First published Wed May 23, 2001; substantive revision Tue Jul 18, 2017

Panpsychism is the view that mentality is fundamental and ubiquitous in the natural world. The view has a long and venerable history in philosophical traditions of both East and West, and has recently enjoyed a revival in analytic philosophy. For its proponents panpsychism offers an attractive middle way between physicalism on the one hand and dualism on the other. The worry with dualism—the view that mind and matter are fundamentally different kinds of thing—is that it leaves us with a radically disunified picture of nature, and the deep difficulty of understanding how mind and brain interact. And whilst physicalism offers a simple and unified vision of the world, this is arguably at the cost of being unable to give a satisfactory account of the emergence of human and animal consciousness. Panpsychism, strange as it may sound on first hearing, promises a satisfying account of the human mind within a unified conception of nature.

1. Panpsychism in the History of Western Philosophy

Clear indications of panpsychist doctrines are evident in early Greek thought. One of the first Presocratic philosophers of ancient Greece, Thales (c. 624–545 BCE) deployed an analogical argument for the attribution of mind that tends towards panpsychism. The argument depends upon the idea that enminded beings are self-movers. Thales notes that magnets and, under certain circumstances, amber, can move themselves and concludes that they therefore possess minds. It is claimed that Thales went much beyond such particular attributions and endorsed a true panpsychism and pantheism. For example, as reported by Barnes (1982: 96–7), Diogenes claimed that Thales believed that “the universe is alive and full of spirits”, but this remark is derived from an earlier claim of Aristotle: “some say a soul is mingled in the whole universe—which is perhaps why Thales thought that everything is full of gods”. While Barnes disputes the pantheistic reading of Thales, he allows that Thales believed in the “ubiquity of animation”.[1]

The Presocratics were struck by a dilemma: either mind is an elemental feature of the world, or mind can somehow be reduced to more fundamental elements. If one opts for reductionism, it is incumbent upon one to explain how the reduction happens. On the other hand, if one opts for the panpsychist view that mind is an elemental feature of the world, then one must account for the apparent lack of mental features at the fundamental level. Anaxagoras (c. 500–425 BCE) flatly denied that novel elements can emerge from more basic features of reality and instead advanced the view that “everything is in everything” (there are interesting parallels between this and much more recent arguments for panpsychism by Thomas Nagel and Galen Strawson, discussed below). Anaxagoras explained the appearance to the contrary in terms of a “principle of dominance and latency” (see Mourelatos 1986), which asserted that some qualities were dominant in their contribution to the behavior and appearance of things. However, Anaxagoras’s views on mind are complex since he apparently regarded mind as uniquely not containing any measure of other things and thus not fully complying with his mixing principles. Perhaps this can be interpreted as the assertion that mind is ontologically fundamental in a special way; Anaxagoras did seem to believe that everything has some portion of mind in it while refraining from the assertion that everything has a mind (even this is controversial, see Barnes 1982: 405 ff.).

On the other hand, Empedocles, an almost exact contemporary of Anaxagoras, favored a reductionist account based upon the famous doctrine of the four elements: earth, air, fire and water. All qualities were to be explicated in terms of ratios of these elements. The overall distribution of the elements, which were themselves eternal and unchangeable, was controlled by “love and strife” in a grand cyclically dynamic universe.[2] The purest form of reductionism was propounded by the famed atomist Democritus (c. 460–370 BCE). His principle of emergence was based upon the possibility of multi-shaped atoms “interlocking” to form an infinity of more complex shapes. But Democritus had to admit that the qualities of experience could not be accounted for in this way, and thus chose to relegate them to non-existence: “by convention sweet and by convention bitter, by convention hot, by convention cold, by convention color; but in reality atoms and void” (Taylor 1999).

What is striking about these early attempts to formulate an integrated theory of reality is that the mind and particularly consciousness keep arising as special problems. It is sometimes said that the mind-body problem is not an ancient philosophical worry (see Matson 1966), but it does seem that the problem of consciousness was vexing philosophers 2500 years ago, and in a form redolent of contemporary worries.

We find these worries re-emerging at the start of the scientific revolution, as the mechanistic picture of the world inaugurated by Galileo, Descartes and Newton put the problem of the mind at center stage while paradoxically sweeping it under the rug. Galileo’s mathematisation of nature seemed to leave no space for the qualities we find in experience: the redness of the tomato, the spiciness of the paprika, the sweet smell of flowers. Galileo’s solution, in a move reminiscent of Democritus, was to strip matter of such sensory qualities. This led to the distinction between “primary qualities”—such as shape, size and motion—which were thought to really exist in matter, and “secondary qualities”—such as colours, odours and tastes—which were thought to exist only in the mind of the observer (or to exist as powers to cause ideas in the minds of observers).[3] Galileo and Descartes did not take the radical Democritian step of denying the existence of the secondary qualities; instead they placed them in the soul.[4] However, this of course led to a radical form of dualism, with a sharp metaphysical division between souls with their secondary qualities and bodies with their primary qualities.

In opposition to this dualism, the panpsychist views of Spinoza (1632–77) and Leibniz (1646–1716) can be seen as attempts to provide a more unified picture of nature. Spinoza regarded both mind and matter as simply aspects (or attributes) of the eternal, infinite and unique substance he identified with God Himself. In the illustrative scholium to proposition seven of book two of the Ethics ([1677] 1985) Spinoza writes:

a circle existing in nature and the idea of the existing circle, which is also in God, are one and the same thing … therefore, whether we conceive nature under the attribute of Extension, or under the attribute of Thought … we shall find one and the same order, or one and the same connection of causes….

We might say that, for Spinoza, physical science is a way of studying the psychology of God. There is nothing in nature that does not have a mental aspect—the proper appreciation of matter itself reveals it to be the other side of a mentalistic coin.

Leibniz’s view is sometimes caricatured as: Spinoza with infinitely many substances rather than just one. These substances Leibniz called monads (Leibniz [1714] 1989). Since they are true substances (able to exist independently of any other thing), and since they are absolutely simple, they cannot interact with each other in any way. Yet each monad carries within it complete information about the entire universe. Space, for Leibniz, was reducible to (non-spatial) similarity or correspondence relationships between the intrinsic natures of the monads.

Leibniz’s monads are fundamentally to be conceived mentalistically—they are in a way mentalistic automatons moving from one perceptual state (some conscious and some not) to another, all according to a God imposed pre-defined rule. It is highly significant for the development of contemporary forms of panpsychism that Leibniz could find no intrinsic nature for his basic elements other than a mentalistic nature—the only model he found adequate to describe his monads was one of perception and spontaneous activity. This view has been highly influential on the emergence in recent times of Russellian monism, discussed below.

The nineteenth century was the heyday of panpsychism. Even a partial list of panpsychists of that period reveals how many of the best minds of the time gravitated towards this doctrine. Prominent exponents of distinctive forms of panpsychism include Gustav Fechner (1801–1887), Wilhelm Wundt (1832–1920), Rudolf Hermann Lotze (1817–1881), William James (1842–1910), Josiah Royce (1855–1916) and William Clifford (1845–1879). Royce and Lotze represent what may be called “idealist panpsychism”. That is, the primary motivation for the ascription of mental attributes to matter is that matter is, in essence, a “form” of mind, and thus panpsychism is a kind of theorem that follows from this more fundamental philosophical view.

An important figure in the development of panpsychist thought is Arthur Schopenhauer (1788–1860). Schopenhauer was influenced by Kant’s view that we lack an understanding of reality as it is in and of itself, but he made a crucial exception for the immediate knowledge one has of oneself. Taking will to be the fundamental quality one is aware of in introspection, Schopenhauer thus theorised that will is the inner nature of all things. This line of reasoning bears a striking similarity to, and indeed is an important influence on, the contemporary Russellian monists, whom we will discuss below.

Other panpsychists of this time include Friedrich Paulsen (1846–1908), a student of Fechner’s who extended his teacher’s version of panpsychism, and Morton Prince (1854–1929), psychologist and physician who advocated a panpsychism that emphasized that it is matter that must be “psychologized” or imbued with mentalistic attributes (Prince regarded this as a form of materialism, and there are again affinities here with Russellian monism, discussed below). Also to be mentioned are Eduard von Hartmann (1842–1906) who extended his famous doctrine of the unconscious down to the level of atoms, Ferdinand C.S. Schiller (1864–1937) who provided a pragmatist defense of panpsychism as a doctrine which by various analogical arguments yields otherwise unattainable insights into nature, and Ernst Häckel (1834–1919), an early and avid proponent of Darwinism in Germany who interpreted our evolutionary connection with the rest of nature as evidence for panpsychism, and who was thus willing to ascribe mental properties to living cells.

Fechner and Royce developed panpsychist accounts of nature that did not attribute mental properties to the smallest bits of matter. This might seem to exclude their being correctly classed as “panpsychists”, as it is part of the definition of panpsychism that mentality is fundamental. Surely someone who believes that amoebas have experiences, but that the quarks and electrons that ultimately constitute amoebas do not, is no panpsychist. However, this simplifying view contains an implicit assumption about the nature of fundamental reality, namely that micro-level entities are its building blocks. Fechner and Royce did not accept this assumption, holding instead that the ontological foundation of reality is the “world-soul” or “world-mind” of which everything is a part (there are obvious echoes of Spinoza in such a view). This top-down view of the place of mind in the world does seem to be a legitimate sort of panpsychism, and it is one that does not require that everything in the world be itself enminded. Hartshorne (1950) labelled this kind of panpsychism “synecological”, in opposition to “atomistic” panpsychism. In contemporary philosophy, these views are known respectively as “(constitutive) cosmopsychism” and “(constitutive) micropsychism”, and both have their defenders as we shall see below.

William James’s panpsychism grew out of his “neutral monism”— the view that the fundamental nature of reality is neither mental nor physical, but of some third form that can be regarded as either mental or physical from different viewpoints. To the extent that a neutral monism can be regarded as a dual-aspect view (as in Spinoza’s philosophy), it might be regarded as a kind of panpsychism in its own right; but James’s view developed beyond this, to incorporate mind-like elements into the basic structure of reality. In a notebook of 1909 he wrote: “the constitution of reality which I am making for is of the psychic type” (see Cooper 1990). James’s commitment to panpsychism remains somewhat controversial, since he also advanced a cogent set of objections against a version of the view, which he labelled the “mind dust” theory, in chapter six of The Principles of Psychology ([1890] 1981). These objections are the inspiration for the so-called “combination problem”, around which much of the twenty first century literature on panpsychism focuses. But in the end James’s commitment is quite clear (see James 1909, 1911; Lamberth 1997; and for an excellent analysis of James’s views on mind see Cooper 1990 or chapters 2–4 of Cooper 2002).

The most significant development and defense of a panpsychist philosophy in the twentieth century was undoubtedly that of Alfred North Whitehead (1861–1947).[5] Exploration of the details of Whitehead’s philosophy would require an article of its own, and would be fraught with interpretive difficulties in any case since Whitehead’s own presentation is forbiddingly complex. But roughly speaking Whitehead proposed a radical reform of our conception of the fundamental nature of the world, placing events (or items that are more event-like than thing-like) and the ongoing processes of their creation and extinction as the core feature of the world, rather than the traditional triad of matter, space and time. His panpsychism arises from the idea that the elementary events that make up the world (which he called occasions) partake of mentality in some—often extremely attenuated—sense, metaphorically expressed in terms of the mentalistic notions of creativity, spontaneity and perception. The echoes of Leibniz are not accidental here, and Whitehead also has a form of Leibniz’s distinction between unities and mere aggregates, which he explains in these terms:

… in bodies that are obviously living, a coordination has been achieved that raises into prominence some functions inherent in the ultimate occasions. For lifeless matter these functionings thwart each other, and average out so as to produce a negligible total effect. In the case of living bodies the coordination intervenes, and the average effect of these intimate functionings has to be taken into account. (1933: 207)

(Lest it seem that Whitehead is only discussing life, he is clear that this depends upon a sort of mental functioning.)[6]

From the 1930s to the end of the twentieth century, there was relatively little interest in panpsychism in Western philosophy. This attitude was arguably caused by two things: the dominance of physicalism in the philosophy of mind, and the general hostility to metaphysics which reigned up until the 1970s. A rare exception to this trend was Timothy Sprigge who, in A Vindication of Absolute Idealism (1983), defends an idealism-based form of panpsychism. Sprigge summarized his views and provided some novel defences of them in Sprigge (2007), which is a response to critics, a number of which explicitly discuss panpsychism (see e.g., Maddell 2007). An important form of the anti-emergence argument for panpsychism (discussed below) was published by Thomas Nagel in 1979. Later David Griffen, in Unsnarling the World Knot (1998), espoused an atomistic panpsychism in the form of an explicit interpretation, extension and defense of Whitehead’s version of the doctrine. We also find sympathy for panpsychism in David Chalmers’ (1996) The Conscious Mind, and in articles responding to Chalmers by Piet Hut & Roger Shepard, Gregg Rosenberg, and William Seager, all in Shear 1997 (for more on the history of panpsychism see Clark 2004 and Skrbina 2005).

Recent developments have gone some way to reversing the aversion to panpsychism that has dominated Western philosophy in recent times. From the 1970s onwards hostility to metaphysics slowly withdrew, and most philosophers in the analytic tradition now accept the inevitability of metaphysics. And towards the end of the twentieth century and into the twenty-first, the continuing failure of physicalists to come up with a satisfying account of consciousness has led many to look for alternatives. As a result of both of these things, a significant and growing minority of analytic philosophers have begun seriously to explore the potential of panpsychism, both to provide a satisfying account of the emergence of human consciousness and to give a positive account of the intrinsic nature of matter (these motivations should become clearer in the discussion below of the arguments for panpsychism). The following volumes include some of this recent work: Freeman 2006; Skrbina 2009; Blaumauer 2011; Alter & Nagasawa 2015; Brüntrup & Jaskolla 2016; Seager forthcoming.

2. Varieties of Contemporary Panpsychism

2.1 The Definition of Panpsychism

The word “panpsychism” literally means that everything has a mind. However, in contemporary debates it is generally understood as the view that mentality is fundamental and ubiquitous in the natural world. Thus, in conjunction with the widely held assumption (which will be reconsidered below) that fundamental things exist only at the micro-level, panpsychism entails that at least some kinds of micro-level entities have mentality, and that instances of those kinds are found in all things throughout the material universe. So whilst the panpsychist holds that mentality is distributed throughout the natural world—in the sense that all material objects have parts with mental properties—she needn’t hold that literally everything has a mind, e.g., she needn’t hold that a rock has mental properties (just that the rock’s fundamental parts do).

We can distinguish various forms of panpsychism in terms of which aspect of mentality is taken to be fundamental and ubiquitous. Two important characteristics of human minds are thought and consciousness. In terms of these characteristics we can distinguish the following two possible forms of panpsychism:

  • Panexperientialism—the view that conscious experience is fundamental and ubiquitous
  • Pancognitivism—the view that thought is fundamental and ubiquitous.

According to the definition of consciousness that is dominant in contemporary analytic philosophy, something is conscious just in case there is something that it’s like to be it; that is to say, if it has some kind of experience, no matter how basic.[7] Humans have incredibly rich and complex experience, horses less so, mice less so again. Standardly the panexperientialist holds that this diminishing of the complexity of experience continues down through plants, and through to the basic constituents of reality, perhaps electrons and quarks. If the notion of “having experience” is flexible enough, then the view that an electron has experience—of some extremely basic kind—would seem to be coherent (of course we must distinguish the question of whether it is coherent from the question of whether it is plausible; the latter will depend on the strength of the arguments discussed below).

Thought, in contrast, is a much more sophisticated phenomenon, and many doubt that it is correct to ascribe it to non-human animals, never-mind fundamental particles. The traditional view in analytic philosophy is that thoughts are mental states that can be modelled as psychological attitudes towards specific propositions: believing that Budapest is the capital of Hungary, hoping that war is over, fearing that there will be another Global Financial Crisis. Panpsychism is often caricatured as the view that electrons have hopes and dreams, or that quarks suffer from existential angst. However, whilst there have been some defenders of pancognitivism in history, it is panexperientialist forms of panpsychism that are taken seriously in contemporary analytic philosophy. From now on I will equate panpsychism with panexperientialism.

2.2 Constitutive Versus Emergentist Panpsychism

Panpsychists believe that there is much more consciousness in the universe than most Westerners tend to think there is; indeed at least some fundamental entities have consciousness according to panpsychism. But what is the relationship between this “extra” consciousness and the consciousness we ordinarily believe in, the consciousness we pre-theoretically associate with humans and other animals?

David Chalmers (2015) distinguishes between constitutive and non-constitutive forms of panpsychism, a distinction I present here in a slightly modified form:

  • Constitutive panpsychism—Forms of panpsychism according to which facts about human and animal consciousness are not fundamental, but are grounded in/realized by/constituted of facts about more fundamental kinds of consciousness, e.g., facts about micro-level consciousness.
  • Non-Constitutive panpsychism—Forms of panpsychism according to which facts about human and animal consciousness are among the fundamental facts.[8]

The most common form of constitutive panpsychism is:

  • Constitutive Micropsychism—The view that all facts are grounded in/realized by/constituted of consciousness-involving facts at the micro-level.

According to constitutive micropsychism, the smallest parts of my brain have very basic forms of consciousness, and the consciousness of my brain as a whole is in some sense made up from the consciousness of its parts. This is the form of panpsychism that suffers most acutely from the combination problem, which we will explore below. However, if it can be made sense of, constitutive micropsychism promises an elegant and parsimonious view of nature, with all the richness of nature accounted for in terms of facts at the micro-level.

Turning to non-constitutive forms of panpsychism, we should note that by saying that human and animal consciousness is not “fundamental”, we simply mean that it is not grounded in (realized by/constituted of) micro-level consciousness; and this does not entail that human/animal consciousness is not caused by micro-level consciousness. Indeed, non-constitutive panpsychism typically takes the form of some kind of emergentism, according to which the conscious minds of humans and animals arise as a causal product of interactions between micro-level conscious subjects.

Emergentist panpsychism in turn takes two forms. Gregg Rosenberg (2004) and Godehard Brüntrup (2016) have each defended a form of layered emergentism, according to which human minds co-exist with the micro-level conscious subjects that give rise to them and sustain them throughout their existence. The resulting picture is structurally similar to the “British emergentism” of the 19th and early 20th century: in both pictures new fundamental entities and forces appear when matter reaches a certain level of complexity.[9] However, panpsychist emergentists are arguably committed to a less radical form of emergence than non-panpsychist emergentists, as the emergent entities are of the same kind as the micro-level entities from which they emerge.

William Seager (2016) and Hedda Hassel Mørch (2014) have independently defended a non-layered form of panpsychist emergentism, which we can call “fusionism”. According to fusionism, when micro-level subjects come together to form a human mind they don’t compose it as bricks compose a house, rather they as it were fuse into it, ceasing to exist in the process. On Seager’s view the post-fusion conscious brain entirely lacks parts; it is a “big simple”. On Mørch’s view the post-fusion conscious brain still has parts, but whereas pre-fusion the brain was dependent for its existence on its parts, post-fusion the parts are dependent for their existence upon the brain.

By taking human and animal consciousness to be fundamental, rather than somehow made up of more basic forms of consciousness, emergentists avoid some forms of the combination problem (discussed below). However, this comes at the cost of having an empirically more risky view. It is natural to think that emergent fundamental features of reality would introduce radically new causal powers, and hence it ought to be possible in principle to observe the difference they make in the world when they come into existence. David Papineau (2001) has argued that (i) neuroscience and cellular biology show no sign of the existence of distinctive causal powers associated with biological consciousness, and that (ii) this counts strongly against emergentism of any kind.

2.3 Panpsychism Versus Panprotopsychism

It is worth mentioning a position very similar to panpsychism, namely panprotopsychism. Whereas panpsychists think that consciousness is fundamental and ubiquitous, panprotopsychists think that proto-consciousness is fundamental and ubiquitous. The properties that characterise conscious experience are commonly referred to as “phenomenal properties”; and hence the properties involved in proto-consciousness are referred to as “protophenomenal properties”.[10]

In the first instance, we can think of protophenomenal properties as properties that are not themselves forms of consciousness but which in combination give rise to forms of consciousness. However, as Daniel Stoljar (2010) has pointed out, this definition is too broad, as anybody who believes that consciousness is not fundamental holds that it is constituted of some other properties, and hence believes in properties which are “protophenomenal” in this sense. Standard forms of physicalism will turn out to be forms of “panprotopsychism” on such a definition.

To get around this problem, a fuller definition of “protophenomenal properties” would define them as properties that in certain combinations transparently account for the existence of consciousness, in the sense that one could in principle move a priori from knowing the relevant facts about protophenomenal properties to knowing the relevant facts about phenomenal properties (Chalmers 2015; Goff 2015, 2017). That is to say, if you could magically perceive the protophenomenal properties in my brain (assuming panprotopsychism is true), you would in principle be able to deduce what it’s like to be me. This would distinguish panprotopsychism from the standard contemporary form of physicalism—that advocated by proponents of the so-called “phenomenal concept strategy” (Loar 1990; Papineau 1998; Diaz-Leon 2010)—according to which there is no explanatory entailment from the physical to the mental. We can further stipulate that the explanatory entailment advocated by the panprotopsychist does not hold (solely) in virtue of the kind of properties physical science reveals to us, thus distinguishing panprotopsychism from more radically reductive views such as analytic functionalism.

Thus, protophenomenal properties have a kind of indirect definition, in terms of their propensity to ground consciousness. Different forms of panprotopsychism are distinguished by what if anything they have to say about the positive nature of protophenomenal properties. Many panprotopsychists think we currently have no positive conception of the nature of protophenomenal properties. Indeed, some have argued that we are constitutionally incapable of ever forming one. This view was dubbed “mysterianism” by Owen Flanagan, and is most associated with Colin McGinn (1989; McGinn does not use the label “panprotopsychism” to describe his view, but it fits the definition laid out in this section).

Perhaps the most promising conception of protophenomenal properties is given by the view Herbert Feigl (1960) called “panqualityism”, crediting it to a conversation with Stephen C. Pepper. Versions of the view itself were held by William James (1904), Ernst Mach (1886), Bertrand Russell (1921) and Peter Unger (1999). More recently the view has been prominently defended by Sam Coleman (2012, 2014, 2015, 2016). According to panqualityism the protophenomenal properties are unexperienced qualities. Our conscious experience is filled with experienced qualities, e.g., those phenomenal qualities involved in seeing colour or feeling pain. Panqualityists believe that such qualities are only contingently experienced, and that in basic matter they exist unexperienced.

Panqualityists typically give some kind of reductionist account of how such unexperienced qualities come to be experienced, such as a functionalist account according to which for a quality to be experienced is for it to play the right causal role in the cognitive capacities of the organism. Thus, panqualityism can be seen as a kind of middle way between panpsychism and physicalism.[11] Whereas the physicalist thinks that we can give an entirely reductive account of consciousness, and the panpsychist thinks that consciousness is fundamental, the panqualityist thinks that that the qualitative aspect of consciousness is fundamental, whilst holding a reductive view of subjectivity, i.e., the fact that those qualities are experienced.

Tom McClelland (2013) defends a form of panprotopsychism that combines elements of mysterianism with the kind of reductive account of subjectivity favoured by the panqualityists. McClelland is a mysterian about the basic features of matter that give rise to the qualitative properties we encounter in our experience, but like Coleman he hopes that we may be able to give a reductive account of how those qualities come to be experienced.

For some other defences of protopanpsychism or closely related views, see Stoljar (2001), Holman (2008), Montero (2010) and Pereboom (2011, 2015).

2.4 Micropsychism Versus Cosmopsychism

Contemporary philosophers tend to assume that fundamental things exist at the micro-level. Coleman (2006) calls this “smallism”: the view that facts about big things are grounded in facts about little things, e.g., the table exists and is the way it is because the particles making it up are related in certain extremely complicated ways. However, the work of Jonathan Schaffer (2010) has recently brought to prominence an alternative picture of reality. According to the view Schaffer calls “priority monism”, facts about little things are grounded in facts about big things. The table’s atoms exist and are the way they are because the table exists and is the way it is; and all things ultimately exist and are the way they are because of certain facts about the universe as a whole. For the priority monist there is one and only one fundamental thing: the universe.

If we combine priority monism with constitutive panpsychism we get:

  • Constitutive cosmopsychism—The view that all facts are grounded in/realized by/constituted of consciousness-involving facts at the cosmic-level.

We can also envisage non-constitutive forms of cosmopsychism. On a standard form of layered emergentism (discussed above), human and animal minds are causally dependent on consciousness-involving micro-level facts whilst being fundamental entities in their own right; on the cosmopsychist analogue, human and animal minds are causally dependent on the conscious cosmos whilst being fundamental entities in their own right.[12] The minimal commitment of cosmopsychism is that the universe is conscious; in principle this is compatible with holding that the universe is a derivative entity, grounded in facts about is parts.

Cosmopsychism is not to be confused with pantheism: the view that the universe is God.[13] Just as the micropsychist holds that electrons have experience but not thought, so the cosmopsychist holds that the universe has some kind of experience, but may refrain from attributing thought or agency to the universe. It could be that the consciousness of the universe is a gigantic mess that doesn’t add up to anything coherent enough to ground cognition.

Detailed forms of cosmopsychism have been proposed by Mathews (2011), Jaskolla & Buck (2012), Shani (2015), Nagasawa & Wager (2016), and Goff (2017, forthcoming). Most of these philosophers are attracted to cosmopsychism on the grounds that it is better fitted than micropsychism to deal with the combination problem (we will discuss some of their reasons for thinking this below in the section on the combination problem). Cosmopsychism is the contemporary analogue of the “synecological” forms of panpsychism, defended by Fechner and Royce amongst others, which were discussed above.

2.5 Russellian Monism

In his 1927 book The Analysis of Matter, Bertrand Russell proposed a novel approach to the mind-body problem. Arthur Eddington, in his Gifford lectures of the same year, independently expressed very similar thoughts (published in Eddington 1928).[14] Remarkably this approach was almost completely forgotten about for much of the twentieth century. However, there has recently been a revival of interest in this approach, resulting in a Russell-inspired view that has become known as “Russellian monism”.

Russellian monists are motivated by the need to characterise the intrinsic nature of matter (This issue is discussed in great detail below in the section on the “Intrinsic nature argument”; reading that section will help one get a grip on Russellian monism and its motivation). We can define the view itself in terms of two components, one negative and one positive:

  • The information we get from the physical sciences is in some significant sense limited. There are subtle variations on how exactly this is put, but the idea is that the physical sciences only tell us about the extrinsic, relational, mathematical, or dispositional nature of matter, and leave us in the dark about its intrinsic, concrete and categorical nature. Physics tells us how an electron behaves, but it doesn’t tell us how it is in and of itself.
  • The intrinsic/concrete/categorical features of matter which physical science remains silent on account for the existence of consciousness. The problem of consciousness, the difficulty seeing how consciousness fits into the physical word, is the result of our not taking into account these “hidden” features of the physical world.

Some Russellian monists think that the intrinsic nature of fundamental matter is itself consciousness-involving; others that it involves non-phenomenal properties that somehow transparently explain the reality of consciousness. Thus, we get panpsychist and panprotopsychist forms of the view, which we can call “Russellian panpsychism” and “Russellian panprotopsychism” respectively.

The attraction of Russellian monism is that it has the potential to avoid both the deep problems facing dualism and the deep problems facing physicalism. The problem with dualism is its difficulty reconciling the causal efficacy of human consciousness with (what many philosophers take to be) the empirical fact that the physical world is causally closed, in the sense that every event has a sufficient physical cause. The causal closure of the physical seems to leave no room for fundamental non-physical mental causes to do any work. If my behaviour is entirely caused by physical events in my brain, then my immaterial soul is left with no role to play in the production of behaviour. The physicalist avoids this problem as on her view consciousness states are physical states, and hence they are themselves parts of the causally closed physical system. Or rather physicalists can avoid this problem if they can give an adequate account of the grounding of consciousness. The problem for physicalists, as we will discuss in the next section, is that there are strong philosophical grounds for thinking that they are unable to do this.[15]

Russellian monism offers hope of a satisfying solution to both of these difficulties. Its elegant integration of consciousness in the material world looks to be a promising way of accounting for the causal role of human consciousness. If conscious states just are the intrinsic nature of brain states, then the causal action of brain states and the causal action of conscious states are arguably one and the same thing. And by postulating a phenomenal or protophenomenal nature to fundamental physical reality, Russellian monism hopes to provide an adequate account of the grounding of consciousness.[16]

For these reasons, Russellian monism is increasingly being seen as one of the most promising ways forward on the problem of consciousness. Even its opponents have expressed admiration for its virtues; physicalist Alyssa Ney (2015: 349) says of it

This proposal strikes me, suspending disbelief about the…theses that lead up to it, as at least as bold and exciting as Newton’s proposed identification of terrestrial and cosmic reality.

The growing prominence of Russellian monism, given that one paradigmatic form of Russellian monism is panpsychist, has resulted in panpsychism once again being considered as a serious option.

See Alter & Nagasawa (2015) for a recent collection of essays on Russellian monism. For further work on Russellian monism and related views see Feigl (1967), Maxwell (1979), Lockwood (1989), Strawson (1994, 2003, 2016), Chalmers (1996, 2015), Griffen (1998), Stoljar (2001), Pereboom (2011, 2015) and Goff (2015, 2017).

3. Arguments for Panpsychism

3.1 The Anti-Emergence Argument

Neuroscience has made great progress in uncovering the mechanisms in the brain that underlie our cognitive and behavioural functioning. But this form of scientific investigation has not produced anything approaching a satisfying explanation of why it is that a person has subjective experience, i.e., of why there is something that it’s like to be a human being. It seems that we can imagine a creature that was empirically indiscernible from a human being in terms of its physical brain processes and the behaviour they give rise to, but which had no experience whatsoever (it screams and runs away when you stick a knife in it, but it doesn’t actually feel pain). And it arguably follows that facts about physical brain processes and behaviour cannot explain, at least not in a transparent and satisfying manner, the reality of conscious experience.

This is the problem David Chalmers (1995, 1996) famously named “the hard problem of consciousness”.[17] Some think the alleged problem involves a confusion, although anyone who thinks this is obliged to diagnose the exact root of the confusion. Others think that there is a problem, but one that further scientific investigation will solve. Perhaps we just need to wait for the arrival of the “Darwin of consciousness” to make progress. However, there is no reason to suppose that “further scientific investigation” has to be pursued under the methodological assumption that consciousness is to be accounted for in terms of processes which don’t involve consciousness, e.g., in terms of facts about non-conscious neurons. The panpsychist proposes an alternative approach: explain human and animal consciousness in terms of more basic forms of consciousness. These more basic forms of consciousness are then postulated as properties of the fundamental constituents of the material world, perhaps of quarks and electrons. Thus, we try to explain the consciousness of the human brain in terms of the consciousness of its most fundamental parts.

Thomas Nagel (1979) influentially argued that adopting a view like panpsychism is the only way to avoid what he called “emergence”. Crucially, close examination of the text reveals that Nagel is using the word “emergence” slightly differently to how it has come to be used in contemporary discussions of panpsychism (discussed above). For Nagel, “emergent” properties of a complex system are ones that cannot be intelligibly derived from the properties of its parts. In contrast, for the “emergentist panpsychists” discussed above, “emergent” properties of a complex system are simply fundamental macro-level properties, which may or may not be intelligibly derived from the properties of its parts.[18] Following Galen Strawson (2006a) we can use the word “radical emergence” to express Nagel’s notion of emergence.[19]

Nagel’s argument involves four premises:

  1. Material Composition—Living organisms are complex material systems with no immaterial parts. The matter composing us is not special; the matter composing any material entity, if broken down far enough and rearranged, could in principle be incorporated into a living organism.
  2. Realism—Mental states are genuine properties of living organisms.
  3. No Radical Emergence—All the properties of a complex organism are intelligibly derived from the properties of its parts.
  4. Non-Reductionism—The mental states of an organism are not intelligibly derived from its physical properties alone.

Nagel takes these premises to imply that there must be non-physical properties of basic matter that, when combined in the right way, intelligible imply the existence of mental states. It is worth noting that, although Nagel calls the resulting view “panpsychism”, it seems compatible with panprotopsychism (discussed above).

More recently, Galen Strawson (2006a) has defended a similar argument from the untenability of radical emergence. Whereas Nagel’s aim is merely to establish the disjunction of panpsychism and panprotopsychism, the conclusion of Strawson’s argument is very definitely the truth of panpsychism. Strawson begins by arguing that radical emergence is upon reflection unintelligible:

Emergence can’t be brute. It is built into the heart of the notion of emergence that emergence cannot be brute in the sense of there being absolutely no reason in the nature of things why the emerging thing is as it is (so that it is unintelligible even to God). For any feature Y of anything that is correctly considered to be emergent from X, there must be something about X and X alone in virtue of which Y emerges, and which is sufficient for Y (Strawson 2006a: 18)

There are of course cases in which one property arises from another, e.g., liquid arises from individual molecules each of which is not itself liquid. However, in all such cases, Strawson argues, the emergence is perfectly intelligible:

We can easily make intuitive sense of the idea that certain sorts of molecules are so constituted that they don’t bind together in a tight lattice but slide past or off each other (in accordance with van de Waals molecular interaction laws) in a way that gives rise to—is—the phenomenon of liquidity. So too, with Bénard convection cells we can easily make sense of the idea that physical laws relating to surface tension, viscosity, and other forces governing the motion of molecules give rise to hexagonal patterns on the surface of a fluid like oil when it is heated. In both these cases we move in a small set of conceptually homogeneous shape-size-mass-charge-number-position-motion-involving physics notions with no sense of puzzlement…. Using the notion of reduction in a familiar loose way, we can say that the phenomena of liquidity reduce without remainder to shape-size-mass-charge-etc. (Strawson 2006a: 18)

Thus, the crucial feature of intelligible emergence, according to Strawson, is that the relationship between the product of emergence and its producer can be adequately characterized using a single set of conceptually homogeneous concepts. But it’s very hard to see how any set of conceptually homogeneous concepts could capture both the experiential (i.e., consciousness-involving) and the non-experiential (non-conscious-involving), and hence hard to see how the thesis that consciousness emerges from non-consciousness could be rendered intelligible. Strawson argues that it is only by supposing that human and animal consciousness emerges from more basic forms of consciousness, that we have hope of avoiding the emergence of animal consciousness being a brute and inexplicable miracle.

It is not clear that Strawson is able to conclusively rule out the panprotopsychist option discussed above. It is plausible that we currently have no positive conception of wholly non-experiential states that would intelligibly give rise to consciousness. But maybe that’s because the Darwin of consciousness hasn’t come along yet to theorise her way to their nature. Or maybe, as Colin McGinn (1989) famously argued, human beings are constitutively incapable of grasping the nature of the properties underlying consciousness; it could nonetheless be that the emergence of consciousness from non-consciousness is intelligible to God if not to us. We have seen that Strawson insists that an emergent feature and that from which it emerges must be capable of being captured under a set of conceptually homogeneous notions; but perhaps there is an unknown (at least thus far) neutral vocabulary in terms of which both experiential and non-experiential features of reality can be adequately described (Nagel is open to this possibility, which is another way of seeing how the conclusion of Strawson’s argument is stronger than that of Nagel’s). Furthermore, as Philip Goff (2006, 2017: ch. 7) has argued in response to Strawson, there is reason to doubt that the panpsychist herself is able to give a wholly intelligible story as to how macro-level consciousness emerges from the micro-level consciousness, which threatens to undermine Strawson’s claim that panpsychism avoids radical emergence. (This issue is discussed in detail below in the section on The Subject-Summing Problem).

Strawson’s argument is intended to show that a non-panpsychist reduction of consciousness is impossible. However, it is not obvious that this is essential for the anti-emergence argument for panpsychism to have force. Philosophers and scientists have spent a great deal of time trying to explain consciousness in terms of non-consciousness, and these efforts have not produced even the beginnings of an intelligible explanation. Given this failure it seems reasonable to explore other paradigms of scientific explanation.

It might seem obvious that emergentist panpsychists (discussed above) are unable to make use of the anti-emergence argument for panpsychism. However, many panpsychists argue that panpsychist forms of emergentism are less radical than non-panpsychism forms of emergentism. Hedda Hassel Mørch (2014), for example, defends a form of panpsychism involving partially intelligible emergence, which she argues is to be preferred over fully brute emergence.

Brian McLaughlin (2016) responds to Nagel’s argument by deploying a currently popular strategy for defending physicalism: the phenomenal concept strategy. See also Freeman 2006 for a volume of responses to Strawson’s anti-emergence argument, followed by Strawson’s counter-response.

3.2 The Intrinsic Nature Argument

There is a second prominent argument for panpsychism, which has nothing to do with the need to explain human consciousness; rather it begins from a certain gap in the picture of the world we get from the physical sciences. This argument has its roots in Leibniz, Schopenhauer, Russell (1927) and Whitehead (1933 [1967]), and is defended by many panpsychists, including Sprigge (1999), Strawson (2003) and Goff (2017). It is also strongly connected to the motivations for Russellian monism, and so it may be useful to read this section in close conjunction with the section above on Russellian monism.

In the public mind physics is on its way to giving us a complete account of the fundamental nature of the material world. It seems almost tautological that “physics” is the true theory of “the physical”, and hence that it is to physics we should turn for an understanding of the complete nature of space, time and matter. However, this commonplace opinion comes under pressure when we reflect on the austere vocabulary in terms of which physical theories are framed. A crucial moment in the scientific revolution was Galileo’s declaration that the book of the universe is written in the language of mathematics; from this point onwards mathematics has been the language of physics. The vocabulary of physics is arguably not entirely mathematical, as it involves causal or nomic notions, such as the notion of a law of nature. But the kind of qualitative concepts we find in the Aristotelian characterisation of the universe are wholly absent from modern physics. Physical theories are framed in a wholly mathematico-nomic vocabulary.

The problem is that it’s not clear that such an austere vocabulary can even in principle capture the complete nature of concrete reality. A mathematical description of a situation abstracts from concrete reality; a mathematical model in economics for example abstracts away from what is being bought or sold, or the nature of labour. And nomic predicates can only express information about how physical entities are disposed to behave. This is fine if we want to predict, say, how electrons will behave. But intuitively there must also be an intrinsic nature to an electron; there must be an answer to the question “How is the electron in and of itself?” And this question doesn’t seem to be answered by describing how electrons are disposed to behave.

Some philosophers, known as “dispositional essentialists”, hold that all fundamental properties are pure dispositions (Ellis 2001; Molnar 2003; Mumford 2004; Bird 2007). On this view, once we have fully described how the electron is disposed to behave, e.g., the disposition to repel other electrons and to attract positrons, or the disposition to exert gravitational attraction on other entities with mass, we have thereby said everything there is to be said about the nature of the electron. Entities on this view are not so much beings as doings.

However, there are powerful arguments against the intelligibility of dispositional essentialism. Most discussed is the charge that attempts to characterize the nature of properties under the assumption of dispositional essentialism lead to vicious regress (Robinson 1982; Blackburn 1990; Armstrong 1997; Heil 2003; Lowe 2006; Goff 2017: ch. 6). For any given disposition X, we understand the nature of X only when we know the nature of its manifestation, that is, the property it gives rise to when manifested. For example, the manifestation of flammability is burning; we only know what flammability is when we know that burning is its manifestation. However, assuming dispositional essentialism the manifestation of any disposition X will be another disposition, call it “Y”. To know the nature of X we need to know the nature of Y. But we can only know the nature of Y by knowing the nature of its manifestation, which will be another disposition, call it “Z”. To know the nature of Z we need to know the nature of its manifestation, and so on ad infinitum. The buck is continually passed, and hence an adequate understanding of the nature of any property is impossible, even for an omniscient being; in other words, a dispositional essentialist world is unintelligible. Russell records the moral of the story thus:

There are many possible ways of turning some things hitherto regarded as “real” into mere laws concerning the other things. Obviously there must be a limit to this process, or else all the things in the world will merely be each other’s washing (Russell 1927: 325)

If this argument is sound, then physical theory will never provide us with a complete and adequate account of the nature of the material world. The job of physics is to provide us with mathematical models that accurately predict the behaviour of matter. This is incredibly useful information; rich understanding of the causal structure of matter has enabled us to manipulate the natural world in all sorts of extraordinary ways, allowing us to build lasers and hairdryers, and to put men on the moon. Indeed we can explain the extraordinary success of physics in terms of the fact that from Galileo onwards it focused on this more limited project of capturing matter’s causal structure, rather than speculating about the underlying nature of the stuff that has that structure.

However, as philosophers we may be interested in finding out what the intrinsic nature of matter is, or at least having our best guess as to what it might be. And if the above line of reasoning is correct, we must look beyond physics for this. The panpsychist has a proposal: the intrinsic nature of matter is, at least in part, consciousness. Supposing for the sake of discussion that electrons are fundamental constituents of reality, the panpsychist proposal is as follows: physics tells us how an electron behaves, but in and of itself the electron is essentially a thing that instantiates consciousness (of presumably some extremely basic kind).

What is to be said in favour of this proposal? The first thing to say is that it is not obvious that we have an alternative proposal, at least at present. We learn about matter through its causal impact on our senses or on our measuring devices; as Eddington (1928: 58–60; quoted in Strawson 2006a) put it “Our knowledge of the nature of the objects treated in physics consists solely of readings of pointers [on instrument dials] and other indicators”. It’s hard to see how this indirect method of investigating matter could yield insight into its intrinsic nature. Derk Pereboom (2011) has suggested that future thinkers may through imagination theorise their way to a positive hypothesis concerning the intrinsic nature of matter, and such a proposal may turn out to have empirical support, or theoretical support of some other kind. However, at least as they are currently conceived of, the physical sciences have no use for speculation concerning matter’s intrinsic nature. It is arguable that our choice is between the panpsychist proposal and the view that the intrinsic nature of matter is “we know not what”.

Furthermore, assuming the falsity of dualism, we know that the intrinsic nature of at least some matter is consciousness-involving: namely the matter of brains (or whole organisms if we think that organisms are the bearers of consciousness). This is perhaps our only real clue as to the intrinsic nature of matter in general; as regards the intrinsic nature of stuff outside of brains (or of the parts of brains) we can only speculate. Goff (2016, 2017: ch. 7) has argued that from this epistemic starting point there is a clear “simplicity argument” in favour of panpsychism: in the absence of any reason to suppose otherwise, the most simple, elegant, parsimonious hypothesis is that the matter outside of brains is continuous with the matter of brains in also having a consciousness-involving nature. Eddington (1928: 259–60; quoted in Strawson 2003) remarked that it was rather “silly”, given that we know nothing from physics of the intrinsic nature of matter, to suppose that its nature is incongruent with mentality and then to wonder where mentality comes from. These panpsychists try to put the onus is on their opponents to come up with a non-panpsychist proposal as to the intrinsic nature of matter, and to give reasons to prefer it to the prima facie much simpler and more parsimonious panpsychist proposal.

3.3 Other Arguments for Panpsychism

Whereas the anti-emergence argument discussed above tries to show that panpsychism offers the best account of the synchronic dependence of biological consciousness on more fundamental features of reality, genetic arguments try to show that panpsychism offers the best account of the development of biological consciousness in evolutionary history.[20] Such arguments turn on the assumption that evolution is a continuous process that molds pre-existing properties into more complex forms, but that cannot produce “entirely novel” properties. William Clifford puts the argument thus:

… we cannot suppose that so enormous a jump from one creature to another should have occurred at any point in the process of evolution as the introduction of a fact entirely different and absolutely separate from the physical fact. It is impossible for anybody to point out the particular place in the line of descent where that event can be supposed to have taken place. The only thing that we can come to, if we accept the doctrine of evolution at all, is that even in the very lowest organism, even in the Amoeba which swims about in our own blood, there is something or other, inconceivably simple to us, which is of the same nature with our own consciousness…. (Clifford [1874] 1886: 266)

A similar argument is due to James:

we ought … to try every possible mode of conceiving of consciousness so that it may not appear equivalent to the irruption into the universe of a new nature non-existent to then. ([1890] 1950: 148)

More recently, Goff (2013) has argued that consciousness is not vague, and that this leads to a sorites-style argument for panpsychism. Very roughly if consciousness does not admit of borderline cases, then we will have to suppose that some utterly precise micro-level change—down to an exact arrangement of particles—marked the first appearance of consciousness (or the change from non-conscious to conscious embryo/foetus), and it is going to seem arbitrary that it was that utterly precise change that was responsible for this significant change in nature.

A final important motivation for panpsychism comes from the need to account for mental causation in a way that is consistent with alleged causal closure of the physical: the thesis that every physical event has a sufficient physical cause (Chalmers 2015; Goff 2017: ch. 6). If, as the dualist believes, consciousness exists outside the physical world, it is hard to see how it could impact on a causally closed physical system. But if, as the panpsychist believes, consciousness infuses the intrinsic nature of the material world, then consciousness and its effects are part of the causally closed system. As discussed above, this is an important motivation for the contemporary position Russellian monism.[21]

4. Objections to Panpsychism

4.1 The Incredulous Stare

Many people, both philosophers and non-philosophers, find deeply counterintuitive the idea that fundamental constituents of the physical world, such as electrons, have conscious experience. And many take this to be a good reason not to take panpsychism seriously. However, panpsychists may respond by denying that a theory’s ill-fit with our intuitions is a reason for doubting its truth. Consider the thesis that we have a common ancestors with apes, or that time flows slower when travelling at high speeds, or that a particle can exist in a superposition between distinct locations; all of these theses are highly counter-intuitive, but this gives us little or no reason to think them false.

Presumably these scientific theories are taken so seriously in spite of their strangeness because they are supported by empirical evidence. However, most arguments for panpsychism start from a datum which is known with greater certainty than the data of observation and experiments: the existence of human consciousness. Of course the mere existence of human consciousness does not logically entail the truth of panpsychism. There are always an infinite number of theories consistent with the data, and we must choose between them on the basis of theoretical virtues, such as parsimony and simplicity. But if it could be shown that panpsychism provides the best explanation of the existence of human and animal consciousness, or that it is the most parsimonious theory of the intrinsic nature of matter (given that the only clue we have as to the intrinsic nature of matter is that some of it involves consciousness), this would give us strong support for the truth of panpsychism in spite of its prima facie strangeness.

Consider the following analogy (Goff 2016, 2017: ch. 7). Einstein’s theory of special relativity is empirically equivalent to the Lorentzian theory that preceded it; and if our concern is fit with commonsense then Lorentz’s theory is superior as it preserves our commonsense notion of absolute time. However, the scientific community almost universally went for Einstein’s view on the grounds of its greater simplicity and elegance. Similarly, we should assess panpsychism on the grounds of its theoretical virtue and explanatory power, rather than the fact that most Western people find it strange.

4.2 The Combination Problem

It is generally agreed, both by its proponents and by its opponents, that the hardest problem facing panpsychism is what has become known as the “combination problem”. This term comes from William Seager (1995), although in the contemporary literature the problem itself is generally traced back to William James ([1890] 1981).[22] The combination problem is most obviously a challenge for constitutive micropsychism, although as we shall see there are forms of it that threaten other kinds of panpsychism. According to constitutive micropsychism, micro-level entities have their own very basic forms of conscious experience, and in brains these micro-level conscious entities somehow come together to constitute human and animal consciousness. The problem is that this is very difficult to make sense of: “little” conscious subjects of experience with their micro-experiences coming together to form a “big” conscious subject with its own experiences.

The inspiration for the problem is the following passage from James:

Take a hundred of them [feelings], shuffle them and pack them as close together as you can (whatever that may mean); still each remains the same feeling it always was, shut in its own skin, windowless, ignorant of what the other feelings are and mean. There would be a hundred-and first-feeling there, if, when a group or series of such feelings where set up, a consciousness belonging to the group as such should emerge. And this 101st feeling would be a totally new fact; the 100 feelings might, by a curious physical law, be a signal for its creation, when they came together; but they would have no substantial identity with it, not it with them, and one could never deduce the one from the others, nor (in any intelligible sense) say that they evolved it. (James [1890] 1981: 160)b

In fact, if one reads on in the text one finds that James’ argument is that there is no mental combination because there is no combination whatsoever (Shani 2010). James believes that in reality there are only particles arranged in various ways, which give rise to the idea of composite objects by the effects they have on our senses. The denial that there are any composite objects whatsoever is fairly radical. However, contemporary philosophers have been inspired by the above passage to think that there is something specifically troubling about the notion of mental combination, a concern that doesn’t obviously arise in the physical case. At least on the face of it we have no problem with the idea of bricks forming a house, or mechanical parts forming a car engine. But the idea of many minds forming some other mind is much harder to get your head around (so to speak).

The general consensus among panpsychists is that there is currently no wholly adequate solution to the combination problem. However, this is not obviously a reason to think the panpsychist research project is not worth pursuing. Compare: it was only many decades after Darwin and Wallace formulated the principle of natural selection that modern genetics developed, and indeed there are many deep problems facing the Darwinian research project that remain unsolved. It takes time to move from a broad theoretical framework to a complete theory with all the details filled in. It is only recently that panpsychism is once again being taken seriously by contemporary philosophers and neuroscientists (e.g., Tononi & Koch 2015). If it does eventually produce a perfectly adequate account of human consciousness and of the nature of matter, this will no doubt only be after many decades or centuries of serious inter-disciplinary work.

4.3 The Subject-Summing Problem

The kind of mental combination which is generally taken to be most troubling is subject-summing: the combination of distinct conscious subjects into a single conscious mind. And hence the paradigmatic form of the combination problem is the subject-summing problem.

The subject-summing problem, and indeed all forms of the combination problem, can be construed in a stronger or a milder form. In its milder form it is taken to be a challenge that the panpsychist must address in the long run, either by eventually coming up with an adequate theoretical account of mental combination, or at least by explaining why such an account is beyond our ken. Almost all panpsychists accept this challenge, and one major activity of the contemporary panpsychism research project is attempting to solve (or circumnavigate) the subject-summing problem and the combination problem more generally.

In its stronger form the subject-summing problem takes the form of an argument to the conclusion that subject-summing is incoherent or impossible, and hence that panpsychism—or at least constitutive micropsychism—must be false. Sam Coleman (2014), for example, has argued that subject-summing is incoherent on the grounds that each subject has a viewpoint that excludes the viewpoints of all other subjects. The essence of my current point of view as a conscious subject is a matter not just of the conscious experiences I am positively having, but of the fact that I am having those experiences and no others. The same could be said of the essence of the point of view you are currently enjoying. If my point of view and your point of view were to be combined into an “uber-mind”, then that uber-mind would have to have both your experiences to the exclusion of all other experiences and my experiences to the exclusion of all other experiences. This seems flatly contradictory, assuming that you and I have different experiences. If this argument works, it ought to apply to the much simpler points of view of micro-level subjects, thus rendering constitutive micropsychism incoherent.[23]

Another attempt to demonstrate the impossibility of subject-summing is found in Goff’s (2009, 2017) conceivability argument against mental combination. Goff reads into the above James passage a claim about conceivability:

Conceivable Isolation of Subjects (CIS)—For any group of subjects, \(S_{1}\), \(S_{2}\), …, \(S_{n}\), and any conscious states, \(E_{1}\), \(E_{2}\), …, \(E_{n}\), the following scenario is conceivable: there are \(S_{1}\), \(S_{2}\), …, \(S_{n}\) instantiating \(E_{1}\), \(E_{2}\), …, \(E_{n}\), but it’s not the case that there is a subject \(S*\) such that \(S*\) is not identical with any of \(S_{1}\), \(S_{2}\) … \(S_{n}\).

Building on this he argues that we can conceive of a “micro-experiential zombie”, defined as a creature that is:

  • Physically indiscernible from an actual human being,
  • Such that each of its micro-level parts has conscious experience.
  • Such that no macro-level part of the organism has conscious experience.

If we can infer from the conceivability to the possibility of such creatures, then the falsity of constitutive micropsychism seems to follow. For the constitutive micropsychist holds that the facts about micro-subjects wholly account for the existence of macro-level conscious subjects. But if it is possible for the facts about micro-subjects to obtain in the absence of any macro-level consciousness—which on the face of it seems to be the case in a world of micro-experiential zombies—then it seems that the facts about micro-subjects cannot wholly account for the existence of macro-level consciousness (it’s generally assumed that for fact X to ground fact Y, it must be the case that X necessitates Y). In that sense, it’s impossible for subjects to sum.

This is a particularly worrying argument for the panpsychist, as she generally motivates her view in terms of a rejection of physicalism: if physicalist accounts of consciousness are implausible then this can motivate turning to panpsychism as an alternative. However, the most common way of rejecting physicalism is via a conceivability argument of the above form, roughly: we can conceive of the physical facts of the body and brain obtaining in the absence of the facts about consciousness, and hence the physical facts cannot wholly account for the facts about consciousness (see Chalmers 2009 and Goff 2017). If the same form of argument also applies to the panpsychist account of macro-level consciousness—the kind of consciousness we surely want explained at the end of the day—then it seems we’ve got nowhere. (Note that this worry does not threaten the intrinsic nature argument for panpsychism, discussed above).[24]

For further details, see the supplementary document Possible Solutions to the Subject-Summing Problem.

4.4 Other Forms of the Combination Problem

In David Chalmers’ (2016) taxonomy of the combination problem, there are three dimensions of difficulty:

  • Difficulties relating to subject combination: the core difficulty being the subject-summing problem
  • Difficulties relating to quality combination: the core difficulty being the palette problem
  • Difficulties relating to combination of structure: the core difficulties being the structural mismatch problem and the grain problem.

We have already covered the subject-summing problem in some detail. I turn now to a briefer treatment of problems pertaining to quality and structure.

4.4.1 The Palette Problem

Human consciousness is a rich and wonderful thing. In any given sense modality, we enjoy an incredible variety of qualities. Moreover, prima facie the delightful qualities we enjoy in one sense modality seem to be wildly different from the sensory qualities we enjoy in any other sensory modality; what it’s like to smell, for example, seems to have nothing in common with what it’s like to see a colour. For the panpsychist all this richness and variety results from fundamental kinds of mental qualities, which panpsychists tend to suppose are quite small in number (e.g., for Russellian monists basic conscious properties are the intrinsic nature of the basic properties picked out by physics, which are relatively few in number). The palette problem (Chalmers 2016), expressed as metaphor, goes as follows: How is it that the richly painted canvas of human experiences is produced from such a small palette of paints?

Numerous speculative solutions have been offered to the palette problem. Patrick Lewtas (forthcoming) avoids the palette problem altogether by postulating an enormous number of fundamental micro-experiential properties, one corresponding to every basic quality we find in human experience. Luke Roelofs (2014, 2015) develops a form of constitutive micropsychism according to which we cannot recognise or imagine the basic micro-conscious ingredients which make up human consciousness, because we never experience them in isolation from the extremely complex combinations we find in our experience; given that we are unable even to imagine the micro-conscious ingredients, we have no good reason to deny that those ingredients are extremely small in number. Keith Turausky (2012, Other Internet Resources) considers the view that perhaps there is just one fundamental mental quality that somehow contains all others, in something like the way white light contains all colours.

4.4.2 The Structural Mismatch Problem

Human conscious experience is not only rich in qualities, but also rich in structure. For example visual experience appears to have a structure that corresponds to the spatial environment being experienced, and experience as a whole comes carved up into distinct sensory modalities. The structure of our experience seems very different from the structure of the brain, at either the micro or the macro level. For the dualist this is of course not a worry, as the conscious mind is a completely distinct entity from the brain. However, many panpsychists believe that the conscious mind is identical with, or bears a very intimate relationship with, the brain. Most Russellian monists, for example, believe that the conscious mind is the intrinsic nature of the brain. And all constitutive micropsychists think that human experience is grounded in the properties of micro-level entities. Thus, these forms of panpsychism face the challenge of explaining how the rich structure of consciousness results from, or at least co-exists with, the seemingly very different structure of the brain. Perhaps the most discussed form of the structural mismatch problem is the grain problem (Maxwell 1979; Lockwood 1993): the worry that experiences seem to be smooth and continuous in a way that is at odds with the discrete, particularized structure of brain properties.

Again there are numerous proposals for addressing the worry. Michael Lockwood (1993) suggests that the worry only arises when we are implicitly thinking of the brain in terms of classical physics, and that it evaporates when we explicitly adopt more recent scientific paradigms. Stoljar (2001) argues that the alleged problem arises from philosophers confusing the structure of consciousness itself with the structure of what is represented by consciousness. Nagasawa & Wager (2016) suggest that the problem goes away when we adopt cosmopsychism rather than micropsychism, because we no longer suppose that the structure of the macro-level brain is derived from its structure at the micro-level. Roelofs (2015: 182–97) has argued, echoing certain views of Leibniz and Spinoza, that the structure of our conscious experience might outstrip our awareness of it. Goff (2017: ch. 8) argues that we do find structure in the brain isomorphic with the structure of consciousness, so long as we consider less basic kinds of brain structure; and hence the moral of the story is that there is much more consciousness present in the brain than we ordinarily suppose, corresponding both to more basic and to less basic brain structures (cf. Roelofs 2015: 213–28 and Chalmers 2016: 7.8).


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The July 2017 version of this entry is almost entirely new and was written by Philip Goff. Section 1, however, was developed from the previous version (by William Seager and Sean Allen-Hermanson), and a couple of paragraphs of the earlier version are retained in later sections.

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