture of the world. This scientific picture is further reproduced through activities which seek to dominate nature, thus instrumental-scientific activity creates a reality to fit this picture. The inexorable drive of instrumental reason causes this distorted picture to be seen as the only true picture of the world (Horkheimer 1947a p. 33).

Moreover, all elements of society, not just scientific research, are touched by the progress of instrumental rationality. Motivated by self-preservation, people seek protection from various powerful groups (sometimes called “rackets,” see Schmid Noerr 2002, and Stirk 1992 ch. 6). Instrumental rationality causes society to fragment into these various competing cliques. But this fragmentation is attended by cultural homogenization, as displayed by the chapter in Dialectic titled “The Culture Industry: Enlightenment as Mass Deception.” The general thrust of that chapter is that instrumental rationality has assimilated culture to an industrial model, which leads to a leveling and homogenizing of that culture. At points, this homogenizing move is described as though it is necessarily all-encompassing, as when the authors write that “anyone who resists can survive only by being incorporated. Once registered as diverging from the culture industry, they belong to it as the land reformer does to capitalism” (p. 104).

Eclipse also presents a slightly different view of instrumental reason, which is equated with “subjective reason,” and contrasted with “objective reason.”[5] At the beginning of “Means and Ends,” Horkheimer notes that “the average man will say that reasonable things are things that are obviously useful,” and then notes that it is through “classification, inference, and deduction…the abstract functioning of the thinking mechanism,” that one is to determine what is thus reasonable (p. 3). Usefulness is further equated with whatever works in favor of one’s self-preservation. This is why instrumental reason is subjective reason; it is thought oriented to the subject’s preservation. Objective reason (which Horkheimer largely associates with history’s great metaphysical systems from Plato to German Idealism), on the other hand, seeks to root truth and meaning, which should be the proper ends of thought, within some comprehensive totality. Objective reason is interested in ends, while subjective reason is interested only in means. Subjective reason thus falls into incoherence, because as the drive toward self-preservation becomes more and more all encompassing, any real conception of the significance of what is to be preserved is lost. Subjectivity is so oriented toward self-preservation that the drive toward self-preservation is the only end left. An interesting comparison can be drawn here with the earlier critique of capitalist social arrangements discussed in §2.2 above. There the similar point is made that the drive to fulfill self interests is ultimately self defeating. But there is a crucial difference; in the works from the 1930s this is clearly said to be the fault of irrationality, and it is supposed that more rational social arrangements could overcome the problem. In the works from the 1940s, rationality itself is impugned.

This description of subjective reason thus displays one way in which reason works against itself, and so falls into irrationality. A more famous way that this movement is displayed is through one of the primary themes of Dialectic, viz. that “myth is already enlightenment, and enlightenment reverts to mythology” (p. xviii). Myth is already enlightenment insofar as myths are already an attempt to control nature; “myth sought to report, to name, to tell of origins, but therefore also to narrate, record, explain” (p. 5). The interpretation of the Odyssey in Excursus I serves as a concrete example of this point. In general, the Odyssey maps out and rationally orders ancient myths, and shows how humanity, in the person of Odysseus, goes about submitting the mythological to rational control (pp. 35–40). Just as myth prefigured enlightenment, enlightenment in turn becomes myth insofar as our abstract categories become reified, leveling their relation to nature and thus making them untrue. This is the case, for example, with the formalistic scientific picture of the world mentioned above; “the mythical scientific respect of peoples for the given reality, which they themselves constantly create, finally becomes itself a positive fact, a fortress before which even the revolutionary imagination feels shamed as utopianism” (p. 33).

4.2 The Domination of Outer and Inner Nature

Instrumental rationality necessarily involves the domination of nature. Taken in its most straightforward sense, this point has become something of a commonplace. As the sciences developed during the enlightenment period (and earlier, insofar as myth was already enlightenment), technology also developed, at the service of self-preservation. Technology involves making over nature for human purposes. This movement ends up thwarting human preservation, however, insofar as the destruction of nature involves the destruction of humanity. This now fairly common line of critique is complicated in Horkheimer’s work from the 1940s, however, because instrumental rationality’s distortion of “outer nature” (nature taken in the most straightforward sense), is directly tied to the repression of “inner nature.”

The concept of “inner nature” is tied to the Freudian libido theory already mentioned in §2.1 above. Our inner life is most immediately, or “naturally,” marked by various drives, particularly the desire for pleasure (which would be akin to the desire for happiness discussed above). On the Freudian view ego development involves the suppression of these various drives (along these lines Horkheimer directly mentions Freud in Eclipse in discussing the way the child relates to the superego which embodies the principles of father-figures; see p. 75). While the development of the ego is necessary, undue repression of our inner drives leads to pathological results. In Excursus II of Dialectic, this repression of inner nature is related to Kant’s moral theory, insofar as it specifies that the will should follow reason against inclination. This complete denial of inclination by calculating reason finds its fullest expression (in an ironic suggestion that would surely horrify Kant) in the writings of the Marquis de Sade. Pleasure, in Sade’s orgies, is submitted to rigorous order, such that the rationalized pursuit of pleasure takes precedence over pleasure itself (pp. 66–69). And importantly in this case it is not only the inner desires that are subjugated; others people are subjugated in the process of subjugating pleasure to organization. This is one instance of Horkheimer and Adorno’s broader claim that the domination of nature leads to the domination of human beings.

The same points are made in Eclipse in the chapter “The Revolt of Nature,” where the domination of inner nature is described as following necessarily from the domination of outer nature. Instrumental reason leads us to dominate outer nature by taking outer nature to be meaningless apart from the way it can satisfy the prerogatives of our self-preservation. But this further requires that our desires must be construed in such a way that they can provide a clear guide for the technological and industrial activity that makes use of outer nature. In this case, “domination becomes ‘internalized’ for domination’s sake. What is usually indicated as a goal—the happiness of the individual, health, wealth—gains its significance exclusively from its functional potentiality” (p. 64). Lohmann 1993 suggestively sums up Horkheimer’s point by referring to the domination of outer and inner nature as a process of “desubstantialization” (p. 392). This connects clearly with the contrast between objective and subjective reason discussed above. Nature loses its objective meaning, or in this sense, its own “substance”; not only in the case of outer nature, but also in the case of inner nature, because of the functionalization of our desires and drives. Eclipse construes this in terms of a loss of autonomy, which would involve our creatively developing drives and desires into ideal ends that could orient the ways we act on our environments (see, for example, 66). This can make sense of the somewhat unique interpretation in Dialectic of Odysseus telling the cyclops that he is “Nobody” (p. 53). As we reduce our inner nature to instrumental functions, we lose any strong sense of self, and thus lack the inner substance in a manner that makes us, metaphorically, into nobodies.

4.3 Sources of Emancipation

The upshot of these views seems to be that reason is self-destructive in a way that limits the very possibility of a rational critique of reason. It is fairly common to interpret the work from the 1940s as being so totalizing in its critique that it closes all avenues for finding in reason the possibility for any emancipatory critique of society (Habermas is the most famous exponent of such a critique, see for example his 1984, pp. 366–399). One can certainly find much pessimistic rhetoric in both Dialectic and Eclipse that supports such a notion. But there are also elements of the text that hint at the possibility for positive social change, such that the emancipatory aim of earlier critical theory is not entirely lost.

The emancipatory aim is not lost, but it is perhaps obscured. In the first essay of Dialectic, it is noted that “a true praxis capable of overturning the status quo depends on theory’s refusal to yield to the oblivion in which society allows thought to ossify” (p. 33). That “theory” and “thought” are so emphasized is important. Relatedly, Horkheimer disavows, in the preface to Eclipse, the idea he should present a program of action, because “action for action’s sake is in no way superior to thought for thought’s sake, and is perhaps even inferior to it” (p. vi). This does not necessarily separate thought from action, of course, and the quote from Dialectic speaks of a “true praxis.” But genuinely emancipatory action is said to depend on correcting problems of thought first, such that Horkheimer would stress thought for thought’s sake. Correcting these problems would require freeing reason from instrumentality, which would mean eschewing formalism. But this does not mean eschewing reason, if there can be a kind of knowing that uses rational concepts while at the same time moving beyond the static form of concepts associated with scientific thinking. Such a view is closely associated with Adorno’s later work (see the entry in this encyclopedia on Adorno, Zuidervaart 2008). It is sometimes argued that the unusual literary style of Dialectic itself is meant to exemplify such an attempt at escaping the ossification of thought (for an interpretation that generally takes such a view, see Honneth 2007). Along somewhat similar lines, modern art might have emancipatory potential, in its ability to express something of the current state of society through means other than formal reasoning. This is, again, a view that is commonly associated with Adorno’s thought. But Horkheimer also presents such a view, especially in his 1941 essay “Art and Mass Culture.” There culture is criticized in a manner similar to the discussion of the culture industry in Dialectic, and a largely pessimistic picture of the restrictive and homogenizing role of contemporary mass culture is presented. But Horkheimer does note that some art can break free of this and still help the human being “conceive of a world different from that in which he lives.” Such works (Horkheimer mentions Joyce’s literature and Picasso’s Guernica) can do so only negatively, however, by displaying the difference between the human being and his or her “barbarous surrounding” (p. 278; on Horkheimer’s views on art see Jay 1993). In the case both of non-ossifying thought and modern art, the emancipatory potential is found only in traces, presented in an esoteric and perhaps abstruse manner. Such a conception of “emancipation” now seems to be somewhat separated from the experience of the proletariat, and is possibly evidence of elitism (see Heller 2002). Whatever one makes of these criticisms, it is clear that Horkheimer was less than sanguine regarding the possibility of positive social change.

Horkheimer does suggest another avenue for emancipatory social change, however. He notes in Eclipse that “there are some forces of resistance left within man,” and that “the spirit of humanity is still alive, if not in the individual as a member of social groups, at least in the individual as far as he is left alone” (p. 95). Unsurprisingly given the tone of the text as a whole, much of what follows that passage discusses the difficulty of separating oneself from the homogenizing forces of society. But Horkheimer does suggest that it is possible to engage in a kind of non-conformism (without much of a description of what it would be like), which comes through the “spontaneity of the individual subject” (p. 99). The emphasis on individual action is tempered, however, through the emphasizing of a point that brings the latter parts of Eclipse back to one of Horkheimer’s earliest views; solidarity can be formed through the experience of shared suffering, and philosophy should “translate what [those who suffer in the face of oppression] have done into language that will be heard” (p.109). How this happens is unclear, as is the connection between individual acts of non-conformism and solidarity. One might also doubt the reliance on the power of the compassion. For a thorough discussion of Eclipse that examines these potential problems, see Lohmann 1993. Whatever one makes of these points, it is clear that this emphasis on suffering is the thread that ties all of the periods of Horkheimer’s work together, as it would continue to be present in Horkheimer’s last works.

5. Late Work

With his return to Frankfurt the year after the publication of both Eclipse of Reason and Dialectic of Enlightenment, Horkheimer’s academic production would largely consist of essays and lectures. He also left a number of unpublished texts from the period, including a set of notes and aphorisms published shortly after his death (along with a set of aphorisms from the early 30s titled Dämmerung) under the name Notizen 1950 bis 1969. There is no real systematic unity to these writings (Habermas 1993, p. 51 even refers to them as “shot through with contradictions”), but there are common themes that can be explored.

One can, for instance, trace out Horkheimer’s late views on the tasks of critical theory. In a remark in Notizen from 1957–1958 titled “Critical Theory,” he pursues the idea mentioned in the preface to Eclipse that philosophy need not be immediately related to practical action. Philosophy “holds up a mirror to the world” but “it is no imperative” (p. 148). It is as though Horkheimer wants to guard against a caricature of his earlier views as blindly equating theory and practice. But there is also a very pessimistic note sounded when Horkheimer says that philosophy “has replaced theology but found no new heaven to which it might point, not even a heaven on earth” (p. 148). Horkheimer touches on these same themes in his 1956 conversations with Adorno in which they preliminarily discussed producing a new (never finished) joint work. In the transcripts of those conversations (which were published in 1989 as a part of Horkheimer’s collected works with the title “Diskussion über Theorie und Praxis”) one finds Horkheimer continually stressing the importance of linking theory to practice without reducing the former to the latter. And while he does at points seem to hold out a vague hope for such a combination of theory and practice, he also pessimistically claims that “it is easy to believe that the whole of world history is just a fly caught in the flames” (p.39). Because of this pessimism, critical theory takes on a primarily negative task. In another note from a collection dated 1966–1969 titled “On Critical Theory” he continues with the idea that no positive conception of the good can be formed, but “if one wishes to define the good as the attempt to abolish evil,” such a view can be formed, and “this is the teaching of Critical Theory” (p. 237).

The negative conception of critical theory is closely related to the renewed interest Horkheimer showed in Schopenhauer in his last works. Schopenhauer is said, in the 1961 essay “Schopenhauer Today,” to be “the teacher for modern times” (p. 81). This is in part because Schopenhauer’s work grasps the need to focus on the suffering of the present as it is, without covering it over with a false philosophical conception of the good. To a certain extent this repeats the earlier emphasis on suffering and rejection of metaphysics. But these points work in a much more pessimistic direction, because, “according to Schopenhauer, philosophy does not set up any practical aims” (p. 80). It rather focuses on correctly grasping suffering. Schopenhauerian pessimism also connects with an interest in negative theology in Horkheimer’s late work. In 1935, he would write that the religious belief in another world of perfect justice, when uncoupled from “the inhibiting religious form” amounted to a positive force for social change (Horkheimer 1935c, p. 131). In his late writings this combination of criticism of organized religion and respect for the desire for the “wholly other” would be further developed (see Siebert 1976). In religious beliefs, if not in organized religion, Horkheimer would find a desire for a better world that never forgets the suffering of this world (see, for instance, Horkheimer 1963).

The overall tenor of Horkheimer’s last writings has led some to criticize him for falling into a backhanded form of conservatism (see, for example, Bronner 1994, pp. 88–92). This criticism makes some sense, especially when one considers the political climate of the late 1960s that served as a backdrop for his latest work. It is pertinent, along these lines, that he was generally opposed to the radical student movements, and he supported (with much qualification) the Vietnam War as an attempt to halt the totalitarian movement of Chinese Communism (on these points see Stirk 1992, 178–181). But Horkheimer did not give up on the possibility of radical action entirely. For example, Notizen ends on something of a positive note by ( in the note “For Nonconformism”) holding out hope that the “critical analysis of demagogues” might aid the practical work of those who are attempting to create non-conformist collectives that work against current society. But the primary possibility for hope discussed in Horkheimer’s later work is compassion, as seen at the end of the 1961 essay “The German Jews”:

The decisive point—and the real task of education without which neither the Jewish nor the Christian nor the German cause is helped—is that men should become sensitive not to injustice against the Jews but to any and all persecution, and that something in them should rebel when any individual is not treated as a rational being. (p. 118)

In a way, this passage sums up the aim of all of Horkheimer’s work, early to late. The task of education, and the task of the critical theorist, is to foster such compassionate sensitivity to injustice.


A partial bibliography, written in English, of Horkheimer’s works can be found in S. Benhabib, W. Bonß, and J. McCole (eds.), On Max Horkheimer: New Perspectives, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 1993. An extensive bibliography of primary and secondary sources, written in German, can be found in Max Horkheimer Gesammelte Schriften, Band 19: Nachträge, Verzeichnisse, und Register, A Schmidt and G. Schmid Noerr (eds.), Frankfurt am Main: Fischer, 1996.

Primary Sources

References in the text above are to the English translations, where available. Horkheimer’s works can be found in various collections in German, but there is one primary collected edition:

  • Max Horkheimer Gesammelte Schriften, 19 volumes, A Schmidt and G. Schmid Noerr, (eds.), Frankfurt am Main: Fischer.

Below are the bibliographical entries for the cited English translations, listed by original publication date:

  • 1931, “The Present Situation of Social Philosophy and the Tasks of an Institute for Social Research,” in Between Philosophy and Social Science: Selected Early Writings, G. Hunter, M. Kramer and J. Torpey, (trans.), Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 1993, pp. 1–14.
  • 1932, “Notes on Science and the Crisis,” in Critical Theory: Selected Essays, M. O’Connell (ed.), New York: Continuum Press, 1999, pp. 3–9.
  • 1933a, “Materialism and Metaphysics,” in Critical Theory: Selected Essays, pp. 10–46.
  • 1933b, “Materialism and Morality,” in Between Philosophy and Social Science: Selected Early Writings, pp. 15–47.
  • 1934a, Dämmerung, partially translated as “Dawn: Notes 1926–1931,” in Dawn and Decline: Notes 1926–1931 & 1950–1969, M. Shaw, (trans.), New York: Seabury Press, 1978, pp. 15–112.
  • 1934b, “On Bergson’s Metaphysics of Time,” Radical Philosophy, P. Thomas and S. Martin, (trans.), 131(May/June 2005): pp. 9–19.
  • 1934c, “The Rationalism Debate in Contemporary Philosophy,” in Between Philosophy and Social Science: Selected Early Writings, pp. 217–264.
  • 1935a, “On the Problem of Truth,” in Between Philosophy and Social Science: Selected Early Writings, pp. 177–215.
  • 1935b, “Remarks on Philosophical Anthropology,” in Between Philosophy and Social Science: Selected Early Writings, pp. 151–175.
  • 1935c, “Thoughts on Religion,” in Critical Theory: Selected Essays, pp. 129–131.
  • 1936, “Egoism and Freedom Movements: On the Anthropology of the Bourgeois Era,” in Between Philosophy and Social Science: Selected Early Writings, pp. 49–110.
  • 1937a, “The Latest Attack on Metaphysics,” Critical Theory: Selected Essays, pp. 132–187.
  • 1937b, “Traditional and Critical Theory,” in Critical Theory: Selected Essays, pp. 188–243.
  • 1937c, “Postscript,” in Critical Theory: Selected Essays, pp. 24–252.
  • 1941, “Art and Mass Culture,” in Critical Theory: Selected Essays, pp. 273–290.
  • 1947a, with T. Adorno, Dialectic of Enlightenment: Philosophical Fragments, E. Jephcott, (trans.), G. Schmid Noerr, (ed.), Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press, 2002.
  • 1947b, Eclipse of Reason, London: Continuum Press, 2004.
  • 1961a, “Schopenhauer Today,” in Critique of Instrumental Reason: Lectures and Essays Since the End of WWII, M. O’Connell, (trans.), New York: Seabury Press, 1974, pp. 63–83.
  • 1961b, “The German Jews,” in Critique of Instrumental Reason: Lectures and Essays Since the End of WWII, pp. 101–118.
  • 1963, “Theism and Atheism,” in Critique of Instrumental Reason: Lectures and Essays Since the End of WWII, pp. 34–50.
  • 1968, “Preface,” in Critical Theory: Selected Essays, pp. v-x
  • 1974, Notizen 1950 bis 1969, partially translated as “Decline: Notes 1950–1969,” in Dawn and Decline: Notes 1926–1931 & 1950–1969, pp. 113–240.
  • 1989, with T. Adorno, “Diskussion über Theorie und Praxis,” in Max Horkheimer Gesammelte Schriften v. 13, translated as Towards a New Manifesto, R. Livingstone, (trans.), London: Verso 2011.

Secondary and Other Sources

  • Aboulafia, M., M. Bookman, and C. Kemp (eds.), 2002, Habermas and Pragmatism, London: Routledge.
  • Abromeit, J., 2011, Max Horkheimer and the Foundations of the Frankfurt School, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Benhabib, S., 1986, Critique, Norm, and Utopia: A Study of the Foundations of Critical Theory, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Bonß, W., 1993, “The Program of Interdisciplinary Research and the Beginnings of Critical Theory,” in On Max Horkheimer: New Perspectives, S. Benhabib, W. Bonß, and J. McCole (eds.), Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, pp. 99–125.
  • Borman, D., 2017, “Materialism in Critical Theory: Marx and the Early Horkheimer,” in The Palgrave Handbook of Critical Theory, M. Thompson (ed.), New York: Palgrave Macmillan, pp.207–229.
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