Leibniz on Causation

First published Tue Feb 15, 2005; substantive revision Wed Sep 6, 2017

Substances, according to Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz (1646–1716), always act; furthermore, since even finite, created substances are naturally indestructible and thus immortal, substances continue to act forever. To what or to whom do substances causally owe their action? In Leibniz’s day, this question more or less becomes a question about the causal role of God. Is God the only genuine causal agent in nature? Or does God’s causal contribution, at least in the ordinary development of nature, consist “merely” in the creation and conservation of created substances? We will see that Leibniz holds that both God and created substances are causally responsible for changes in the states of substances. There is another question particularly salient for the seventeenth century philosopher: What kinds of causes are present in substantial activity? Just thirty years after Leibniz’s death, David Hume stated that his own definition of cause entails that “all causes are of the same kind,” namely, efficient (i.e., productive) causes. Leibniz’s theory of causation instead integrates efficient, final, and even formal causes, as it tries to explain away real causation among phenomenal things with the infamous pre-established harmony.

1. Competing Theories of Causation

Leibniz assumes that all events have causes—they don’t just happen—and considers only three theories of causation worthy of philosophical consideration: physical influx, occasionalism, and parallelism. Let’s summarize in turn each of these theories.

According to the theory of physical influx, there is an inflow between cause and effect; in other words, there is intersubstantial causation among finite (i.e., non-divine) substances. So, for instance, when Andres Segovia appears to strum his guitar, he really is the cause of the vibration of the strings. In this case, motion is a mode or state of the body of Segovia and is transferred or communicated to the body of his guitar. Interestingly, the term ‘physical’ notwithstanding, the theory of physical influx is not limited to material finite substances. For physical influx sometimes is invoked to explain the causal interaction among immaterial finite substances (e.g., minds) and material finite substances (e.g., bodies). Accordingly, it is more accurate to take the term ‘physical’ to mean natural rather than material. Francisco Suarez, Thomas Hobbes, Pierre Gassendi, and Robert Boyle, among others, subscribed to some variety of physical influx.

Occasionalism denies causation not only among finite substances, and so rules out any inflow between cause and effect, but also within finite substances. In other words, regarding finite substances, there is neither intersubstantial nor intrasubstantial causation. Taken individually or jointly, finite substances have no genuine causal efficacy. When the strings of Segovia’s guitar vibrate, Segovia is not the real cause of the vibration. Nor are his fingers, wrist, and arm real causes. Is the vibration then uncaused for the occasionalist? No, for there is God. God, thought by many of Leibniz’s contemporaries to be the only infinite substance, is considered to be the only real cause. God causes the strings on Segovia’s guitar to vibrate on the occasion of Segovia’s volition—itself caused by God—to strum the strings on his guitar. Al-Ghazali, Nicolas Malebranche, and Louis La Forge, among others, were occasionalists.

Like occasionalism, the theory of parallelism holds that there is no intersubstantial causation among finite substances. And like occasionalism, when the strings of Segovia’s guitar vibrate, Segovia is not the real cause of the vibration. Nor, again, are his fingers, wrist, or arm real causes. Nevertheless, it is not God who is the total real cause of this vibration. According to parallelism, finite substances can be real causes. Rather the strings themselves are causing themselves to vibrate. Due to the special harmony between mind and body and not because of any direct causal relation, when Segovia is in a state of willing his fingers to strum the strings on his guitar, the strings are in a physical state that would result in their vibration.

Leibniz was and is the most famous proponent of parallelism. His version is properly called “pre-established harmony” and is usually interpreted to encompass four main tenets:

  1. no change in the states of a created substance is due to another created substance (i.e., there is no intersubstantial causation);
  2. all (non-initial, natural) change in the states of a created substance is due (at least in part) to that substance itself (i.e., there is intrasubstantial causation);
  3. each created substance has a “blueprint” (i.e., a complete concept or law of the series) that “lists” or includes all of its states; and,
  4. each “blueprint” conforms with the blueprints of all other created substances (i.e., each of a created substance’s natural states cohere with all the natural states of every other created substance).

For expression of these four tenets, see, for example, Leibniz’s letters to Arnauld, Nov. 28/Dec. 8 1686 and Apr. 30 1687, and Monadology §81. Consider also this 1704 articulation of the pre-established harmony:

Each of these souls expresses in its own manner what occurs outside itself, and it cannot do so through any influence of other particular beings (or, to put it a better way, it has to draw up [devant] this expression from the depths of its own nature); and so necessarily each soul must have received this nature—this inner source of the expression of what lies without—from a universal cause [cause universelle], upon which all of these beings depend and which brings it about that each of them perfectly agrees with and corresponds to the others. (New Essays A vi, 6, 440)

As to be expected, there is some controversy regarding the interpretation of these tenets; for instance, tenet 2 is sometimes extended to also include non-initial states (see Whipple, 206). There is another important aspect of the pre-established harmony. A substance’s expressions arising “from the depths of its own nature” are also called perceptions by Leibniz. Perception is “[t]he passing state which involves and represents a multitude in a unity” (Monadology §14 GP vi, 608/AG 214). The pre-established harmony consists in the isomorphic mapping of perceptions and bodily motions. Whenever a substance has a perception x there will be a corresponding bodily state y expressing that perception x. So when I perceive myself as putting a log in the fire “[my] animal spirits and [my] blood [take] on, at exactly the right moment, the motions required to correspond to the passions and the perceptions of [my] soul” (New System GP iv, 484/L 458).

Note, however, that the four main tenets of Leibniz’s pre-established harmony leave room for God’s supernatural causal activity even in the actions of finite substances. In other words, pre-established harmony, in Leibniz’s hands at least, is a form of concurrentism. More of this will be addressed in the section on divine causation, but for now it is enough to say that God’s causal role in the actions of finite substances at the very minimum is to pre-establish the concomitance or conjunction between “causes” and “effects,” without which God’s aim of producing universal and maximum harmony (Monadology §§85ff) would be frustrated.

Why is Leibniz drawn to the rather bizarre-sounding pre-established harmony? In other words, why does he reject the more terrene physical influx and the more celestial occasionalism?

2. Why does Leibniz reject Physical Influx?

Leibniz wants to rule out any kind of causation in which one substance passes something on to the other substance: “The way of influence belongs to that of the common philosophy. However, since it is impossible to conceive of material particles or of species or immaterial qualities that can pass from one of these substances into the other, the view must be rejected” (GP iv, 498f). Early in his career, Leibniz dismisses the physical influx theory of the Scholastic Francisco Suarez as a “barbaric expression … metaphorical and more obscure than what it defines” (Preface to an Edition of Nizolius GP iv, 150). (Whether Suarez actually held the view Leibniz ascribes to him is another matter entirely.) Moreover, the pre-established harmony can achieve the same effect without the metaphysical baggage of “property passing”: “So there will be a perfect accord between all these substances which produces the same effect that would be noticed if they all communicated with each other by a transmission of species or of qualities, as the common run of philosophers imagine” (New System GP iv, 484/L 457f).

It is fairly clear here that Leibniz takes ‘influx’ to refer to the transference of accidents—today we call them tropes or property-instances—as when a guitarist’s fingers give an instance of motion to a struck guitar string. Leibniz holds that it cannot be comprehended how one finite substance could act on another finite substance. For such intersubstantial causation entails the transference or migration of an accident from one substance to another, where a trope passes from one thing to another, which then instantiates it. Such transference is inexplicable; an accident passing (i.e., trope transferring) from one subject to another is impossible (New Essays A vi, 6, 224). Leibniz writes in the Discourse on Metaphysics:

… nothing ever enters into our mind naturally from the outside; and we have a bad habit of thinking of our soul as if it received certain species as messengers and as if it has doors and windows. We have all these forms in our mind; we even have forms from all time, for the mind always expresses all its future thoughts and already thinks confusedly about everything it will ever think about distinctly. (Discourse on Metaphysics §26 GP iv, 451/AG 58)

And he writes almost three decades later: “Monads have no windows, through which anything could come in or go out. And accidents cannot detach themselves and stroll about outside of substances, as the Scholastics’ sensible species used to; so neither substance nor accident can come into a monad from outside” (Monadology §7 GP vi, 608/WF 268).

Leibniz also argues in this way: If the mind (one finite substance) were to act on the body (another finite substance) thereby causing bodily motion, there would be an increase in motion in that region of the world after the mind’s action on the body not compensated for by a decrease in motion in another region. This is an obvious violation of the law of the conservation of motion. Therefore, there is no physical influx. The Monadology includes the following passage:

Descartes recognized that souls cannot impart a force to bodies because there is always the same quantity of force in matter [i.e., the material world]. However, he thought that the soul could change the direction of [force in] bodies. But that is because the law of nature, which also affirms the conservation of the same total direction in matter, was not known at that time. If he had known it, he would have hit upon my system of pre-established harmony. (Monadology §80 GP vi, 620f/AG 223)

Part of what troubles Leibniz about the doctrine of physical influx is that in acting, the cause is drained. According to Leibniz, real causation entails that the cause not lose any of its efficacy after exercising its causal power. Leibniz depicts the production of our thoughts, for instance, as involving emanative causation: “it is very evident that created substances depend upon God, who preserves them and who even produces them continually by a kind of emanation, just as we produce our thoughts” (Discourse on Metaphysics §14 GP iv, 439/AG 46). Other commentators have put it this way: “[S]ubstances are to be understood as enjoying a lawful primitive force of action whereby accidents emanate from the substance, from within” (Cover & O’Leary-Hawthorne, 181).

It is hard to tell why Leibniz is troubled by any theory that involves the potential loss of causal efficacy in substances. Part of it might have to do with his belief that even finite, created substances are naturally indestructible (i.e., immortal) (Principles of Nature and Grace §2 GP vi, 598/P 195). But then created, finite substances, continually acting according to the physical influx model, might eventually lose their causal efficacy and would no longer be able to act. And for Leibniz, “substances cannot be conceived in their bare essence, devoid of activity; that activity is of the essence of substance in general” (New Essays A vi, 6, 65). So, physical influx would entail the natural mortality of substance, a view that Leibniz wholly rejects.

Consider another expression of Leibniz’s anti-influx position:

No created substance exerts a metaphysical action or influence on another, for to say nothing of the fact that it cannot be explained how anything can pass over from one thing into the substance of another, it has already been shown that all the futures of each thing follow from its own concept. What we call causes are in metaphysical rigor only concomitant requisites. (Primary Truths C 521/L 269/AG 33)

Now, the idea here of causes as concomitant requisites and of God “preserving” substances continually by a kind of emanation may suggest occasionalism, but it is clear that Leibniz, after initially showing some sympathy toward occasionalism, eventually rejects it.

3. Why does Leibniz reject Occasionalism?

Occasionalism puts forward a view where God must act for any substance that does not have the causal power itself to act. But since no other substance besides God has the causal power to act for itself, or even in conjunction with other finite substances, God must continually intervene in the course of the world. Leibniz sees this as a serious problem for the occasionalist account of causation.

Since occasionalism entails that God must continually intervene in the course of nature, Leibniz takes this to mean that he must perform continuous miracles—an occupation not entirely worthy of God’s name. He explains:

Let us see, however, whether the system of occasional causes really doesn’t involve a perpetual miracle. [Pierre Bayle] said that it does not, because the system holds that God acts only according to general laws. I agree that he does, but in my view that isn’t enough to remove miracles. Even if God produced them all the time, they would still be miracles, if the word in understood not in the popular sense, as a rare and marvelous thing, but philosophically, as something which exceeds the power of created things. It isn’t sufficient to say that God has made a general law, for in addition to the decree there has also to be a natural way of carrying it out. It is necessary, that is, that what happens should be explicable in terms of the God-given nature of things. (Explanation of Bayle’s Difficulties §7 GP iv, 520/WF 205)

Note Leibniz’s definition of a miracle as simply an event that results from God and not from finite substances. However, Leibniz adds, a world in which God is required to perform continuous miracles is a world less perfect, and thereby less praiseworthy, than a world that “unfolds” naturally without the direct intervention of God (Theodicy §16). The idea is that the doctrine of occasionalism must hold that God did not initially get creation right (even if the occasionalist himself or herself is not willing to make such an assertion) and so must continually step in and repair things to get them to go the way God intends. (This is, of course, not to say that for Leibniz there are no miracles whatsoever. He does speak of events that “surpass all the force of creatures” (Theodicy §249 H 280), including the Creation and the Incarnation.)

For Leibniz, a world of genuinely active substances is more perfect than a world of purely passive or causally inert substances, whose activity is not properly ascribed to them but to God. Ascribing such activity to God alone, Leibniz believes, leads inexorably to Spinozism, where God is the only real substance and where any other thing is just a mode of God or else must invoke a deus ex machina, which for Leibniz is an ad hoc solution (Primary Truths C 521/P 90; GP iv, 515/WF 221). In order to avoid what he thinks is unadulterated Spinozism, Leibniz is keen to emphasize that we must be able to distinguish the actions of God from the actions of created substances. (The success of this endeavor of Leibniz’s is debatable, as discussed in the section on divine causation.)

4. Intersubstantial Causation

Since Leibniz seems to think that intersubstantial causation requires physical influx and physical influx is unacceptable, he concludes, logically enough, that we must reject intersubstantial causation. But Nicholas Jolley notes that Leibniz does not always argue this way. For while consistently rejecting the existence of influx, sometimes Leibniz will not at the same time reject outright the existence of intersubstantial causation. “Leibniz sometimes suggests that our ordinary statements about causal interaction can be understood in such a way that they come out true” (Jolley, 595). Nevertheless, Jolley continues, “When Leibniz simply denies the existence of causal interaction between created substances, he tends to accept the influx analysis; he does not look around for a better analysis that would preserve the truth of our ordinary causal statements” (Jolley, 595). So, on the whole, Leibniz does not take seriously other alternative accounts of intersubstantial causation.

Perhaps because he thinks he already has an account that will work for him—the pre-established harmony—Leibniz does not believe that a plausible theory of causation need be intersubstantial in kind. In other words, Leibniz does not face a problem so many of his contemporaries face: his metaphysics—unlike their own—includes the necessary (and sufficient?) elements to sustain a properly and purely intrasubstantial theory of causation; a Leibnizian created substance is self-sufficient (possessing an inner principle of change that explains all of its property-instances), permanently causally efficacious (acting does not diminish its power), and equipped with a complete concept that conforms to the complete concepts of all other created substances (perceiving or representing one and the same universe). Thus, it makes sense that Leibniz would not feel compelled to defend intersubstantial causation.

This point can be alternatively expressed. A difficult problem in giving an account of intrasubstantial causation concerns the explanation of the difference between causation among systems and causation within a system. For instance, do the works of a watch constitute an isolated system? For even Rolexes, constructed for deep-sea divers, are affected at extreme temperatures and depths. So there is a problem giving an account of causation within a Rolex. A similar problem arises for a seventeenth century philosopher who holds a mechanistic and materialist notion of substance. But Leibniz has no problem with explaining the difference between systems that are causally isolated and systems that cannot be made absolute; his monadic ontology is readily equipped to handle causally isolated units or unities. For his substances are “windowless,” not at all causally compromised by external substances.

There is … no way in which it could make sense for a monad to be altered or changed internally by any other created thing. Because there is nothing to rearrange within a monad, and there is no conceivable internal motion in which it could be excited, directed, increased, or diminished, in the way that it can in a composite, where there is change among the parts. Monads have no windows, through which anything could come in or go out. And accidents cannot detach themselves and stroll about outside of substances, as the Scholastics’ sensible species used to; so neither substance nor accident can come into a monad from outside. (Monadology §7 GP vi, 608/WF 268)

In other words, Leibniz writes, “substances can never prevent one another from performing those works in this universe as far as is possible” (Letter to Arnauld April 30, 1687 §6 WF 125).

In what follows, I will focus on Leibniz’s positive account of causation. The only real causation present in Leibniz’s metaphysics is that within each finite substance and that of God who pre-establishes the harmony among minds and bodies (and minds and minds, and bodies and bodies). So the rest of this entry will address intrasubstantial and divine causation.

5. Intrasubstantial Causation

Whatever can be predicated of a Leibnizian substance is either an attribute (a permanent and common characteristic (GP ii, 227, 257ff)), sometimes called “property” (GP ii, 258/L 533), or an accident (a transitory and individual characteristic (GP ii, 458/L 605; GP iv, 363)), sometimes called “modification” (G ii, 258/L 533; GP ii, 503f). In contemporary lingo, we would call an attribute a “property” and accident a “property-instance” or “trope.” Action is an attribute of substance, for Leibniz defines substance as “a being capable of action” (GP vi, 598). A perception is an accident of a substance, for the action of a substance consists precisely in the fact that they are always changing their perceptions. Now, an attribute must not be considered a substance, since it would be a mistake to equate action with what is acting, or extension with what is extended (New Essays A vi, 6, 210f). Neither is an attribute to be considered an accident, for “an attribute may be predicated of several substances at the same or at different times while an accident can never inhere in more than one substance at the same or at different times” (Clatterbaugh, 1978, 3).

So, for Leibniz, the essence of a created substance is activity, in the sense of being continually in process of change of its perceptions (Letter to De Volder, January 21, 1704, GP ii, 263/L 534). The accidents (tropes or property-instances) of a substance are its perceptions. The change in a created substance must be caused (Primary Truths C 519/L 268), yet there can be no transeunt (i.e., intersubstantial) causation (Discourse on Metaphysics §14, GP iv, 439/L 312/WF 66f). For causal interaction between created substances (i.e., monads) is in principle inexplicable (New System GP iv, 483/L 457) as seen earlier. Therefore, the cause of change of perceptions in a created substance is either to be located in an uncreated substance, namely God, or in the substance itself. But, as we have already seen, Leibniz rejects the view that God alone is the real causal power driving change in substances; as previously shown, he is no occasionalist (Notes on a Reply of Foucher, GP i, 373f/L 155). So, putting God aside for the moment, perceptual change is caused by the substance itself. But surely we want to know what it is about the substance or in the substance that drives perceptual change.

What exactly causes the change of perceptions of a substance? Leibniz holds that both the “primitive active power” of a substance and its perceptions or perceptual states play crucial causal roles in the changes of a substance. (As we shall see, furthermore, God is no minor player in this effort as well.) The primitive active power of a substance, Leibniz tells us, is “a nature or an internal force that can produce in it, in an orderly way … all the appearances or expressions it will have, without the help of any created being” (New System GP iv, 486/AG 144). Moreover, “the present state of each substance is a natural result [consequence] of its preceding state” (Clarification of Difficulties concerning Monsieur Bayle GP iv, 521).

To be clear, however, primitive powers and perceptions do not play the same causal roles, according to Leibniz. Whereas the primitive power of a substance (some commentators maintain that primitive powers and substances are one and the same) is the efficient cause—a post-Humean might say the real cause—of the change of its perceptual states, these states themselves do not function as efficient causes. How perceptual states do function causally is controversial, and we will address this issue later. Whatever the final details of Leibniz’s account happen to be regarding primitive power and perception, one thing is clear: Leibniz’s account runs seriously counter to David Hume’s regarding causation. In 1748, Hume stated that his definition of cause entails that “all causes are of the same kind” (An Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding, 156), whereas Leibniz incorporates efficient, final, and formal causes in his theory of causation. Before discussing these different kinds of causes, however, let us consider a particularly vexed issue in Leibniz’s account of causation: divine causation.

6. Divine Causation

It is difficult to distinguish the actions of God from those of creatures, for some believe that God does everything, while others imagine that he merely conserves the force he has given to creatures. (Discourse on Metaphysics G iv, 432/AG 40)

Not all systems of pre-established harmony are the same. Leibniz’s own version represents a form of concurrentism, since he rejects the view that the change in perceptual states of a created substance is due solely to that created substance itself. As he writes, “Each and every substance is the true and real cause of its own immanent actions and has the power to act … sustained by divine concurrence” (A vi, 4 Strickland 2006). According to Leibniz, both God and created substances are causally responsible for changes in the states of created substances. But God is no minor player in this effort; God is immediately and directly causally present in every aspect of the universe, even in those effects normally attributed to created substances. Consider these two texts:

[God] operates immediately on all created things, continually producing them … (New Essays A vi, 6, 222)

God continually produces all that is real in creatures. But I hold that in doing it he also continually produces or conserves in us that energy or activity which according to me constitutes the nature of substance and the source of its modifications. (New System GP iv 588f/Adams, 98)

Leibniz argues for this view in the Theodicy: “the action of God in conserving should have some reference to that which is conserved, according to what it is and to the state wherein it is; thus his action cannot be general or indeterminate” (Theodicy §27). So even though Leibniz rejects occasionalism, Leibniz does agree with the occasionalist Malebranche that God must be given his causal due. It is certainly not a mere afterthought. In fact, both agree that “conservation is continual creation.” Consider another two passages from Leibniz:

[T]he duration of things (the multiplicity of momentary states) is the total of an infinity of divine fulgurations, of which each one at each instant is a creation or reproduction of everything; which strictly speaking leaves no continuous passage from one state to the next. This provides a perfect proof of that famous truth of Christian theologians and philosophers, that the conservation of things is a continual creation; and it gives a very special way of verifying the dependence of every changeable thing on the unchangeable divinity …. (Letter to Sophie Charlotte GP vii 564f)

And when it is said that the creature depends upon God insofar as it exists and insofar as it acts, and even that conservation is a continual creation, this is true in that God gives always [donne toujours] to the creature and produces continually all that in it is positive, good and perfect, every perfect gift coming from the Father of lights. (Theodicy §31)

Commitment to continual creation is thus an important constraint on Leibniz’s theory of causation. Ultimately, Leibniz adopts a form of concurrentism in which the natural change in the perceptual states of a created substance is due to the direct involvement of both the created substance and God. In other words, created substances possess genuine causal powers even while God’s own causal power is flexed everywhere in creation, including that of created substances and their states.

Since God’s causal activity complements created substances, including our own, Leibniz does not count such activity as miraculous. Properly speaking, this is not intervention on God’s part, but divine cooperation or concurrence. Leibniz writes: “In concurring with our actions, God ordinarily does no more than follow the laws he has established, that is, he continually conserves and produces our being in such a way that thoughts come to us spontaneously or freely in the order that the notion pertaining to our individual substance contains them, a notion in which they could be foreseen from all eternity” (Discourse on Metaphysics §30 AG 63).

Should we take take Leibniz’s word for it? Some commentators are not convinced that Leibniz consistently advocates concurrentism, for if the doctrine of continual creation was taken seriously (that is, that God continuously produces all things), then how can anything but occasionalism be the natural upshot? David Scott puts it this way: “After all, it is a fundamental Leibnizian tenet that the ‘degree of perfection’ of a thing is the extent to which that thing acts. [Discourse on Metaphysics §15] Thus, if a thing’s perfection or action is ‘due to God’ (as opposed to itself) then we have a de facto occasionalism in which God does all the work. The question here is what sense can be made of the idea that God’s conservation is a ‘support’ for the ‘natural permanence of a thing which comes into existence’” (Scott §4). Scott continues to claim that “the notion of God supporting the natural permanence of things is a contradiction in Leibnizian terms, resolvable only if a greater, occasionalist-like dependence of nature upon God is admitted.” The problem, however, is that Leibniz certainly does reject occasionalism and specifically tries to show (unsuccessfully, according to Scott) that continual creation is consistent with the genuine causal activity of created substances. Perhaps it is inescapably philosophically untenable, but Leibniz’s view is that “[God’s action] cannot be general or indeterminate. … Conservation by God consists in the perpetual immediate influence which the dependence of creatures demands” (Theodicy §27).

It may be tempting to say that for Leibniz we know that God does act on created substances continually, but we cannot understand how he does this. Consider what Leibniz writes in the New Essays: “[A]ll monads were created by God and depend on him; yet we cannot understand in detail how this was done; and fundamentally the preservation of monads is nothing but a continual creation, as the Scholastics knew very well” (New Essays A vi, 6, 443). Perhaps Leibniz simply adopts the Cartesian stance—that God is a sui generis cause, the likes of which we would be rash to think we can learn anything meaningful.

Unlike Descartes, however, Leibniz does try to explain how God acts on creatures: “created substances depend on God, who conserves them and even produces them continually by a kind of emanation as we produce our thoughts” (Discourse on Metaphysics §14 GP iv 439/PM 26). This suggests Leibniz’s preferred way of reconciling God’s creation and concurrence with creaturely activity. Continual creation is to be understood in terms of God’s emanative activity. Emanation is how God sustains the activity of substances.

Leibniz’s appeal to emanation needs some explanation and defense, however. Jonathan Bennett, for one, finds this idea “astonishing”:

When we “produce our thoughts,” we cause some alteration in ourselves; that is, our thoughts “emanate from our substance” only because the substance has the thoughts, just as faces have blushes, bowls have shapes, and so on. Leibniz’s comparison implies that God’s conserving us is his causing himself to be in some state, which then implies that we are not separate substances, but rather states or modes of God. Leibniz would reject that, calling it “Spinozism.” I do not understand his offering a comparison which so obviously implies it. (Bennett, 245)

It us debatable whether Bennett fully grasps Leibniz’s analogy. The point of Leibniz’s analogy between substantial thought or perception and God’s conservation is to reveal two important aspects of emanation: (1) that God’s causal influence on us in continual (just as substances always perceive); and (2) that this influence doesn’t diminish God’s causal power (just as thinking doesn’t seem to diminish our ability to think) (Mercer, 189).

Since a substance is more perfect than its mental states, the power of a substance is in no way diminished when it perceives or thinks. The active principle in a substance offers thoughts to itself—thoughts produced by emanation (Mercer, 325, 366f). A third aspect of emanation is equally important: Neither the emanator (God) nor the emanatee (created substance) is diminished causally. We can attribute to Leibniz the following view: God’s role in intrasubstantial causation, besides that which is implied by miraculous intervention, is an emanatory one (Discourse on Metaphysics §28; New Essays A, 6, 210f). An emanative mode of causal activity is one in which the cause includes, in some “eminent” or higher form, what it gives to its effect, without losing the ability to produce the same kind of effect in the future. But a substance, undergoing this kind of intervention or causal process, need not lose its natural causal efficacy. So I think that Bennett misses the main implication of the Discourse on Metaphysics §14 passage; the implication is not that we are modes of God, but that our causal agency is analogous to God’s. Causally speaking at least, we are made in the image of God. (This feature of emanation also reveals one shortcoming of Jeffrey McDonough’s otherwise excellent analogy of divine continual creation. McDonough points out that “my freezer can be thought of as creating and conserving particular ice cubes through a single continuous action that begins when a tray of water is put in the ice box, and ends when the cubes are removed” (McDonough, 2007, 50). This analogy nicely captures the concurrence of continual creation but it fails to capture the non-entropic nature of such creation, for freezers are certainly not 100% efficient.)

There is another problematic aspect of Bennett’s analysis of Leibniz’s thought analogy. He seems to suggest that something that has causal power must necessarily have productive causal power. Bennett asks rhetorically: If we are to God as our thoughts are to ourselves, then how can we produce anything? But it would be a mistake to think that Leibniz would concur with such an inference. In fact, Leibniz probably would not, since final causes clearly figure into his account of the causal power of created substances: “perceptions in the monad arise from one another by the laws of appetites, or by the laws of the final causes of good and evil, which consist in notable perceptions, ordered or disordered” (Principles of Nature and Grace §3 GP vi 598/AG 207). These appear to be genuine causes in Leibniz’s metaphysics, giving potency to created substances, and helping serve to “distinguish the actions of God from those of creatures” (Discourse on Metaphysics §8); however, echoing Aristotle, final causes are not productive causes. There is a general moral to be gleaned here as well. Unless Leibniz indicates otherwise, it is a mistake to equate causal power and activity with productive or efficient causality. (Not surprisingly, there is a further complication here. For, as we will see in the next section, at least one commentator thinks that for Leibniz some final causes are actually efficient.)

Leibniz wants to reconcile continual creation with creaturely causal power and activity in order to defend concurrentism, and now we can see that a promising answer (at least as a way of understanding Leibniz) is to understand continual creation as a kind of emanation. Emanation seems compatible with God’s “continual creation” (that is, immediate and direct causal influence on and continual production of all things) and the power, activity and so (relative) autonomy of created substances. In other words, continual creation need not be understood as an occasionalist doctrine. But in what sense precisely are created substances genuine causes? What grounds the causal power, activity, and (relative) autonomy of creatures? We need to gain a better sense of Leibniz’s account of intrasubstantial or immanent causality.

7. Efficient (Productive) Causation

To understand Leibniz’s theory of intrasubstantial causality better (and also to acquaint ourselves with some interpretive difficulties), let us first focus on considerations having to do with efficient causation. Then we will discuss final and formal causation.

A point of terminological clarification is needed. According to Leibniz, the terms ‘efficiently cause’ and ‘produce’ are synonymous: “It must be admitted that in saying that ‘efficient cause’ is what produces and ‘effect is what is produced, you are merely dealing in synonyms” (New Essays A vi, 6, 228). Elsewhere, Leibniz defines ‘efficient cause’ as “active cause” (A vi, 2, 490; C 472).

Now, Leibniz consistently refers to the causal efficacy or productivity of substances. Consider the following texts:

… the modifications which can occur to a single subject naturally and without miracles must arise from limitations and variations of a real genus, that is, of a constant and absolute inherent nature. (New Essays A vi, 6, 65 (1702))

Anything which occurs in what is strictly a substance must be a case of action in the metaphysically rigorous sense of something which occurs in the substance spontaneously arising out [arrive] of its own depths. (New Essays A vi, 6, 210)

… free or intelligent substances possess something greater and more marvelous, in a kind of imitation of God. For they are not bound by any certain subordinate laws of the universe, but act by a private miracle as it were, on the sole initiative of their own power… (“Necessary and Contingent Truths” C 10/PM 100 (1686))

… why should God be unable to give substance, from the beginning, a nature or an internal force that can produce [produire] in it, in an orderly way…all the appearance or expressions it will have, without the help of any created being? This is especially so since the nature of substance necessarily requires and essentially involves progress or change, without which it would not have the force to act. (New System GP iv, 485 (1695))

Whether passive substances truly exist or not, active agencies “are responsible for whatever activity is attributed to the former” (Shapere, 45). Leibniz’s principle (which has it ancestors principally in Stoicism) is this: “Whatever is fundamentally explanatory must be an active principle” (Shapere, 45). The purely passive cannot do anything unless it is acted upon. At times, Leibniz seems to think that only the truly active exists: “we can show from the inner truths of metaphysics that what is not active is nothing, for there is no such thing as a mere potentiality to act without any initial action” (“On the True Method in Philosophy and Theology” W 64 (1686)). If all things that exist are substances, and the essence of substance is activity, then passive “substances” do not truly exist, since they are passive, that is, not active (Shapere, 46).

Consider this passage where Leibniz not only attributes causal efficacy or activity to finite substances, but also causal efficiency or productivity:

Bayle asserts, for instance, that by purely philosophical meditations one can never attain to an established certainty that we are are the efficient cause [la cause efficiente] of our volitions. But this is a point which I do not concede to him: for the establishment of this system demonstrates beyond a doubt that in the course of nature each substance is the sole cause of all its actions, and that it is free of all physical influence from every other substance, save the customary cooperation of God. (Theodicy §300)

But Nicholas Jolley, among others, insists that “[a]lthough Leibniz may say that it is substances which produce their states, this is only a loose way of speaking” (Jolley, 605). Strictly speaking, according to Jolley, “substance A caused perceptual state p2” is shorthand for “there is some perceptual state p1 such that p1 involves A and p1 causes p2” (Jolley, 605). But does Leibniz indeed take perceptions or perceptual states to be efficient causes? The answer is surprisingly unclear. One problem is that (almost) invariably the language Leibniz employs to describe the relationship among perceptions or perceptual states is not explicitly causal (in the efficient or productive sense at least). Leibniz predominantly uses terms such as ‘consequence’, ‘suite’, ‘sequitur’, ‘résultat’, ‘tend’, and ‘derivantur’, when speaking of the passage from one perceptual state to another (GP ii 47, 91f, 372; GP iv 440, 521), terms which should make us hesitate in automatically attributing to Leibniz a theory of causally efficacious perceptions or perceptual states. Consider the following representative sample of texts:

… every present state of a substance occurs to it spontaneously and is only a consequence of [une suite de] its preceding state. (Remarks on a Letter to Arnauld, GP ii, 47)

Everything occurs in each substance in consequence of [en consequence du] the first state that God gave it in creating it … (Letter to Arnauld, April 30, 1687, GP ii, 91)

… all our future thoughts and perceptions are merely consequences [que des suites], thought contingent, of our preceding thoughts and perceptions (Discourse on Metaphysics §14 GP iv, 440)

… the present state of each substance is a natural result [consequence] of its preceding state… (Clarification of Difficulties concerning Monsieur Bayle, GP iv, 521)

… every present perception leads to [que la suite de] a new perception… (Theodicy §403)

… subsequent [perceptions] are derived [derivantur] from preceding ones (Letter to Des Bosses, GP ii, 372 (1709))

This is just not the kind of language we should expect to find from Leibniz when speaking of efficient or productive causes. Further, when Leibniz does claim that perceptions or perceptual states produce other states, it’s difficult to determine if such a claim is to be taken strictly. Consider these claims:

And really it can be said that the representation of the end in the mind is the efficient cause of the representation of the means in the same mind. (Notes on Stahl 1702, D ii, 2, 134)

… the representation of the present state of the universe in the soul of the dog will produce in it the representation of the following state of the same universe, just as in objects the preceding state effectively produces the following state of the world. In a soul, the representations of causes are the causes of the representations of effects. (GP iv, 533/WF 78)

Laurence Carlin takes these passages to mean that “deliberation of means depends on perceptions of ends in the sense that the latter are the efficient causes of the former” (Carlin, 226). Now, neither the term “perception” nor “perceptual state” is used in these passages, but in alignment with Carlin’s interpretation Leibniz defines perception as “the internal state of the monad representing external objects” (Principles of Nature and Grace §4) and “the transitory state that involves and represents a multiplicity in the unity” (Monadology §14). One problem with Carlin’s interpretation of these passages, however, is that there is another passage from the Theodicy that may indicate that these passages are not to be taken strictly:

When we say that an intelligent substance is moved by the goodness of its object, we do not assert that this object is necessarily a being existing outside the substance, and it is enough for us that it be conceivable: for its representation acts in the substance, or rather [ou plutôt] the substance acts upon itself, insofar as it is disposed and influenced by this representation. (Remarks on King §21 in Theodicy; my emphasis)

This passage can be read to mean that speaking of a substance’s representation acting (as an efficient cause) is only a loose way of speaking; strictly speaking, it is the substance, or better, power of the substance, that acts in accordance with this representation (presumably functioning as a final cause). More on this issue in the section on final causation, but the main point is that textually it is difficult to know whether or not Leibniz takes perceptions or perceptual states to be efficient causes. Of course, all of the texts adduced up to this point could accommodate the view that for Leibniz perceptions or perceptual states function as efficient causes, for while the terms ‘consequence’ and ‘derivantur’, for instance, do not entail efficient causation, they are still compatible with it.

However, the above texts aside, there is a philosophical worry with attributing efficiency or productivity to perceptions on Leibniz’s metaphysics. The question is whether perceptions can function as active agencies (and so efficient causes) for Leibniz. In Leibniz’s ontology, what is active is a true, enduring unity and a center of force—a substance. Leibniz writes that “everything that acts is an individual substance” (“On Nature Itself” AG 160). To understand perceptions and perceptual states as causally ordered, in the sense that efficient causal and not merely lawful or regular or final causal relations obtain among them, is to subscribe to an event oriented model of causation. But Leibniz, not only like his medieval predecessors but also many of his contemporaries, subscribes to a rather different model—one in which a real cause must be a substance or a power of that substance. (More on this in the section on causal models.) Therefore, unless perceptions are genuine substances and so not events, it seems to follow that for Leibniz, perceptions (and perceptual states) are causally inefficacious.

8. Final and Formal Causation

If Leibniz does not think that perceptions can function as efficient or productive causes, why does Leibniz even speak of later perceptions as natural consequences of earlier perceptions, if not causally? There seem to be two good reasons for this. First, there is a purpose or end guiding the unfolding of perceptions in each substance. The substance (or primitive power) acts efficiently in order to fulfill this end. Such an end may be called a final cause. Second, Leibniz wishes to ground his Law of Continuity—that all change in nature is continuous (i.e., in nature there are no gaps). This points to formal causation in substances. In other words, the picture we come away with in Leibniz is that a substance’s perceptions, representing final and formal causes, rationally determine that substance’s future states. The object of a perception is a final cause insofar as each perception specifies why certain states should be produced rather than others. Perceptions themselves are formal causes insofar as they specify the content of a substance’s future states.

Let’s first consider how the objects of perceptions operate as final causes. Leibniz speaks of perceptual states as unfolding spontaneously in monads according to a metaphysically basic order of causal relations. But the fact that perceptions are automatically and irreducibly causally ordered need only mean that “prior” perceptions contain the reason for subsequent perceptions. This is the way Jan Cover puts it: Temporal priority depends on a relation of “involves a reason for” (Cover, 317). Now, according to Leibniz, “A reason is a known truth whose connection with some less well-known truth leads up to give our assent to the latter. But it is called reason, especially and par excellence, if it is the cause not only of our judgment but also of the truth itself—which makes it known as an a priori reason” (New Essays A vi, 6, 475). As mentioned earlier, Leibniz also speaks of appetitions as a substance’s “tendencies to go from one perception to another” (GP vi, 598/AG 207). That perceptions come and go according to final causes is apparent in the following passage from the Principles of Nature and Grace §3: “perceptions in the monad arise from one another by the laws of appetites, or by the laws of the final causes of good and evil, which consist in notable perceptions, ordered or disordered” (GP vi, 598/AG 207). Leibniz writes in the same work: “the future can be read in the past; the distant is expressed in the proximate” (GP vi, 605/AG 211). The moral is that perceptions function as teleological explananda, which is reminiscent of Aristotle’s account of final causation, where natural processes are completed and regulated by a final state or end, towards which they tend.

It is also worth noting that Leibniz does not limit his doctrine of final causation to the conscious activity of rational agents, for he holds that a mental state can function as a final cause without our being aware of it. In a letter to Sophie Charlotte, Leibniz writes: “So that even in our instinctive or involuntary actions, where it seems only the body plays a part, there is in the soul an appetite for good or an aversion to evil which directs it, even though our reflection is not able to pick it out in the confusion” (GP III, 347; WF 224f.). Nor does Leibniz restrict final causation to rational agents. (Nor does Aristotle for that matter.) The final cause of a plant or an animal is not a plan or intention. Rather, it is whatever lies at the end of the regular series of developmental changes that it undergoes. 

Let’s now explain the presence of formal causation in perception. Some thinkers contemporaneous with Leibniz, most notably Pierre Bayle, found the apparent lack of continuity among our perceptions to be deeply problematic. For, given the Law of Continuity, Leibniz cannot allow perceptions to arise in a monad that are radically unlike preceding perceptions. To solve this problem, Leibniz offers his theory of petites or unconscious perceptions and says that this apparent lack of continuity in the actions of the individual substance results from our overlooking the complex multitude of unconscious perceptions, which flow, at every moment, from the individual’s nature. But the doctrine of petite perceptions alone is not sufficient to ground continuity. Rather, it is the rational relation among perceptions that serves to guarantee continuity in perceptual content. Leibniz speaks of the “marks [les marques]” that each perception of a substance contains for all other perceptions that substance will ever have (Discourse on Metaphysics §8). I take it that this relation among perceptions points to perceptions being formal causes; that is to say, a substance’s present states specify fully the content of its future states.

So, to summarize, what causes the changes in perceptions? Three species of cause: efficient causes (in accordance with laws of mind and active forces), final causes (in accordance with the law of appetites and ultimately God’s aim of universal and maximum harmony), and formal causes (in accordance with the Law of Continuity). Leibniz’s account of intrasubstantial causation therefore involves a tight connection between efficient, final, and formal causes. This should not be surprising, since Leibniz tells us that “[a] cause in the realm of things corresponds to a reason in the realm of truths, which is why causes themselves—and especially final ones—are often called reasons” (New Essays A vi, 6, 475).

None of this should be surprising. Hume may have endorsed just one species of cause—efficient—but final and formal causation did not die with the advent of mechanistic science and philosophy in the seventeenth century. Besides Leibniz, Gassendi, Boyle, and Newton all accommodated final or teleological causation in their systems. Baruch Spinoza is really the only known philosopher in the seventeenth century who truly has no place for final causation in his philosophy, except in the sense that artifacts have final causes (e.g., chairs serve a purpose and carpenters create them in part to achieve that purpose). On the other hand, Spinoza probably does endorse formal causation in his metaphysics of substance.

9. Causal Models

It has been noted that “[p]erhaps the greatest difference between a contemporary concept of causation and a seventeenth century concept is one of model. Following in Hume’s footsteps, contemporary philosophers customarily conceive causation as a relation between events (e.g., my flipping the switch caused the light to come on) while seventeenth century philosophers thought of it more as a relation among substances, their qualities, and their ‘powers’ (e.g., I cause my idea of justice)” (Frankel, 57).

Yet this early model of causation possesses at least one virtue that the contemporary one does not. It has the distinct advantage of avoiding any problematic regress of causal explanation. Once a causal sequence of events is laid out, we can always ask why that sequence, and not another, occurred. But an explanation of this sequence, according to an event/event model of causation does not preclude the same question “Why that sequence of events?” being asked of it again and again. On the other hand, Leibniz does not think that the power or will, which are not events at all, but faculties, of an agency or agent, need any explaining. The regress of explanation stops abruptly with the substance. In a letter to De Volder (June 30, 1704), he writes: “To … ask why there is perception and appetite in simple substances is to inquire about something ultramundane, so to speak, and to demand reasons of God why he has willed things to be such as we conceive them to be” (GP ii, 271/L 538). Furthermore, the central message of Leibniz’s essay, Against Barbaric Physics (c. 1713), seems to be that since the actions of substances are in fact spontaneous, there is no way of explaining change in monads unless we posit some force or power that drives substantial action. If it turns out that substances just are forces or powers, as Julia Jorati and John Whipple maintain, it is no violation of this causal model. At any rate, without this agency in monads, there would be no cause sufficient to determine the whole sequence of events and thus no adequate causal explanation of the totality of actions (i.e., perceptions) on the part of substances. And, besides failing to break out of the cycle of explanation that appears to plague event/event models of causation, such a picture appears to violate Leibniz’s Principle of Sufficient Reason:

Thus the sufficient reason, which needs no other reason, must be outside this series of contingent things, and must be found in a substance which is its cause, and which is a necessary being, carrying the reason of its existence with itself. Otherwise, we would not yet have a sufficient reason where one could end the series. (Principles of Nature and Grace §8 GP vi, 604/AG 210)

Hence, we should understand Leibniz’s statement in a letter to Arnauld (May 1686) that “there is always something to be conceived in the subject which provides the explanation why this predicate or this event belongs to it, or why a particular event happened rather than not” (GP ii, 45/PM 60) not in terms of some ideal event contained in the subject as carrying the correlative explanatory role, but the power or principle of change of the subject.

Further lending credence to the claim that Leibniz postulates a substance-accident model of causation, it appears that whenever Leibniz describes the causal relation found within substances, even those depictions that are best understood as metaphorical, those depictions themselves point to a non-homogeneous account of the intrasubstantial causal relata. That is, intrasubstantial causal relata do not involve components of the same kinds. Whether he speaks of the actualizations of an essence, predicates of a subject, values of a function, perceptions of an appetite, cogitations of a will, ends of reason, harmonies of a rule of order, it is clear that Leibniz envisions “effects” which are different in kind from their “causes.” The essence of a substance is not itself an actualization; the function of a substance is not itself a value of a function (Cover & O’Leary-Hawthorne, 229); a substance’s appetite is not itself a perception; the will of a substance is not itself a cogitation, it is a faculty; the reason governing the substance is not itself the end to which it strives; and, the rule of order is not itself an instance of the harmonious agreement among substances.

All told, it seems that Leibniz ascribes to a heterogeneous account of causation, where the cause is different in kind from its effect. Ultimately, Leibniz offers a theory of intrasubstantial causation that incorporates both efficient, final causes, and formal causes, where only substances—or better yet, their powers—can be efficient causes and perceptions have a teleological as well as a formal function.

10. Conceptual “Outline” of Leibnizian Causes

All told, Leibniz’s theory of causation incorporates a variety of causes—some would say a confusing array of causes. To help dispel this confusion, an outline of the various Leibnizian causes may be helpful.

I. Real Causes (Only a substance can be a real cause; that is, effect changes in itself or in another noumenally (New Essays 65).)

  1. Intersubstantial (In which a substance operates transiently or beyond itself. A substance acts on another to cause change; it effects changes in the states of others.)
    1. Productive of a natural state (Such acts of God sustain the active force in the monad (Monadology 47).)
      1. Conservative efficient (God contributes being or perfection to a substance, analogous to the way in which we produce our thoughts (Discourse on Metaphysics 14). This is continual and non-draining. God’s conservation is also special, not general (Theodicy 27).)
    2. Productive of a miracle (Such acts of God “surpass all the force of creatures” (Theodicy 249).)
      1. Creative efficient (God chooses to actualize the most perfect set or totality of compossible substances (New System 4). “God produces substances from nothing” (Theodicy 395).)
    3. Non-productive (That which rationally determines a substances’s future states.) a. Final (God’s reasons to produce, based on the formal and final causes of created substances and the Principle of the Best.)
  2. Intrasubstantial (In which a substance causes change in itself; it effects changes in its own states. “Each substance is the true and real cause of its own immanent actions … sustained by divine concurrence” (A vi, 4).)
    1. Productive (To produce a state is to efficiently cause it (WF 56f; Theodicy 298).)
      1. Efficient (An efficient cause happens in accordance with formal and final causes.)
      2. Final (What a substance’s present states specify about its future states, in terms of why these future states rather than others. Some argue that final causes can be productive (e.g., Carlin 2006).)
    2. Non-productive (That which rationally determines a substance’s future states. A reason-giving cause that is explanatorily prior to the efficient cause.)
      1. Formal (What a substance’s present states specify about its future states, in terms of content.)
      2. Final (What a substance’s present states specify about its future states, in terms of why these future states rather than others.)
        1. Free (When acting, the bearer of a final cause is aware of that cause.)
        2. Unfree (When acting, the bearer of a final cause is not aware of that cause.)


Works of Leibniz

[A] Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz: Sämtliche Schriften und Briefe. Edited by the German Academy of Science. Darmstadt and Berlin: Berlin Academy, 1923–. Cited by series, volume, and page.
[AG] Philosophical Essays. Edited and translated by Roger Ariew and Daniel Garber. Indianapolis: Hackett, 1989.
[C] Opuscules et Fragments Inédits de Leibniz. Edited by Louis Couturat. Paris: Felix Alcan, 1903.
[GM] Leibnizens Mathematische Schriften. Edited by C. I. Gerhardt. Berlin: Weidman, 1875–90. Cited by volume and page.
[GP] Die Philosophischen Schriften von Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz. Edited by C.I. Gerhardt. Berlin: Weidman, 1875–1890. Cited by volume and page.
[H] Theodicy. Edited by Austin Farrer and translated by E.M. Huggard. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1952.
[L] Philosophical Papers and Letters. Edited by Leroy Loemker, 2nd ed. Dordrecht: Reidel, 1969.
[PM] Philosophical Writings. Translated and edited by Mary Morris and G.H.R. Parkinson. London: Dent, 1973.
[NE] New Essays on Human Understanding. Translated and edited by Peter Remnant and Jonathon Bennett. Cambridge: Cambridge UP, 1982.
[S] The Shorter Leibniz Texts. Translated and edited by Lloyd Strickland. Bloomsbury Academic, 2006.
[W] Leibniz: Selections. Edited by Philip P. Wiener. New York: Charles Scribner’s Sons, 1951.
[WF] Leibniz’s ‘New System’ and Associated Contemporary Texts. Edited and translated by Roger Woolhouse and Richard Francks. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1997.

Secondary Literature

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  • Wilson, M., 1976. “Leibniz’s Dynamics and Contingency in Nature” in Machamer and Turnbull (eds.), Motion and Time, Space and Matter, Columbus: Ohio State University Press, 264–289.
  • Whipple, J., 2010. “The Structure of Leibnizian Simple Substances,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 18: 379–410.
  • –––, 2015, “Leibniz on Substance and Causation,” in P. Lodge and T. Stoneham (eds.), Leibniz and Locke on Substance and Identity, New York: Routledge, 203–230.
  • Winkler, Kenneth, 2011. “Continuous Creation,” Midwest Studies in Philosophy, 35: 287–309.
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  • –––, 1985. “Pre-established harmony returned: Ishiguro versus the tradition,” Studia Leibnitiana, 17: 204–19.

Other Internet Resources

  • Leibnitiana, maintained by Gregory Brown (University of Houston)
  • Leibniz, maintained by Jan Cover (Purdue University)
  • Leibniz Translations, maintained by Lloyd Strickland (Lancaster University, England)

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