First published Tue Mar 26, 2013; substantive revision Fri Sep 8, 2017

Markets are institutions in which individuals or collective agents exchange goods and services. They usually use money as a medium of exchange, which leads to the formation of prices. Markets can be distinguished according to the goods or services traded in them (e.g., financial markets, housing markets, labor markets), according to their scope (e.g., regional, national, international markets), or according to their structure (e.g., competitive markets, oligopolistic markets, monopolistic markets). From a normative perspective, markets are of interest for a number of reasons: various arguments for and against markets relate to central questions of social and political philosophy. In addition, markets depend on, and in turn influence, many other institutions and aspects of social life. They thus co-determine the ways in which values such as liberty, justice or solidarity can be realized. Questions as to which markets, for what goods, can be defended by normative arguments, and how they relate to other institutions, are therefore at the core of thinking about a just society.

Markets are analyzed in a variety of disciplines, including sociology, history, and, most notably, economics. In philosophy, the interest in questions relating to markets has seen ebbs and flows. Starting roughly in the 18th century, one finds debates about a society in which markets are a social sphere of their own, and have an impact on the society as a whole. This article presents the most important strands of the philosophical debate about markets. It offers some distinctions between the concept of markets and related concepts, as well as a brief outline of historical positions vis-à-vis markets. The main focus is on presenting the most common arguments for and against markets, and on analyzing the ways in which markets are related to other social institutions. In the concluding section questions about markets are connected to two related themes, methodological questions in economics and the topics of business ethics and corporate social responsibility.

1. Conceptual delineations

The term “market” with its cognates in other European languages (marché, Markt, mercado, etc.) stems from the Latin root “merx”. It means “wares” or “merchandise”. To understand better what markets are, it is important to distinguish the concept of markets from other, related concepts.

The concept of “exchange” is at the core of the concept of markets. In markets, exchanges of goods and services take place for reasons of self-interest, in contrast to, for example, the exchange of gifts with the aim of building relationships (on gift exchange see e.g., Maus 1923–24). Most markets use money as a medium of exchange. Often, individuals act as “price takers”, i.e. they take prices as given and choose how much to buy or sell. But there are also markets where exchanges take place in the form of barter or in different forms of auctions. The concept of “markets”, however, is wider than the concept of exchange because it includes the structural macro-effects that result from a large number of exchanges, for example changes in the overall price level.

“Competition” is a feature of markets, but is also used in different senses, e.g., with regard to institutional competition or evolutionary competition. In markets, competition results from the fact that agents seek to find the best deal, thus creating competition among the participants on the other side of the market, supply or demand respectively. Markets are called “competitive” when they have certain structural features that include a large number of buyers and sellers, comparable goods, and the absence of informational asymmetries. In what follows, the focus is on competitive markets, leaving aside the specific problems (in particular unequal market power) of non-competitive markets such as monopolies or cartels. It should be noted, however, that even in seemingly competitive markets there are often “pockets” of unequal market power, e.g., when a company is the only employer in a certain region or when a bank possesses more information than its customers. To the degree to which such deviations from the model of a competitive market are unavoidable - for example because network effects in the digital realm lead to highly concentrated markets – they need to be taken into account in normative evaluations of markets.

The term “economy” describes the productive and distributive activities of a region or country, which includes markets, but also the legal framework within which they take place, as well as the organizations within markets, such as households and corporations (on the latter see recently Ciepley 2013 and Anderson 2017). The latter’s internal structure is hierarchical and bureaucratic and thus quite different from the structure of markets. In many countries, the “economy” also includes a state sector as well as mixed forms, such as private-public partnerships. It can also include other forms of redistribution such as charities or “black markets”. Polanyi has provided a classic categorization of allocation mechanisms: he distinguishes between reciprocity (based on symmetrical relations), redistribution (based on centricity: a central authority collects the goods and hands them out to individuals), autarky (production for one’s own use) and markets (1944, ch. 4). This shows that markets are only one form in which goods and services can be allocated in a society. Insofar as other structures – e.g., hierarchical structures within corporations – continue to play a role in economic systems, it is misleading to conceptualize them as pure “market economies.”

The concept of “capitalism” includes a reference to markets, but as a socio-economic system, it is broader; its defining feature is the private ownership of capital (see e.g., Scott 2011). This typically leads to pressures to find profitable investment opportunities and to asymmetries between owners and non-owners of capital. Markets are a core element of capitalism, but in principle they can also exist in societies in which the ownership of capital is organized differently (see e.g., Carens 1981 for a proposal that builds on “moral incentives”; for the debate about “market socialism” in general see e.g., Bardhan/Roemer 1993). Many proposals for reforming current forms of capitalism, for example the Rawlsian idea of a “property owning democracy” (see e.g., O’Neill/Williamson 2012), do not reject markets, but rather argue for a more equal distribution of productive assets.

A vague, but nonetheless helpful distinction is drawn by Polanyi between “market economies” and “market societies”. The latter are societies where “instead of the economy being embedded in social relations, social relations are embedded in the economy” (Polanyi 1944, 57, see also Cunningham 2005). Many arguments about the value of markets have to do with their impact on the character of a society as a whole and with the questions of where, when and how one should limit the influence of markets. In Polanyi’s terms, this is the question of whether a “market economy” can and should remain a “market economy”, or whether it does or should lead to a “market society”.

2. Three lines of tradition: friends, foes, and critical friends

In Western thought systematic inquiry into the character and the value of markets starts in the early modern era. Earlier analyses were typically restricted to questions about the economic relations of the household, the “oikos” (which is the root of the term “economics”). Important exceptions are Aristotle’s discussion of the character of money (Politics I, 8–10) and the discussions in which this topic was taken up. They raise fundamental questions about legitimate and illegitimate forms of exchange. From at least the 18th century onwards, one finds an intense debate about the nature of markets and their value for individuals and societies (on the history of economic thought see for example the classic, but somewhat outdated, Schumpeter (1954) or for a more technical account Blaug (1996)).

The line of thinkers who by and large endorse markets reaches from Mandeville’s Fable of the Bees (1924 [1714/1721]) to the Scottish Enlightenment, with Adam Smith’s 1776 Inquiry into the Nature and Causes of the Wealth of Nations often seen as the birth certificate of economics as a separate science. In the 19th century, insights from Smith and other earlier thinkers were taken up by “classic” economists such as Thomas Malthus [1798] or David Ricardo [1817]. In the 20th century the pro-market tradition includes the “Austrian” school with thinkers such as Ludwig von Mises (e.g., 1949), Joseph Schumpeter (e.g., 1942), and F.A. von Hayek (e.g., 1944; 1973–9); James Buchanan and the “Virginia School” with its focus on public choice theory (e.g., Buchanan 1975), and the (largely libertarian) “Chicago School” with Milton Friedman as its most prominent representative (e.g., 1962; on the Chicago School as a whole see e.g., Emmett (2010); for a critical delineation of libertarian from liberal thought see Freeman 2001). The arguments by friends of markets have changed over time, but there are some threads that unite this tradition: the emphasis on individualism and on markets as helping to emancipate individuals from traditional ties, a “negative” understanding of freedom, a focus on the innovating and modernizing effects of markets, and on their positive impact on the welfare of society.

There is also a long tradition of thinkers critical of markets. This was, in a sense, the “default” position in the Christian culture of the European middle ages, where trade and markets were seen as driven by, and favorable to, the sins of gluttony and greed, and as inimical to the established order.[1] In the last three centuries, the most notable critics of markets include Jean-Jacques Rousseau (notably in the Second Discourse on the Origins of Inequality [1764] (1997)), and Karl Marx and Friedrich Engels (e.g., Communist Manifesto, Capital) and the Marxist tradition, which has unfolded into a wide spectrum of positions, from left-wing social democrats to radical communists (see Kołakowski 1978). Common themes in this tradition are the inegalitarian, disruptive results of unregulated markets, their instability, their alienating effects (e.g., separating individuals from the fruits of their labor, see also section 3.2 below), and their degrading effects on the poor. What also unites these thinkers is the hope that there are alternatives to markets for organizing the economic life of large-scale societies. In the 19th century and the first three quarters of the 20th century what was standardly quoted as an alternative to a market economy was a centrally planned economy. After the fall of communism in Eastern Europe and Russia other, usually more modest, models have been discussed and sometimes experimented with (for examples see e.g., Wright 2011, ch. 7). Much of the force of criticisms of markets depends on the availability of alternative models that score better on a number of normative dimensions. Research on and experiments with alternative models are therefore of great interest for philosophers who wish to evaluate markets from a normative perspective.

There is a third line of thinkers who stand between the friends and the foes of markets and argue for a qualified endorsement: they see advantages in markets, but also problems. Therefore, they either argue that the overall balance is positive, or that the problems can be mitigated by other institutions. Often, this position is motivated by the argument that we do not know of a better way of organizing the economic life of large societies, and that it is therefore better, overall, to “tame” markets than to abolish them. This position has been held by thinkers as diverse as G.W.F. Hegel (1942 [1821]), J.S. Mill (1848), J.M. Keynes (1936) or John Rawls (1971) and by many social-democratic parties in Europe (see Berman 2006). What unites them is a belief in the “primacy of politics.” Markets are welcomed as an instrument for achieving certain aims within the framework of the state, but their purpose and their limits should be determined by politics. Whether and how this primacy of politics is possible is another important question in the philosophical debate about markets (cf. also 4.3 below).

Today, remnants of these historical traditions can be found in the ways in which different academic disciplines look at markets. Although there are exceptions, economists typically see markets in a positive light. They standardly analyze them using abstract methods that model individuals as sovereign, rational choosers. This approach, which leaves a number of problems of real-life markets unexplained, has also been used for incentive-based analyses of other social spheres (see notably Gary Becker, e.g., 1976). These have raised questions about the possibilities and limits of the rational choice approach, especially since behavioral economists have started to explore how real human behavior departs from the behavior assumed in the models (see e.g., Kahneman/Tversky 1979; Laibson 1997; Fehr/Schmidt 1999; for an overview of behavioral economics see e.g., Camerer/Loewenstein/Rabin 2003; for a critique of rational choice theory from a philosophical perspective see e.g., Sen 1977). Sociologists, anthropologists and historians use different, usually less abstract methods for exploring different markets. Their emphasis has often been on the relation of markets to other spheres of life, because they see individuals as socially embedded, and their decisions as shaped by their social environment. Many researchers from these disciplines are rather critical of capitalist markets. Their methods allow them to see problems that economists may be blind to. But economists might reply that the methods used by historians, sociologists and anthropologists are in turn less suitable for grasping the positive indirect effects of markets, for example the benefits for customers when a company is restructured. Although they can sometimes be intertwined, it is therefore important to distinguish between disciplinary approaches, research methods, and substantive arguments about the value of markets.

3. Arguments about markets

Judgments about markets are often “all things considered”-judgments in which both defenders and critics can concede certain points to one another, but hold that other arguments outweigh them. For the sake of clarity, the most common arguments about markets are here presented along the lines of justifications and criticisms. Some of these arguments apply to markets in general, some apply to market societies, and others apply to specific markets (cf. also 3.3 below). Many arguments, however, can be used on several of these levels, and it depends on an author’s goals how he or she uses them (for a book-length account of arguments for and against markets see also Buchanan 1985).

3.1 Justifications of markets

Sen (1985) distinguishes two basic strategies for justifying markets: from antecedent rights or liberties on the one hand, or from consequences on the other hand. Arguments about antecedent rights and liberties often go hand in hand, as the rights in question are said to protect the liberties in question. In its paradigmatic form, this argument is based on a right to private property. It gives individuals the right to do whatever they like with their property. This includes the right to enter into exchange relationships with others. Prohibiting such exchanges, or interfering with them in any other way, infringes on these rights and thus, it is said, on a basic form of freedom. The attractiveness of such justifications of markets lies in their a priori character and their intuitive plausibility. But they only work if one can defend the a priori rights or liberties on which they are based. Arguments of this kind are therefore often joined with arguments about the naturalness of property rights as existing prior to the state. It is more plausible to hold that property rights must not be compromised if one holds that they are a priori, than when they are understood as dependent on consent by and enforcement through the state. The naturalness of property rights has often been defended by connecting them to self-ownership and by basing them on the mixing of one’s labor with material things and thereby appropriating them, along Lockean lines (Locke 1960 [1689]; see also Nozick 1974; for the left-libertarian defense of private property (which combines it with very different positions with regard to equality and the role of the state) see e.g., Vallentyne/Steiner 2000). But this view of property rights has been disputed. Many thinkers point out the crucial role of the state in providing and protecting property rights and the right to free contract (see e.g., Murphy/Nagel 2002). Also, many historians of ideas have pointed out that the idea that liberty consists in the unhindered use of one’s property (what MacGilvray (2011) calls “market freedom”) is not the only way in which freedom can be understood, and has historically been understood (see for example Pettit 2006 for a discussion of markets from the perspective of freedom as non-domination, for a more emphatic endorsement of markets from a neo-republican perspective see Taylor 2013). In fact, the strength of such a priori defenses of markets crucially depends on what “counts” as infringement of freedom: does one only “count” coercive rules by the state, or does one also count the obstacles to pursuing one’s interests that one experiences in a market society, which are often the result of numerous decisions by anonymous individuals (cf. e.g., Cohen 1979; Olsaretti 2004, ch. 4–6; MacGilvray 2011, ch. 5). A strict system of private property rights can lead to situations of extreme inequality in which some members of a society are left to starve, so that it becomes questionable in what sense they can be called free. This presents defenders of markets on a priori grounds with a choice: they either have to bite this bullet and accept extreme inequality and poverty as justified. Or they have to step back from their pure a priori position and admit that consequences can play a role in the consideration of markets. Then, one can admit that markets may have to be supplemented by other institutions, and their justification cannot be unconditional any more (Sen 1985). Nevertheless, rights and liberties can continue to play an important role in pro-market arguments, even while being embedded in a wider framework in which, for example, a certain amount of taxation is also defended (for a recent account, called “free market fairness”, that emphasizes the importance of economic liberties as basic rights, but also allows for some restriction for the sake of social justice, see Tomasi 2012).

Many justifications of markets, however, are based not on a priori rights or liberties, but rather on the consequences of markets. Several dimensions of these consequences can be distinguished. A first, historically important, argument holds that markets make individuals more virtuous and sociable: they build on calm, rational interests rather than violent passions. Markets therefore make manners more peaceful and civilized (see Hirschman 1977, who refers to Montesquieu and other 18th century thinkers).[2] Arguments about the character-building effect of markets are sometimes also raised today (cf. e.g., McCloskey 2006). Hirschman has conjectured that the civilizing and moralizing forces of markets might just be sufficient to outbalance their self-undermining forces (1982); Bowles, in contrast, has suggested that non-market elements of liberal societies might counteract potentially dangerous effects of markets.

A second argument concerns the consequences of markets in the sense of the distribution they bring about. It is sometimes held that markets, or more specifically labor markets, give people what they deserve because they reward individuals’ contributions to the social whole. This makes desert rather than traditional hierarchies the determinant of social positions (e.g., Miller 2001, ch. VIII-IX; Honneth in Fraser/Honneth 2003, 137ff., Mankiw 2010; for justifications of profits along similar lines see e.g., Arnold 1987; Narveson 1995). Such arguments draw on the (luck egalitarian) intuition that differences in individuals’ incomes are justified as long as they are not undeserved, but reflect free choices (see e.g., Arneson 2008), for example the decision to work 50 rather than 40 hours per week, or to take on a less pleasant job, which gives one a ‘premium for being a steeplejack or an embalmer or working on the night shift’ (Okun 1975, 72). It has been a matter of debate, however, whether markets in fact reward choices in this way, or whether one’s socio-economic background, one’s participation in teams of workers (where individual contributions may be impossible to separate), or simply luck play too great a role in determining one’s income. If so, then the “cult of personal responsibility” would be misguided (Barry 2005, part IV; cf. also Olsaretti 2004, ch.1–3 for a discussion of the arguments for markets from desert, which she ultimately rejects). Interestingly, even some defenders of free markets, such as von Hayek and Knight, have argued that the sense in which they can be called just only concerns the framework of rules within which they take place, not the resulting distributing of income. They argue that what markets reward, namely the satisfaction of wants, has nothing to do with moral values (1978, ch. IX; cf. also Knight 1923). One might argue that these rules can be more or less conducive to justice in the sense of desert, and that, ceteris paribus, they should be made more conducive to it rather than less (e.g., Lamont 1997; Herzog 2013, ch. V; see also Herzog 2017, chap. V). In that form, however, the argument concerns not the justification of markets, but rather the question of how their framework should be designed, such that they bring about results that reward desert.

The most important argument for markets that builds on consequences, however, concerns their ability to deliver efficient outcomes and hence to create high levels of welfare. They spur economic growth, while not relying on a central planning mechanism, but on the self-interest of individuals. This is what the famous Smithian metaphor of the “invisible hand” (WN IV.II.9) is usually taken to stand for. Under certain assumptions, such as stable preferences, the absence of external effects on third parties, equal and open access to information, and the absence of one-sided bargaining power, market outcomes are Pareto efficient. This has been shown in the first theorem of welfare economics (for the formal proof see e.g., Mas-Colell/Whinston/Green 1995, ch. 16). Pareto efficiency means that no individual’s position in terms of satisfaction of her preferences can be improved without reducing another individual’s position, i.e. there is no waste caused by unused possibilities of bargaining. The strict mathematical conditions of the first theorem of welfare economics never hold in practice. But the general equilibrium model embodies two arguments about markets that explain why they can spur economic growth, and these can also be applied to real markets. The first can be called the “coordination argument” (cf. Roemer 2012): the price system can transmit complex information about people’s preferences in decentralized ways, which allows for the allocation of goods and services to where they are most wanted. The emerging spontaneous order satisfies social needs in better ways than could be achieved by central planning (see notably von Hayek 1945). Market prices serve as an instrument for determining the opportunity costs of certain uses of resources, which also allows for comparisons of the different sets of resources individuals hold (see Dworkin 2000, ch. 1 and 2). The second argument is that markets fuel individuals’ energies because they give them incentives to find socially useful ways in which to use their talents. As Adam Smith’s famous (if often abused) quote goes: “It is not from the benevolence of the butcher, the brewer, or the baker, that we expect our dinner, but from their regard to their own interest” (WN I.II.2). Smith’s aim is not to give an account of human nature as fundamentally egoistic. Rather, he points out that markets tap a source of motivation that goes beyond the benevolence that people show within a small circle of family members and friends. Their self-interest connects individuals to a much wider range of exchange partners, which allows for a greater division of labor and hence more efficient production. Defenders of markets also hold that they support innovation because they give individuals the possibility of using new techniques and new combinations of factors of production, and they provide capital for entrepreneurs and inventors. This leads to a dynamic process of “creative destruction” that helps to satisfy individuals’ preferences in better ways (Schumpeter 1942, who popularized this Marxist term).

The arguments from efficiency and growth do not, as such, say anything about the distribution of income and wealth that is achieved in a market economy. A situation can be Pareto-efficient while at the same time being extremely unequal (cf. e.g., Sen 1973). Sometimes one finds additional pro-market arguments to the effect that the wealth created by markets automatically “trickles down” to the poorer layers of society. This can happen, for example, when the rich buy goods or services the production of which creates employment for the poor (as argued by Smith in 1976b [1759] IV.I.10], or when innovations first made for luxury goods are later adopted in the mass market. It is not clear, however, under what conditions this happens. As a matter of fact, market economies exist in egalitarian and less egalitarian societies. Surrounding institutions play a major role in determining the degree of inequality that results from them. One can argue, however, that markets can make the pie of a national economy larger than it would otherwise be, and that the additional wealth can be redistributed through taxation or other measures. Then markets-plus-redistribution can be justified vis-à-vis non-market-institutions by their distributive effects, for example along the lines of Rawls’ “difference principle”. According to this principle inequalities can be justified if they are “to the greatest benefit of the least advantaged members of society” (1999, 5–6). If one chooses this justification for markets, the degree to which they should be left free and the degree to which income and wealth should be redistributed depend not only on one’s normative position, but also on one one’s assumption about which regime in fact makes the poorest members of society best-off. Such an instrumental defense of free markets can be found in many theories of what Freeman (e.g., 2011) calls the “high liberal” (in contrast to the “classical liberal”) tradition.

3.2 Criticisms of markets

Numerous arguments have been brought forward against markets, either in order to reject them altogether or in order call for their limitation. One of the main criticisms of relying on markets to organize economic life points to their unequal outcomes, and the poverty – understood in absolute or relative terms – they can create. In the 19th century, this concerned in particular those members of society who did not own the means of production and therefore had to sell their labor to earn an income. During the industrial revolution a large percentage of the laboring classes turned into a proletariat that, in Marx’ and Engels’ famous words, had “nothing to lose but its chains” [Communist Manifesto, 1848]. The ability of markets to be a “tide that lifts all boats” (a phrase attributed to J.F. Kennedy) has thus been questioned at least since the 19th century. Critics have called for a more equal distribution of resources in society. Often, this criticism was combined with the call for a complete overthrow of the capitalist system, which was seen as self-undermining because of the ever-greater divisions it created; this debate has been revived by the publication of Piketty (2014) and the ensuing controversies about diverging tendencies in capitalist societies.

To this criticism defenders of markets can reply by questioning the value of equality of outcomes. What is more difficult for them to reject – because their own arguments often emphasize rights and liberties – is the charge that the inequalities created by unregulated markets can go so far as to seriously limit the possibility of making use of one’s rights and liberties (see also Rawls 1971, sect. 32). In a society in which most goods and services are distributed through markets, those who do not have the means for purchasing them can be said to be free only in a very restricted sense. Even relative (in contrast to absolute) poverty can then imply various forms of social exclusion. A lot here depends on how one understands the notions of freedom and coercion, but in some situations it is plausible that a lack of resources helps to subject individuals to coercion, not least because it is the enforcement of other persons’ property rights that hinders their access to resources (Cohen 1995, Otsuka 2003, Waldron 1993, Widerquist 2013). As Satz (2010, esp. ch. 4) argues, the vulnerability of agents whose choice is limited by their dire situation, as well as the “weak agency” of individuals who are poorly informed and depend on other people’s decision, can therefore be reasons for limiting free markets. In the 19th century, the asymmetry in bargaining power between workers and capitalist was at the heart of the debate, and it still plays an important role in many countries. In addition, individuals with low human capital, with psychological afflictions, or with a problematic legal status (e.g., illegal migrants) are especially vulnerable in markets. The idea of markets as mechanisms of social coordination is based on a picture of all individuals as sovereign, fully informed, and fully rational choosers. Wherever this is not the case, markets can lead to the exploitation of vulnerable individuals by others. These arguments do not necessarily imply a complete rejection of markets, but they raise questions about the wider institutional framework in which they are embedded. Possible remedies to these problems can either aim at regulating markets or at complementing them by institutions that put individuals on a more equal footing when they enter into exchange relationships (cf. 4.2 below).[3]

The idea that markets have anything to do with “desert” has also been criticized, especially from the perspective of Marxian theories of exploitation. They hold that, to the contract, laborers are systematically deprived of their rightful contribution, as their wages are lower than the value they create through their labour (e.g., Marx, Kapital, vol. I, ch. 7–8; for a discussion see e.g., Buchanan 1985, 87–95). As has also been pointed out, the idea of desert can easily serve as an ideological smokescreen for those who are successful in markets (cf. e.g., Hayek 1978, 74f.). Markets have been criticized for cementing inequality and social division, thus undermining equality of opportunity (cf., e.g., Barry 2005, parts II-IV). This leads to the question whether other institutions, for example a system of public education, can help to mitigate these problems, so that a combined system could be justified.

The ability of markets to deliver efficient outcomes when the goods in question are private goods has seldom been questioned by their critics. But even friends of markets admit that they do not lead to efficient outcomes in two cases, namely when there are external effects or public goods. External effects are effects on third parties that are not captured in property rights, for example air pollution. Public goods are goods that are non-excludable (it is not possible to effectively exclude individuals from their use) and non-rivalrous (the possibility of use by one individual does not reduce the possibility of others using it) (see Mas-Colell/Whinston/Green 1995, ch. 11). An example for a public good is public security: if it is provided, individuals cannot be excluded from it, and the fact that more individuals enjoy it does not reduce its value for others. Therefore, no individual has sufficient economic incentives to provide it; it has to be provided by the state. Critics of markets often hold that situations that include external effects or public goods are much more widespread than defenders of markets admit, for example with regard to environmental problems. With regard to externalities, economists often point to Coase’s famous theorem that holds that when there are no transaction costs, problems of externalities can be overcome through bargaining, independent of the initial distribution of property rights (1960). In reality, however, transactions are often extremely difficult and costly, especially when multiple agents with differing interests are involved. This makes the applicability of this theorem – and hence the defense of market solutions in such cases – problematic. Another problematic case is that of “positional goods” (Hirsch 1976), i.e. goods the value of which depends on their relative position in comparison to what other have. A case in point are expensive houses that people desire for the sake of their status rather than their intrinsic qualities: they want to have a house that has a certain size relative to the houses of others. Positional goods are scarce by definition – only 10% of houses can be in the top 10% of the market; only 10% of students can be the best-educated 10%. Competition for them is thus a zero-sum game: it is a “rat race” in which everyone keeps the same relative position if everyone moves up by the same amount. This is why some theorists argue that the externalities caused by this kind of competition justifies regulatory measures (see e.g., Frank 2005; for a discussion of positional goods from an egalitarian perspective see also Brighhouse & Swift 2006, for an account in terms of recognition theory see Claassen 2008).

A broader question that can be raised in this context is the question of “efficiency of what?” (cf. also Satz 2010, 33f.). As critics of markets point out, markets may be efficient in satisfying people’s wants, but sometimes this may happen because they actually shift people’s preferences towards things that can easily (which often means: profitably) be provided in markets. These are not necessarily the preferences people would choose it they reflected about which preferences they would like to have (cf. e.g., George 2001, who uses the metaphor of “preference pollution”). Economic models of markets usually take individuals’ preferences as given, which makes them colorblind, as it were, to a whole range of questions that have been raised about markets in this respect: how do markets change individuals, their relation to one another, and their relation to certain goods and values? Among Marxist theorists, the term “alienation” is used to describe the phenomenon of individuals being, or feeling, separated from things that should belong together. For example, if workers have to sell their labor to the owners of the means of production, they are said to be alienated from their work and its products, as well as from other human beings and the being of the human species, (Marx [1844], I; for a recent account of the notion of alienation see Jaeggi 2014).

With regard to human relations, market societies have been accused of undermining community and solidarity, as markets are based on purely instrumental, fast-changing relations, so that “all that is solid melts into air” (Marx/Engels, Communist Manifesto; for a contemporary account see e.g., Lane 1991).[4] The “creative destruction” that takes place in markets may spur innovation, as their defenders hold, but it also destroys established social ties and traditions (cf. Polanyi 1944). This thought seems to play a role in the communitarian critique of the liberal view of human nature (e.g., MacIntyre 1984, cf. Bell 2012 for an overview). In addition, the fact that markets build on self-interest has been said to make individuals more egoistic and materialistic. Such arguments are the counterpart to the claim that markets make individuals more social and moral, as held by their defenders. An important aspect of this debate, which has also been explored empirically, is the tendency of monetary incentives to “crowd out” the intrinsic motivation to act out of altruism or for the sake of the public good (cf. e.g., Titmus’ famous study on paid and unpaid blood donations (1971); Frey (e.g., 2007); see also Gneezy/Rustichini’s study on how a fine for late-coming parents at a day-care center increased their numbers because it was seen as a price (2000)).

The strength of such arguments depends on whether individuals can and do restrict their “market attitude” to the economic sphere, or whether it comes to dominate society as a whole. For example, can it be kept at a distance from private relationships, or do individuals develop a market attitude with regard to intimate relationships as well, as sociologist Eva Illouz argues (e.g., 2012)? Pressure on the private sphere not only comes from people’s conscious or unconscious transmission of certain ways of thinking into it, but also from the increasing number (or at least the perceived increase) of monetary transactions that concern this sphere, for example in the form of paid child care or surrogate motherhood. This has led critics of markets to call for limitations of their sphere of influence in order not to “commodify” goods whose meaning is closely tied to values such as intimate relations, individual flourishing, or child-parent relationships (cf. e.g., Radin 1996; Anderson 1993; Sandel 2012; for a critical discussion see Satz 2010, 80ff.). As Anderson emphasizes, the larger question behind this issue is how a society can accommodate a plurality of goods that are valued in different ways (1993, esp. ch. 1 and 3). A similar strand of arguments concerns the question of whether markets push people towards the consumption of material rather than immaterial goods (see e.g., the popular account by Fromm 1976). If this is the case, they not only “pollute” their preferences, but also contribute to the overconsumption of natural resources and a variety of ecological problems (e.g., Wright 2011, 70; Hardin 1968).

Related arguments concern the question of whether citizens can stand in an equal respectful relationship to one another if certain goods, e.g., votes or body parts, are traded in markets (Sandel 2012, 10ff. cf. also Satz 2010, ch. 3; on the ethics of vote buying, see the relevant section of the entry on voting, on body parts see Phillips 2013). For example, it has been argued that some institutions, e.g., schools, are such that disagreements should be settled by “voice” rather than “exit” (in Hirschman’s 1970 distinction; for the example of schools see e.g., Anderson 1993, 162f.). Also, many political theorists argue that the political sphere of a democracy should be seen as different from markets in that what is at stake are not individual interests, but the public good (cf. e.g., Radin 1996, ch. 14, who draws on John Dewey’s understanding of democracy). What such theories have in common is that they see society as composed of different social spheres – and, as Walzer puts it, “[t]he morality of the bazaar belongs in the bazaar”, whereas exchanges in other social spheres should be blocked (1983, 109). In many such cases, a combination of arguments applies, concerning not only the character of goods, but also the vulnerability of some market participants; as Brennan and Jaworski (2015) have recently argued, arguments about commodification that are based exclusively on the symbolic dimension of trading certain goods are not convincing because these symbolic dimensions are culturally contingent. As Satz (2010, e.g., 9) reminds us, however, the best answer to problematic markets is not always to ban them. This might lead to black markets or other forms of evasions. The question of alternatives, e.g., regulated markets or markets complemented by other institutions, often depends on the institutional framework within which markets take places. This will be considered in section 4 below.

3.3 “The market” versus different markets

As will have become clear, some arguments for and against markets directly respond to one another, whereas others have to be weighed against one another without being directly compatible. Many thinkers acknowledge the force of at least some arguments from both sides. They take the line described in section 2 as “qualified endorsement” and argue for the market as one element within an institutional framework that can mitigate some of its more problematic effects. It should be kept in mind, however, that different markets can look very different with regard to the arguments listed above. This raises the question of whether it is possible at all to say something general about the value of “markets”, rather than about specific markets in specific situations. A common problem in the discussion about markets is the level of abstraction, as many abstract models make idealizing assumptions that do not hold in real life (see also Phillips 2008).[5] While there is nothing wrong as such with using abstract models, it is important to consider their limited validity in real life instantiations. When comparing markets to other institutional solutions, the comparison has to take place at the same level of abstraction. Otherwise one compares apples to oranges, e.g., when a very imperfect market with great asymmetries of power is contrasted with an idealized public bureaucracy, or when a market in which all individuals are fully rational is contrasted with corrupt public institutions. It makes more sense to compare a reasonably well-functioning market with a reasonably well-functioning bureaucracy.

Another problem in debates about markets is the following: If critical arguments against markets are raised, defenders of markets sometimes hold that the ills should not be blamed on markets, but rather on the surrounding institutions, because the conditions that would need to hold for markets to do their beneficial work are not fulfilled. For example, when markets are criticized for leading to an overconsumption of natural resources, defenders of markets often point out that there are no full property rights for many environmental goods. If environmental goods had a price, it would be expensive to use them, and their owners would have incentives to treat them in responsible ways (see e.g., Tomasi’s reply to the “tragedy of the commons” (2012, 259ff.)). One might retort, however, that in many cases having such property rights would not solve the problem, because the transaction costs of finding bargaining solutions would be too high. Such examples show that the value of concrete markets can often not be discussed in purely abstract terms – what they are and what effects they have crucially depends on the institutions that surround them. These will be discussed next.

4. Relations between markets and other institutions

4.1 Preconditions for markets

Most theorists agree that for markets to come into existence, certain institutions need to be in place. Central among these are property rights and the legal institutions needed for enforcing contracts.[6] The question of enforceable property rights plays as an important role for evaluating markets in countries with weak governance structures. There, the ability to enforce one’s rights can be distributed very unequally, so that free markets can exacerbate these previous injustices. The question of which property rights can be enforced is one of the main determinants (apart from outright bans) of which markets can exist in a society. For example, in most countries one cannot sell oneself into slavery, as courts of law would not enforce such a contract. An area where this question about property rights and hence marketability is fiercely contested are intellectual property rights, where some people argue that our traditional notions of property rights are not suitable for goods that can be reproduced at extremely low costs, such as digital contents (e.g., Shiffrin 2007; Boutang 2011, ch. 4).

While the existence of property rights – and hence of a minimal state that enforces them – has been recognized as a precondition for markets even by most libertarian thinkers, other preconditions are often not made explicit in economic approaches to markets, and are more controversial. As has been emphasized in particular by the members of the German “Freiburg School” of “ordoliberalism”, for markets to remain competitive there need to be anti-trust laws that prevent cartels and monopolies (see e.g., Eucken 1939; on how this view was replaced by more thorough-going laissez-faire views in the US see Crouch 2011, ch. 3). Sociologists have long pointed out the crucial importance of trust for the existence of market exchanges, as contracts in markets often include implicit elements that cannot be spelled out in terms of property rights and hence not be legally enforced (see e.g., the classic account by Durkheim 1997 [1893] or more recently Beckert 2002). Certain forms of social ethos, e.g., a commitment to keep promises, can facilitate market transactions (Rose 2011). Research in economic sociology also puts emphasis on the dependence of markets on other social relations. For example, Granovetter shows how market relations are often embedded in personal relationships, such as the relationships between the experts for certain technologies in different companies (1985). Fligstein emphasizes how the rules set by states, including, for example, rules about governance structures and other regulatory institutions, influence the behavior of companies in markets and make markets “a social construction that reflect the unique political-cultural construction of their firms and nations” (1996, 670; on the “legal construction” of financial markets see Pistor 2013). Some sociologists, notably Callon, also argue that markets depend on the performative power of economic theories about what markets are: these help individuals to frame situations as market exchanges (e.g., 1998). For example, MacKenzie argues that market participants in certain financial markets use theoretical models to determine their own behavior (e.g., 2009). Such examples make particularly clear that the markets we know are not something independently “given”, but depend on existing norms and institutions in societies, and sometimes even on certain forms of information technology.

4.2 Institutions that supplement or correct market outcomes

Many political philosophers take (some of) the criticisms raised against markets (cf. 3.2 above) seriously. They therefore argue that markets can only be justified if they coexist with other institutions that supplement or correct their outcomes. These institutions can be subdivided into different categories. Economists typically use the concept of “market failure” to describe cases where one or more conditions for efficient market outcomes are not met, e.g., when there are externalities or public goods (see e.g., Bator 1958; Cowen 1988). To improve outcomes in such cases can require the regulation of markets (e.g., by prohibiting negative externalities such as the emission of harmful pollutants) or the provision of public goods by state institutions. Rules and regulations might also be needed – and can be justified from the point of view of Pareto efficiency – in cases of what Basu (2007) has called the “large number problem”: some form of behavior, although harmless in itself, may have a negative impact if committed by a large number of people. The same can be true when there is more than one equilibrium in a market and it is desirable to move to one of them rather than another, e.g., from an equilibrium with child labor to one without (Basu / Van 1998). One might also argue that the macro-economic stabilization of markets, for example through the central bank or through measures that raise demand in recessions (cf. Keynes 1936), belongs into the category of provision of public goods. The effectiveness of such measures, however, is deeply contested among economists.

A second broad category of institutions that supplement or correct market outcomes can be summarized under the term “welfare state”. It attempts to provide responses to criticisms of markets concerning poverty, unequal outcomes, and a lack of equality of opportunity. The most basic tasks of the welfare state are to secure the socioeconomic rights (cf. e.g., Marshall 1992) of citizens who cannot earn an income in the labor market, and to provide some degree of equality of opportunity. Many political philosophers have emphasized the importance of redistribution for these purposes (see also Fleurbaey 2012); the emphasis on redistribution has almost overshadowed questions about the direct distributive consequences of different markets and how these might be influenced by regulation (but see Dietsch 2010). Welfare state institutions can take on different forms, and can be organized in different ways, from a minimum of care for the destitute to a large array of social services, such as public education and a public health service. Recently, some thinkers have even argued for the introduction of an unconditional basic income for individuals, to make sure individuals are not at the mercy of those who control the access to resources (e.g., Van Parijs 1995, Widerquist 2013). Decisions about such institutions are often taken to be trade-offs between the efficiency of markets and the desideratum of some degree of equality of income and wealth. As Okun writes: “Any insistence on carving the pie into equal slices would shrink the size of the pie” (1975, 48). It is not clear, however, whether this picture adequately describes all parts of the economic reality. It is often based on the assumptions that higher taxes stifle people’s motivation to work hard. But whether this is true depends, among other things, on the question of whether individuals are mainly motivated by the desire to earn money or whether they might also have an intrinsic motivation to provide certain goods and services (cf. Roemer 2012). Some measures, such as a public education system that gives every child a chance to develop his or her talents, might lead simultaneously to more equality and to a larger economic pie, because the increase in human capital more than outbalances the losses in efficiency through the taxation that pays for the education system (cf. also Okun 1975, 81ff.; on the efficiency of various non-market institutions see also Heath 2006). As a matter of fact, in some countries such as the Scandinavian countries a strong welfare state coexists with a flourishing market economy, undermining claims of mutual incompatibility. In addition to its role in redistribution, the welfare state can also have a wider, cultural meaning: as Cunningham (2005) argues, it can help to overcome the fear created by the existential risks to which individuals are exposed in pure market societies, and which might be an important factor behind the allegedly more egoistic and more materialistic culture in such societies. For example, in a well-functioning welfare state individuals do not have to maximize their income for the sake of saving for periods of unemployment, but can participate in a social system that insures them against unemployment. A welfare state could also encourage risk-taking by lessening the costs of failure, which might spur innovation. [7]

4.3 Problems with the dichotomy of “the market” versus “the state”

The relationship between the market and the state has traditionally been understood as a three-layered scheme, roughly as outlined in sections 4.1 and 4.2: 1) the state secures property rights and other preconditions of markets; 2) markets take place within this framework and deliver efficient outcomes; 3) the state corrects market failures through complementary institutions such as the welfare state. This model is presupposed in many debates about markets. But there are reasons to think that it is insufficient, both descriptively and normatively, for capturing today’s realities.

There is, first of all, the problem of markets having become global, whereas the political framework is still largely based on nation states. This can lead to enforcement deficits, but also puts pressure on states to forego stricter regulations or higher taxation because capital, especially financial capital, will leave the country and escape to so-called “tax havens” (Dietsch 2015). In recent years, there has been increased interest in international markets: What distinguishes them from domestic markets; for example, do the immense inequalities of power and the different institutional frameworks in different countries mean that they need to be conceptualized differently? How could they be regulated and supplemented by other institutions in order to achieve more global justice? How could the community of states, or at least groups of states, cooperate to achieve this? These questions are embedded in the wider debate about global justice (cf. e.g., Pogge 2002; Caney 2005; Brock 2009, see also Blake 2008). This debate turns, for example, on institutions such as the World Trade Organization that could enforce certain standards on labor conditions (see. e.g., Barry/Reddy 2008), or on how the trade in natural resources could be embedded in institutions that prevent the “resource curse” that haunts countries with rich natural resources but weak governance structures (see e.g., Wenar 2015). Such proposals ask how the institutions that structure international markets could be changed in ways that make the gains from trade mutual and give everyone a fair share (see also James 2005; Risse 2007; Kurjanska/Risse 2008).

Secondly, problems of market failures and market instabilities seem to be much more pervasive than has often been assumed, especially in complex, interrelated markets such as financial markets (cf. e.g., Minsky 1986, esp. ch. 9; on financial markets in general see also Herzog 2017). This means that it is far more difficult for states to regulate them. It has to do with the role of psychological effects such as herding (cf. e.g., Akerlof and Shilling 2003) and maybe also with massive imbalances of power within such markets, which are often caused by asymmetries of information or barriers to market entry. The consequences of regulatory changes are hard to predict when there are nonlinear causal chains and the reaction of “the markets” is difficult to anticipate, so that it is unclear how to evaluate their impact on society. This raises the question of whether states have to use a more flexible approach to regulating markets, or whether there might be ways of reducing the fragility of the global economic system.

A third ground on which the dichotomy between “the market” and “the state” has been criticized is that it obfuscates the influence of powerful economic agents, e.g., large-scale corporations, on political decision-making. As some authors have argued, some capitalist countries, notably the United States, are coming close to a situation in which it is not the state that regulates markets. Rather powerful agents among both the corporate and the political elites set the rules of the game to their own advantage, at the costs of society at large (e.g., Crouch 2011).

All these points are of particular urgency because the problems of limited natural resources and climate change raise issues about the ability of the market-cum-political-framework as we know it to steer towards a more sustainable path. Because many of the activities that harm the natural environment take place as market activities, regulating them will often require a regulation of markets. Given how difficult it is to establish such a regulatory framework on a global scale, however, voluntary action by individual market participants also seems to be called for, e.g., by buying sustainably grown products and cars with a low carbon emission. Such voluntary actions should, ideally, create incentives for companies to find innovative solutions to reduce resource consumption and energy consumption (cf. also 5.2 below). Although they are certainly part of the problem, markets might then also be part of the solution to the challenges raised by poverty, resource depletion and climate change.

4.4 The interrelatedness of institutions

The interrelatedness of markets and other institutions is also confirmed by sociological research on the “varieties of capitalism” and similar approaches. They argue that rather than there being one “best” set of institutions, there are certain sets of institutions in the economic and the political realm that fit together better than others – they form “institutional complementarities”. As Hall and Soskice show, one can distinguish “liberal” from “coordinated” market economies in which mutually related mechanisms reign with regard to areas such as industrial relations between employers and employees (or unions), institutions for vocational training and education, corporate governance, or inter-firm relations. In liberal market economies, as they predominate in Anglo-Saxon countries, market mechanisms are much more pervasive; for example, employment contracts are typically shorter. In coordinated market economies, as one finds them for example in continental Europe, other forms of coordination, e.g., collective bargaining, play a greater role (Hall and Soskice 2001). Such interrelations, which can be neglected in highly abstract theorizing, should be taken into account when political philosophers address concrete questions about markets in “non-ideal” theory (as is done, for example, in Keat 2008). Philosophers have often focused on rules and regulations while taking individuals’ preferences as given, implicitly adopting an “economic” perspective on markets. But a “sociological” perspective, in which the generation of preferences and the wider social context are also taken into account, allows one to see other ways in which the outcomes of markets can be changed. Changes in different institutions, in individuals’ preferences, and in the “ethos” that rules in certain markets should, ideally, go hand in hand and be consistent with one another. It is unlikely that the current problems in which markets are involved, such as global justice and climate change, can be solved by relying only on one of these instruments. The desirability and feasibility of different market and non-market arrangements for addressing these issues, together with questions about the international dimension of markets and how they can be geared towards normative goals such as human flourishing and greater equality, are among the most important contemporary research areas about markets.

5. Related themes

When philosophers think about markets and their place and role in society, they need to be aware of the fact that theories about markets can sometimes carry their own implicit value judgments. This is why they need to be sensitive to methodological questions of the scientific discipline that focuses on markets, i.e. economics. When it comes to normative conclusions, political philosophers should also take into account the arguments brought forward by business ethicists, who discuss the moral duties of market participants. As Heath et al. (2010) have recently argued, debates in business ethics and in political philosophy would benefit from being more closely integrated, and this holds in particular for debates about markets. In this final section, these two related themes are briefly discussed.

5.1 Methodological questions in economics

It is important to distinguish methodological issues in economics (see Hausman 2008) from normative questions. However, they are often intertwined in intricate ways. One example concerns assumptions about human rationality: standard economic models assume perfect rationality, which excludes problems such as weakness of the will, so that normative criticisms of markets that build on the ability of more rational market participants to exploit the weaknesses of less rational market participants cannot be raised within this framework. More generally, plausible arguments challenge the possibility of value-free economic theorizing (see e.g., Mongin 2006). This means that philosophers who want to discuss normative issues about markets need to take care to make explicit the normative assumptions that might enter their view of these markets because they are built into the economists’ models. While the mainstream of economic theorizing in the last decades has used a rational choice methodology, new approaches, for example, behavioral economics or institutional economics, have worked with different assumptions, raising new methodological challenges. For example, explorations of the importance of norms of fairness in economic contexts (e.g., Kahneman/Knetsch/Thaler 1986; Fehr/Schmidt 1999) raise questions about the relation between the fairness norms favored by political philosophers and the norms observable in people’s behavior. Another interesting area are “nudges” that are supposed to lead people to more rational or more socially desirable behavior by changing institutional defaults (e.g., Thaler/Sunstein 2008), which leads to philosophical questions about paternalism.

5.2 Business ethics and Corporate Social Responsibility

Business ethics and discussions of corporate social responsibility are concerned with the behavior of individuals and especially corporations in markets (see Marcoux 2008). The scope of such approaches depends to some degree on the legal and cultural framework in which corporations operate. Arguably, the increased interest in these topics in the last decades also has to do with the unwillingness or inability of states to regulate the behavior of firms more strongly (cf. also Smucker 2006). One might therefore think that such measures are only insufficient solutions for problems that states fail to solve. As such, however, they play a particularly important role for international markets, because the regulatory problems at a global level are unlikely to be overcome soon. Initiatives such as the UN Global Compact aim at introducing basic moral standards into global markets.

It should be pointed out that conceptions of “doing business” have long been accompanied by ideas about certain moral norms, often captured in terms of the “honor” of the merchant (cf. e.g., Smith 1978 [1762/66], 538f.). Even Friedman, in his famous article in which he claims that “The Social Responsibility of Business is to Increase its Profits”, holds that business people should do this “while conforming to the basic rules of society, both those embodied in law and those embodied in ethical custom” (1970, emphasis added). As Heath argues, in pursuing profits firms have a responsibility not to exploit market failures such as information asymmetries, which serves both ethics and efficiency (2014). An important question that connects the topics of business ethics and corporate social responsibility to the normative evaluation of markets is whether markets reward or punish ethical behavior, i.e. whether business ethics is a cost or a strategic advantage for companies (cf. e.g., Porter/Kramer 2006 for how the latter might be achieved). This depends on their institutional embedding, but also on the consumers’ “ethics of consumption”, which is an important new field of research on markets (see e.g., Crocker/Linden 1998; Schwarz 2010). The basic idea is that if consumers express not only their self-interested, but also their moral choices in markets, markets can become instruments for making societies more just and economies more sustainable. In many societies, this is an ongoing process, and it remains to be seen how effective it can be in steering the global economy onto a more just and more sustainable path.


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Other Internet Resources


The author would like to thank Andrew Walton, Anca Gheaus, Simon Derpmann, Karl Widerquist and Rutger Claassen for valuable comments and suggestions, and Dan Hausman for a very helpful review.

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Lisa Herzog <>

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