Reasons for Action: Internal vs. External

First published Thu Sep 4, 2008; substantive revision Fri Aug 18, 2017

Often, when there is a reason for you to do something, it is the kind of thing to motivate you to do it. For example, if Max and Caroline are deciding whether to go to the Alcove for dinner, Caroline might mention as a reason in favor, the fact that the Alcove serves onion rings the size of doughnuts, and Max might mention as a reason against, the fact that it is so difficult to get parking there this time of day. It is some sign—perhaps not a perfect sign, but some sign—that each of these really is a reason, that Max and Caroline feel the tug in each direction. Mention of the Alcove’s onion rings makes them feel to at least some degree inclined to go, and mention of the parking arrangements makes them feel to at least some degree inclined not to. According to some philosophers, reasons for action always bear some relation like this to motivation. This idea is variously known as ‘reasons internalism’, ‘internalism about reasons’, or ‘the internal reasons theory’. According to other philosophers, not all reasons are related to motivation in any of the ways internalists say. This idea is known as ‘reasons externalism’ or ‘externalism about reasons’.

1. Preliminaries

1.1 Varieties of Internalism

It is important to clarify that reasons internalism is a thesis about normative (or justifying) reasons, not about motivating (or explanatory) reasons. A normative reason is a consideration that counts in favor of or against doing something, whereas a motivating reason is an answer to the question, ‘why did she do it?’. Clearly, motivating reasons are connected to motivation; reasons internalism maintains the more interesting claim that normative reasons are also closely connected to motivation. For the remainder of this article, by ‘reason’ we will always mean normative reason.

Reasons internalism as we’ve so far presented it is not yet a thesis. To get a thesis from this vague idea we must fill in a detailed answer to the question: what sort of relation must reasons bear to motivation, and in what sense of ‘motivation’? So the idea sketched thus far is really a family of theses, each corresponding to a different way of filling in the following schema:

Schematic Internalism: Every reason for action must bear relation R to motivational fact M.

Different ways of spelling out relation R and motivational fact M correspond to different ways of trying to cash out the intuitive thought about Max and Caroline’s reasons. Each way of filling in a candidate for R and a candidate for M results in a different thesis—a version of reasons internalism (henceforth for this article, a version of internalism). Importantly, since not all versions of internalism say the same thing, there is no single question about whether internalism is correct. Rather, there is a family of questions which raise very similar philosophical issues.

Unfortunately, the labels ‘internalism’ and even ‘reasons internalism’ are often used for different kinds of views than the ones that are our topic here. For example, ‘reasons internalism’ is sometimes used as a name for the view that if something is morally wrong then there must be a reason not to do it. This view will be important to our discussion; to avoid confusion we will follow the rival convention of calling it Moral Rationalism.

In the terminology of Darwall (1983), reasons internalism is an existence form of internalism, contrasting with judgment forms of internalism. According to existence internalism, a consideration is a reason for an agent only if some motivational fact about that agent obtains. According to judgment internalism, an agent genuinely judges that she has a reason only if some motivational fact about that agent obtains; see the entry on moral motivation. Judgment forms of internalism play an important role in traditional arguments for noncognitivist metaethical theories (see the entry on moral cognitivism vs. noncognitivism) but are a quite different issue from that discussed here.

A ‘reasons externalist’ is someone who rejects reasons internalism, maintaining that at least some reasons for action are not connected to motivation in the way reasons internalism claims. However, since there are many different internalist theses about the way in which reasons and motivation are related, there is no clear and unambiguous question of whether reasons externalism is correct. Philosophers generally describe their views as ‘externalist’ if they reject any thesis they consider to involve an interesting and controversial dependence of reasons on facts about motivation; it is most likely not fruitful to try here to adjudicate which theses these are. Externalists need not deny that reasons are commonly connected to facts about motivation, but they can attribute these connections to desires or dispositions that some agents have while others lack.

1.1.1 Varying M

An important division among versions of reasons internalism is between what we will here call Motivation views and State views. According to Motivation views, the kind of motivational fact that reasons require is a fact about what the agent is or can be motivated (i.e. moved through her own volition) to do. According to State views, in contrast, the kind of motivational fact that reasons require is not actually a fact about motivation at all, but rather, that the agent has a certain kind of motivational attitude—a certain kind of psychological state which plays a role in motivation. These states are often taken to be desires, but can include other attitudes such as emotions, intentions, and aversions. Motivation and State views are often run together, but we shall see that they have importantly different implications. Motivation views do not, by themselves, require the presence of any particular kind of psychological state which does the motivating, and State views do not, by themselves, require that the motivating state which is present actually does any motivating.

1.1.2 Varying R

Another very important distinction among versions of Internalism is between Actual and Counterfactual versions. The former claim that if someone has a reason to do A, then it follows by necessity that she actually is somewhat motivated to do A (on the Motivation version), or actually has a desire that would be served by doing A (on the State version). Counterfactual versions make weaker claims: that if someone has a reason to do A, then it follows by necessity that she would be motivated to some degree, or would desire to do A, in circumstances of a particular kind.

Different Counterfactual theories disagree over the nature of this “particular kind” of circumstances: prominent proposals include (i) that the agent be in possession of full information, or at least not have any relevant false beliefs (Smith 1994; Joyce 2001); (ii) that she have completed “cognitive psychotherapy” or that her attitudes have reached a state of reflective equilibrium (Brandt 1979); (iii) that she have a vivid awareness of all relevant contingencies (Darwall 1983); (iv) that she deliberates faultlessly from her existing motivations (Williams 1979); (v) that she be practically rational (Korsgaard 1986)—a suggestion to which we shall return; and (vi) that she be ideally virtuous—a ‘phronimos’ (McDowell 1995).

Some views which count by our classification as Counterfactual forms of internalism are too weak to be interesting. For example, consider the thesis that if someone has a reason to do A, then it follows by necessity that were she to be motivated to do everything that she actually has a reason to do, she would be motivated to do A. This thesis is in some sense a variety of internalism—after all, it posits a necessary connection between reasons and a certain kind of counterfactual about motivation. But given the way that the counterfactual is specified, it is trivially true. Similar accusations can be and have been made about versions of this kind of thesis which invoke virtue, and perhaps also about those invoking rationality—depending on how rationality is to be understood. It should be noted that some philosophers (e.g. McDowell) who accept one or another of these weak theses are commonly considered to be ‘externalists’ by themselves or others, because of their rejection of any stronger, more interesting, internalist thesis.

Because it is uncontroversial that an agent can have reasons to do things that she is not actually motivated to do (particularly if she is unaware of those reasons), we will assume that interesting Motivation versions of internalism take Counterfactual forms. State versions of internalism, by contrast, can be interesting in both Counterfactual and Actual forms.

1.2 The Philosophical Significance of Reasons Internalism

The different versions of reasons internalism are philosophically interesting for a variety of reasons. But it is impossible to understand why these different theses have received so much attention as a group without appreciating one problem in particular that is encountered by some kinds of reasons internalism. We call this the Central Problem. We’ll first introduce this problem in its most familiar form for one famous version of reasons internalism; we then generalize.

1.2.1 The Humean Theory of Reasons

One of the historically most important versions of reasons internalism is an Actual State view according to which the actual states connected to reasons are desires. Due to its rough affinity to David Hume’s view of the dependence of morality on the passions, this view is often called the ‘Humean Theory of Reasons’, despite controversy over whether Hume himself held any such view.

The Humean Theory of Reasons (HTR): If there is a reason for someone to do something, then she must have some desire that would be served by her doing it.

Although both are often called ‘reasons internalism’, there are significant differences between HTR and Counterfactual Motivation versions of internalism. One can accept a Counterfactual Motivation view without accepting HTR (e.g. Korsgaard 1986), and one can accept HTR without accepting any (nontrivial) Counterfactual Motivation view (e.g. Schroeder 2007b). However, these two internalist theses are often linked. Consider the following popular view about motivation, which, following Smith (1987), we call the Humean Theory of Motivation (again despite controversy over whether Hume himself held it):

The Humean Theory of Motivation (HTM): Desires are necessary and beliefs are not sufficient for motivation.

If (as Counterfactual Motivation versions of internalism claim) an agent has no reason to do A if there is no possibility of her being motivated to do A, and if (as HTM claims) there is no possibility of an agent’s being motivated to do A if she has no desire that could motivate her to do A, then it seems to follow that an agent has no reason to do A if she has no desire that could motivate her to do A. This is the classical argument for HTR, which we will evaluate in section 2.1.1.

1.2.2 The Central Problem

The Humean Theory of Reasons, along with other Actual State versions of internalism, is philosophically important because of a Central Problem motivating much ethical theorizing since the 1940s, which derives from a tension between HTR, Moral Rationalism (see section 1.1), and Moral Absolutism:

Moral Absolutism: Some actions are morally wrong for any agent no matter what motivations and desires they have.

For example, presumably it was morally wrong for Hitler to order a program of genocide, even if it served some of his desires and wasn’t detrimental to any of them. (The characteristic of morality that Moral Absolutism expresses is sometimes described, following Immanuel Kant, as its consisting of ‘categorical’ rather than ‘hypothetical’ imperatives; see the entry on Kant’s moral philosophy.) If (as Moral Rationalism claims) an action (like ordering genocide) is morally wrong for an agent (like Hitler) only if there is a reason for him not to do it, and if (as HTR claims) there is a reason for him not to do it only if he has some desire that would be served by his not doing it, then it follows that whether an action is morally wrong for an agent depends upon what he or she desires. But that seems incompatible with Moral Absolutism. So it seems we must reject at least one of HTR, Moral Rationalism, and Moral Absolutism.

In response to this dilemma one could reject Moral Absolutism—either by embracing a form of moral relativism, according to which all moral duties vary according to agents’ contingent characteristics (e.g. Harman 1975), or by embracing a moral error theory, accepting that moral claims are systematically false because they presuppose the existence of external reasons while in actuality there are none (e.g. Mackie 1977; Joyce 2001). On this view, we might think that it was morally wrong for Hitler to order genocide, and hence that he had reasons not to do so, but we would be mistaken. Alternatively, one could reject Moral Rationalism and deny that the moral wrongness of an act entails that there is a reason not to do it (e.g. Foot 1972). On this view, it is possible that Hitler’s deeds were morally wrong yet he had no reason not to perform them. Many philosophers, however, prefer to preserve these commonsense theses about morality—and our ability to say that Hitler had reasons not to act as he did—by rejecting HTR, along with other Actual State versions of internalism. The tension among these views is a big part of what motivates philosophical interest in whether all reasons are related to motivation in the way that some internalist thesis claims.

1.2.3 Generalizing

Philosophers concerned with the Central Problem have mainly directed their criticisms at the Humean Theory of Reasons, but in fact any Actual State version of reasons internalism will lead to a structurally similar problem. Any Actual State version of reasons internalism says that to have a reason, an agent must have some corresponding actual motivational state. But this is precisely what makes reasons hostage to an agent’s actual psychology, creating the tension with Moral Rationalism and Moral Absolutism.

Does the Central Problem similarly arise for Counterfactual versions of reason internalism? The answer is: it depends upon the nature of the counterfactual condition a particular version of internalism requires. There is no such tension if this is a condition under which any agent would be motivated, no matter what motivations and desires she actually has. For example, Christine Korsgaard (1986) advocates a Counterfactual Motivation internalism, and Michael Smith (1994) advocates a Counterfactual State internalism, on which it is necessarily the case that any agent whatsoever would act in the same way as every other, if they satisfied those counterfactual conditions. Smith grounds his claim in optimism that no matter what desires they started with, if every agent was to resolve conflicts between their own desires under the condition of full information, they would converge on the same set of desires. Consequently, what an agent would desire under those conditions does not depend on what she is actually like. So what is wrong for an agent can depend on what she has a reason to do (as Moral Rationalism claims), without depending on what she is like (which would put it in tension with what Moral Absolutism claims). Smith calls his view an ‘Anti-Humean theory of reasons’ in order to contrast it with Counterfactual State theories which do give rise to the problem that confronts HTR.

On the other hand, many Counterfactual versions of reasons internalism do hold that whether their counterfactuals are true of some agent must be grounded in some actual feature of that agent. These views encounter the Central Problem, because they hold that what an agent has reason to do depends on whether some counterfactual is true of her, and that whether that counterfactual is true of her depends on what she is actually like. So, for example, Richard Joyce (2001) accepts Smith’s Anti-Humean theory of reasons, but rejects Smith’s claim that under conditions of full information and the resolution of conflicting desires all agents would converge on the same desires, on the grounds that the desires an agent would have at the end of this process depend upon the desires he started with. (Notice that all Counterfactual versions of internalism of this kind can be re-formulated as Actual State versions of internalism—where the actual state is being such that certain counterfactuals are true of you.)

1.3 Explanatory Direction

A final preliminary distinction between internalist views concerns their direction of explanation. As characterized thus far, the various internalist theses merely posit a necessary connection between the existence of reasons, on the one hand, and facts about motivation or motivational states, on the other, and do not distinguish between competing ways of explaining this necessary connection. Do we have reasons because we have (counterfactual or actual) motivation or desire, or do we have motivation or desire because we have reasons? (Or is there some third possibility?) The Humean Theory of Reasons is standardly understood to claim not only that we have reasons only if we have certain desires, but further that we have those reasons because we have those desires. We interpret it accordingly in the rest of this article.

HTR (revised): If there is a reason for someone to do something, then she must have some desire that would be served by her doing it, which is the source of her reason.

It is natural to understand any Actual State internalist view as claiming this direction of explanation. Since there surely can be normative reasons for an agent to act of which she is unaware, it is implausible that a consideration could be a reason for her to act only if she has an actual motivating state because of it.

Counterfactual Motivation views, however, can adopt either direction of explanation, and a variety of philosophers insist that the existence of reasons explains the relevant facts about motivation rather than vice versa. Consider the popular thesis that if there is a reason for someone to do something, then necessarily if she is fully rational she will be motivated to do it. The most trivial account of this kind suggests that ‘fully rational’ simply means motivated by all one’s reasons. If this is the truth in internalism, however, it places no constraints whatsoever on what can and cannot be an agent’s practical reason; for this reason it is often called an externalist thesis. But the explanatory priority of reasons over motivation can also yield a nontrivial version of internalism. Consider again the thesis appealing to a condition of full rationality. If by ‘rationality’ we mean a substantive psychological capacity involving particular desires or dispositions that enable us to respond to reasons, then we have a form of internalism that places substantive constraints on what can and cannot be a reason. For example, Christine Korsgaard (1986) advocates such a nontrivial version of internalism, taking the counterfactual about motivation under the condition of rationality to be explained by a substantive (non-trivial) account of practical rationality. According to Korsgaard, an agent is only rational if she is consistently motivated in accordance with some general principles that provide her conception of her practical identity. Given this account of rationality, the internalist thesis above tells us that only those considerations that would motivate such a principle-governed agent can be reasons for her to act.

2. Indirect, Theoretical Arguments

In evaluating whether any particular variety of internalism about reasons is true philosophers have brought many different kinds of resources to bear. In sections 2.1–2.3 we look at indirect, theoretical arguments which bear one way or another. Then in part 3 we consider more direct arguments, based on intuitive judgments about what reasons there are.

2.1 Motivational Arguments

A central consideration adduced in support of internalist theses is the conceptual link between reasons and explanation. In an influential early discussion of reasons for action, Donald Davidson (1963) observed that a common form of explanation of why an agent acted as she did involves citing the reasons she had to act that way. He argued that because actions are always to be explained in terms of psychological states, we can identify reasons for actions with the desire-belief pairs that cause them. Since Davidson’s concern was with what explains actual action, rather than with what justifies prospective action, his discussion might seem to concern motivating reasons rather than normative reasons. But Davidson took his reasons to “rationalize” or justify as well as to explain action, and many philosophers subsequently concluded that the two kinds of reasons had to be closely, conceptually, connected.

A common and plausible view is that to be an agent’s motivating reason for acting, a consideration has to be something which that agent takes to be a normative reason for acting (Dancy 2000; see Setiya 2007 for objections). At the very least, it seems that it must be possible for an agent to be motivated by her normative reasons (Nagel 1970). This possibility is in tension with the commonly drawn distinction between motivating reasons as psychological states and normative reasons as facts or propositions (Smith 1994), which places these types of reasons in different ontological categories.

This view, which understands motivating or explanatory reasons in terms of normative reasons, offers no obvious support to any version of internalism. It holds that if an agent has a motivating reason for acting, then she is motivated by something she takes to be a normative reason. But it does not follow from this (and is often denied by proponents of this view) that she has or thinks she has a normative reason only if she is relevantly motivated, as internalism requires. Views that rather understand normative reasons in terms of explanatory reasons, however, yield a distinct kind of argument for some form of internalism. Bernard Williams advances just this kind of argument in his classic but commonly misunderstood article ‘Internal and External Reasons’. We first (section 2.1.1) sketch the Classical Argument, attributed to Williams on the standard reading of his article, and then (section 2.1.2) sketch an alternative argument that Williams may have intended instead.

2.1.1 The Classical Argument

Williams claims that normative reasons have an ‘explanatory dimension’. On a standard reading what he means by this is that a consideration can be a normative reason for some agent only if it is possible (i.e. would under certain conditions be the case) that the agent be motivated to act for that reason, and for it thereby to be explanatory of his acting. This first premise of the classical argument is, of course, just a statement of some version of Counterfactual Motivation internalism. Here a Counterfactual Motivation form of internalism is assumed as a conceptual truth in order to argue for an Actual State internalism; any argument proceeding from such a premise naturally has no force for those externalists who deny even the Counterfactual Motivation internalist thesis. The second premise of the argument is HTM, the Humean Theory of Motivation. If the existence of reasons entails the possibility of motivation, and the possibility of motivation entails the existence of desire, then the existence of reasons entails the existence of desire—as the Humean Theory of Reasons maintains.

This argument, however, has many widely observed weaknesses. First, it depends on HTM, so it dismisses an idea that many philosophers have accepted; namely, that beliefs (either in general or of a specific kind, such as beliefs about reasons) can motivate action by themselves and independently of desire (e.g. Nagel 1970; Darwall 1983; Dancy 2000).

A second problem arises about how to understand the relevant sense of ‘possibility of motivation’, which links the two premises. To say that motivation is possible is equivalent to saying that under certain conditions it would be actual. To understand the relevant sense of possibility, we therefore need to identify the relevant conditions under which, according to the argument, there would be motivation. The problem is that the two premises seem to require for their plausibility different conditions, and therefore different senses of ‘possibility’. In the case of the first premise, connecting the existence of reasons with the possibility of motivation, the existence of reasons plausibly entails the ‘possibility’ of motivation in only a very weak sense: perhaps nothing stronger than that the agent would be motivated if he were rational, or perhaps virtuous. In the case of the second premise, linking the possibility of motivation with the existence of desire, a much stronger sense of ‘possibility’ is arguably needed: something like there being some conditions under which the agent with his actual psychological state would be motivated.

If we were to read the former, weaker sense of the possibility of motivation into this second premise, we get the claim that a rational, or perhaps virtuous, version of the agent would only be motivated to act in some way if the actual agent has some actual desire that could produce that motivation. This premise would be false if agents could be irrational or vicious precisely because they lack certain desires, a common view we discussed in section 1.3. Suppose we try instead to understand the first premise in terms of the stronger sense of possibility suggested for the second premise. This yields the claim that an agent can have a reason to act in some way only if there are some possible conditions under which he would be motivated to act in that way due to psychological attitudes that he actually has. Interpreted in this way the first premise begs the question against Williams’ externalist opponent, because it seems already to be a statement of an Actual State version of internalism.

It seems that there is no interpretation of ‘possibility of motivation’ for which it is plausible that both premises are true and avoid begging the question against externalism. The Classical Argument therefore seems to have either implausibly strong premises, a problematic inference, or both.

2.1.2 An Argument from Explanation

But Williams may not have intended to offer this argument. On a rival and unorthodox interpretation (Finlay 2009), Williams’ claim that practical reasons have an “explanatory dimension” is to be understood not simply as placing a constraint on what can be a reason, but as providing the essential meaning of our thoughts and claims about practical reasons. On this analysis the concept of a ‘reason for action’ just is the concept of an explanation of action, following Davidson. To think that the fact that the Alcove serves onion rings the size of doughnuts is a reason for Caroline to go there, is to think that the fact that the Alcove serves such onion rings is an explanation of Caroline’s going there.

As Williams observes, any view of this Davidsonian kind has to overcome an obvious problem. We can have reasons which do not motivate us to act (e.g. if we are unaware of them), and we can act in ways for which we lack any actual practical reasons (e.g. if we are mistaken about what our reasons are). Identifying an agent’s practical reasons, it seems, neither entails nor is entailed by giving an explanation of her actions. On this reading, Williams suggests that this problem arises simply due to agents’ error and ignorance, and he offers a way to fix the Davidsonian approach. To think that a fact is a reason for an agent to act is not to think it is an explanation of an action that she actually performs, but rather it is to think it an explanation of an action that she would have performed (or would have been somewhat motivated towards performing) if not for her error or ignorance. The concept of a practical reason must be the concept of an explanation of counterfactual (motivation towards) action: action under the condition of full and valid reasoning and exercise of imagination from a belief-set purged of error and ignorance (‘sound deliberation’). He claims that the idealization contained in this counterfactual condition is enough to make these reasons normative and not merely explanatory.

From this understanding of the concept of a practical reason, Williams (on this interpretation) believes he can prove that all ‘external reasons statements’ are false by considering the special case of first personal reasons beliefs: an agent’s beliefs about what considerations are reasons for himself. This argument requires a further assumption: that R is a reason for an agent to do A only if he could, through sound deliberation, come to recognize it as a reason for his doing A. This assumption seems reasonable given the conceptual premise, that the notion of a ‘reason for action’ is just some notion of an explanation of action. A ‘reason for an agent’ would then plausibly be an explanation for that agent, and it is plausible that what can be an explanation for an agent is restricted to what the agent is able to come to recognize as an explanation.

Williams is concerned with what the agent comes to believe when he comes to believe that some consideration R is a reason for him to do A. Granted the conceptual premise, an ‘internal reasons statement’ is a claim that some consideration is an explanation of why by virtue of the contents of the agent’s actual ‘motivational set’ he would be motivated to do A under the conditions of sound deliberation, while an ‘external reasons statement’ is a claim that some consideration is an explanation of why independently of the contents of the agent’s actual motivational set he would be motivated to do A under those conditions.

While Williams is commonly interpreted as challenging the possibility of an agent being motivated to do A by the belief that he has an external reason R to do A, on this reading he explicitly accepts that such motivation is possible; a disposition to be motivated by the belief that you have an external reason could be an element of your motivational set, making the fact that you have an external reason itself an internal reason for you to act. (It is an advantage of this interpretation that this is what Williams actually says.)

Unfortunately, the fact that an agent’s belief that R is an external reason to do A can motivate her to do A does not suffice to show that R is a reason to do A. It only shows that the fact that R is a reason to do A is a reason to do A. That is because it does not show that R can explain the agent’s motivation to herself; it only shows that the fact that R is a reason for her to do A can explain her motivation to herself. So what Williams wants to know is, how could it be true that R is a reason to do A? If it were true, realizing that it was could motivate—but what could make it true?

According to this reading, the problem Williams sees for external reasons is the following. For there genuinely to be external reasons, he observes, it must be possible that some such external reasons beliefs are true. This requires that the consideration R which an agent accepts as his reason must actually be a genuine explanation of his acting under the condition of sound deliberation, independently of any facts about his motivational set. But this condition cannot be met, because nothing could be explanatory of an agent’s action independently of the contents of his motivational set: his desires and dispositions. From this it follows (given the conceptual premise) that no motivationally ‘external’ considerations could genuinely be practical reasons for an agent.

Hence, while many writers have come to the defense of external reasons by appealing to a disposition to be motivated by beliefs about reasons, if this interpretation is correct then Williams’ argument is directly aimed against this kind of solution. A disposition of this kind could explain why a consideration R could motivate an agent once he believed that it was a reason to act, but it could not make it the case that R itself was a genuine explanation of his acting, and therefore a reason for him to act. To use Williams’ own example, if Owen Wingrave comes to believe that the fact that military service is a family tradition is a reason for him to enlist, that belief may indeed motivate him to enlist, and explain his doing so. But if he has no desires or dispositions that would cause the belief that military service is a family tradition itself to motivate him to enlist, then the fact that military service is a family tradition cannot itself be a genuine explanation of his enlisting, and therefore his belief that it is a reason for him to enlist is false.

Although Williams’ article is commonly seen as the classic defense of HTR, on this reading it only restricts agents’ reasons to their dispositions to be motivated, and not more narrowly to their actual desires. This is because dispositions are sufficient, and actual desires not necessary, in order to explain why somebody would be motivated under counterfactual conditions. This argument is therefore stronger than the Classical Argument because of its independence from HTM, which controversially claims that motivation requires desire. But the view supported by this argument is not a weak, Counterfactual Motivation version of internalism; rather it is a more general kind of Actual State view, claiming a connection between reasons and all psychological states relevant to the explanation of action. Indeed, Williams’ skepticism about ‘external reasons’ would then be directed not against those who reject Counterfactual Motivation accounts—he just assumes that his opponent agrees with him that reasons must be able to motivate—but against many philosophers who have championed some Counterfactual Motivation version of internalism, like Nagel (1970) and Darwall (1983). These philosophers argue that the order of explanation runs in the other direction: that the possibility of being motivated to do A can be explained by the existence of a reason to do A, while Williams’ view is that the existence of a reason to do A must be explained by the possibility of being motivated to do A.

The weakest point in this version of Williams’ argument is probably its fundamental, conceptual premise: that the concept of a practical reason is the concept of an explanation of action under certain conditions. Even if we grant the controversial claim that the concept of a practical reason is the concept of an explanation we can still resist this analysis. Suppose, for example, that the concept of a reason to do A is the concept of an explanation of why to do A, or of why doing A is a good thing to do. To say that R was the reason for which the agent did A would then be to say that R was the explanation of why to do A which motivated the agent to do A. This rival account respects the conceptual relation between ‘reason’ and ‘explanation’ on which Williams and Davidson insist, but doesn’t analyze practical reasons as any kind of explanation of action. If this is what our concept of practical reasons is, then a different argument will be needed if we are to rule out the possibility of external reasons.

2.1.3 Other Motivational Arguments

A different kind of argument specifically for the Humean Theory of Reasons tries to reason from some kind of Counterfactual Motivation internalism by raising questions about the concepts of action and motivation in play (Finlay 2007). Necessarily, a rational agent is motivated by recognition of her reasons. But this motivated behavior is not merely caused by her reasons; it is a voluntary response to them. A rational agent responds voluntarily to her reasons.

A connection is then forged between voluntary behavior and desire. Arguably, a behavior is only voluntary if it is caused by being aimed at. On one theory of desire, aiming at p entails desiring something (either p itself, or something to which p is taken to be a means). It follows that a rational agent’s recognition of a reason entails the presence of a relevant desire. This does not yet rule out externalism, which is compatible with this result if any of a number of different claims are true. The internalist can try to close off these escapes, however. (i) One possible externalist solution is that being rational involves having certain desires; the internalist can argue in response that rationality is rather a procedural virtue which doesn’t necessarily involve having any particular desires. (ii) Another solution is to suggest that a rational agent’s ability to recognize reasons is limited by her desires; the internalist can plausibly respond that being (ideally) rational is, by definition, to be able to recognize all one’s reasons. (iii) Perhaps most promisingly, an externalist can suggest that a rational agent can respond voluntarily to her reasons by virtue of their causing her to have a new desire (Darwall 1983). The internalist may counter by arguing that because we cannot desire at will, the causation of such a desire would be a nonvoluntary response to the recognition of a reason, and therefore any behavior motivated by that desire—even if voluntary—would not qualify as a voluntary response to the reason.

This line of argument has not yet received much attention; opponents may reasonably question whether motivation by reasons must always be voluntary (this seems implausible in the case of theoretical reasons, or reasons for belief, for example—see section 2.2 below for this analogy), and also whether voluntary behavior must be caused by desire. For yet a different promising argument for internalism on the basis of the connection between reasons and motivational capacities, see section 4 of (Markovits 2011).

2.2 The Analogy to Theoretical Reason

Externalists often appeal to the parallels between practical reasons (reasons for action) and epistemic or theoretical reasons (or reasons for belief) to make their case against certain forms of internalism, particularly the Humean Theory of Reasons (Millgram 1996). They seem to be different species of the same genus: while practical reasons are facts that support or justify certain actions, theoretical reasons are facts that support or justify certain beliefs. Both sorts of reasons are subsumable under the class of normative reasons, or facts that support certain behaviors.

But externalists object that it is implausible that reasons for belief entail or depend upon facts about desire or motivation. Rational belief is responsive only to evidence, and beliefs formed on the basis of desires (like a husband’s wishful belief—in the face of all the evidence—that his wife is not cheating on him) are irrational. So not all normative reasons are internal reasons. Internalism about practical reasons might therefore seem arbitrary and unmotivated. Once we’ve allowed external reasons that count in favor of believing certain things, why not allow external reasons that count in favor of doing certain things? Elijah Millgram (1996) suggests that just as new experiences can reveal to us hitherto unknown reasons for belief, so too new experiences (involving unexpected pleasures) can reveal to us reasons for action independent of our antecedent desires and dispositions.

Internalists have two options here. They can deny that genuine reasons for belief can be external, extending their internalism to theoretical reasons, or they can seek to motivate differential treatment of the practical and the theoretical cases. To pursue the former course, internalists might argue that we ascribe reasons for belief on the assumption of a desire for knowledge or truth (see Kelly 2003 for discussion). They can further argue that a person is simply not in the business of forming beliefs if he does not have something resembling a desire for truth (Velleman 2000). Alternatively, internalists might argue that we ascribe reasons for belief on the assumption that whatever the contents of a person’s desire-set, it will include some item that would be served by believing that for which there is evidence.

The second strategy would involve identifying a relevant difference between practical and theoretical reasons to explain why internalism is true of reasons for action, but not of reasons for belief. For example, Markovits (2011) argues that the practical case is different because there is no analogue to the plausible case of foundational beliefs in the epistemic case. A different strategy might focus on differences in the nature or aims of action and belief. Suppose for example that while believing by its nature aims at tracking the truth, acting by its nature aims at satisfying some desire of the agent. We could then reasonably maintain that practical but not theoretical reasons can only be internal.

2.3 Arguments from Reactive Attitudes

An important part of the debate about internal and external reasons has centered on ‘reactive attitudes’, or attitudes that we have towards agents in response to their behavior, of which blame is the paradigm. Some have observed in defense of Moral Rationalism, for example, that if an agent does something we consider morally wrong, then we blame (or resent) her. But blame, these philosophers claim, involves the judgment that the agent had reasons not to do what he did. Consequently blame is unwarranted when such judgments are unwarranted (Nagel 1970, Smith 1994). Therefore, since moral wrongdoing is sufficient to warrant blame, moral obligations must entail reasons. Furthermore, Moral Absolutism tells us that the moral wrongness of certain actions is independent of agents’ desires and dispositions. Since wrongness entails the appropriateness of blame, which in turn entails existence of reasons, we can conclude that there must be reasons that are independent of agents’ desires and dispositions: i.e. external reasons.

A difficulty for this argument comes from the fact that outside of morality we do not, in general, blame or resent people for failing to comply with their practical reasons. If an agent does something foolish or imprudent, for example, we might react with pity or scorn, but not with anything as strong as blame. It seems that the appropriateness of blame requires some condition other than noncompliance with reasons. This does not show that noncompliance with reasons is not one of the necessary conditions for blame, of course, but it opens the possibility that once we identify the further necessary conditions we might find that they are also, by themselves, sufficient conditions for appropriate blame. The internalist might suggest, for example, that the missing condition is partly that the judge have desires or concerns that are harmed by the resented behavior. Proponents of the argument from blame may respond that it is inappropriate to blame harmful non-agents (like trees and tigers) and agents whose harms are unintentional. However it may be possible to excuse these from blame without accepting that noncompliance with reasons is a necessary condition for blameworthiness; for example, with the weaker condition that a blameworthy act stems from having a character from which certain concerns or motivations are absent (Arpaly 2003). Trees and tigers don’t have a ‘character’ in the relevant sense, and harms that an agent causes unintentionally do not stem from her character. If something like this is a sufficient condition for blameworthiness, then this argument from reactive attitudes fails.

Bernard Williams does not resist the claim that the appropriateness of blame entails reasons, however, and offers a way of explaining the appropriateness of blame when an agent appears to have no relevant internal reasons to act otherwise than she did. Blaming in these cases functions as a ‘proleptic mechanism’: it itself changes the situation for the agent so that she now has an internal reason that she otherwise would have lacked (1989). This is a reason she has in virtue of something like ‘a disposition to have the respect of other people’. By blaming or being disposed to blame an agent for unethical behavior, we give her a reason to act ethically. Note that this account understands the appropriateness of blame as at least partly instrumental. Blaming is appropriate if it has some motivational grip on the agent. This view is resisted by many who see the question of the appropriateness of a reactive attitude as primarily an issue of desert. Arguably, blame is appropriate only if it is deserved, and not if it is merely effective in influencing people’s behavior.

It is also possible to appeal to reactive attitudes in arguing against external reasons. Williams argues that externalism cannot accommodate the obscurity and indeterminacy in the practice of blame: that is, the pattern predicted by his internalist account that blame sometimes responds to reasons and at other times tries to create them, and that its appropriateness turns on whether the agent can be influenced psychologically in either of these ways.

Russ Shafer-Landau finds in Williams’ article the suggestion of a further argument, turning on the fairness constraint on appropriate blame (2003: 181–2). Blame is only appropriate if it is fair, and it is only fair to blame someone for their behavior if they had the capacity to act otherwise than they did. But an agent’s capacity to act is limited by her desires and dispositions, and therefore blame is only appropriate if an agent’s desires and dispositions gave her the capacity to act otherwise. This is a challenge for externalism because of the suggested connection between blame and reasons we discussed above: an agent is blameworthy for her action only if in so acting she failed to obey her reasons.[1] It follows that an agent’s reasons must be limited by her desires and dispositions; some form of internalism is true.

This argument can succeed only if supported by a plausible version of the ‘ought implies can’ principle. But in basing an agent’s capacity to act on her desires and dispositions, the version of the principle that the argument seems to presuppose treats ‘ought’, or the fairness of blame, as depending on the psychological capacity to act rather than on the mere physical capacity to act. Externalists would reject as implausible the psychological version of the principle, and therefore to assume it for purposes of an internalist argument would be question-begging against the externalist.

2.4 The Conditional Fallacy

(Nontrivial) Counterfactual Motivation versions of internalism are sometimes accused of committing a ‘conditional fallacy’ (named by Shope (1978)). To commit this ‘fallacy’ is to claim that it is necessary for an agent’s having a reason to do A that he would be motivated under certain conditions to do A, when there are some reasons that the agent can have only if precisely those conditions do not obtain. For example, some versions of internalism appeal to counterfactuals involving full rationality, but sometimes agents have certain reasons precisely because they are not fully rational. Smith (1994) offers the case, due to Gary Watson, of a defeated squash player who, because he is prone to irrational anger that could cause him to smash his opponent’s face with his racquet, has a reason not to cross the court to shake the winner’s hand. When the conditions specified by the relevant internalist thesis do obtain, the reason is then not present to motivate the agent, falsifying the counterfactual. For example, were Watson’s squash player to be fully rational, then it would no longer be true that if he crossed the court he might hit his opponent, and therefore he wouldn’t be motivated accordingly not to cross the court. The relevant internalist thesis then yields the false result that the irrational squash player has no reason not to cross the court.

In defense of his own internalist thesis, involving counterfactual motivation under the condition of sound deliberation from full information, Williams (1995) raises an objection of this kind against McDowell’s rival claim involving the condition of full virtue. He observes that being less than fully virtuous gives agents reasons to act that they otherwise wouldn’t have had and that therefore would not motivate a fully virtuous agent. Others object to Williams’ own counterfactuals involving sound deliberation that there are reasons that agents have precisely because they are not capable of deliberating soundly, which his version of internalism therefore fails to accommodate.

It is plausible that objections of this kind will be effective against any nontrivial Counterfactual Motivation version of internalism. This problem has prompted some to switch from a Counterfactual Motivation model to a Counterfactual State model, and others to be more careful about specifying just what state they have in mind. The idea is that an agent S has a reason to do A only if, were she in certain counterfactual circumstances, she would desire S in her actual circumstances to do A (Smith 1994). Michael Smith calls this the advice model (in contrast to the example model), and it plausibly avoids the problems connected with the ‘conditional fallacy’ because it builds in sensitivity to the relevant conditions in the actual cases that generate the reasons. For example, if a fully rational version of Watson’s squash player were to contemplate the situation of his actual, less than fully-rational self, he would be aware of his actual self’s disposition to irrational anger, and would therefore want his actual self not to cross the court to shake the winner’s hand. The advice model may therefore yield the correct result that the actual player has a reason not cross the court. However, as Bedke (2010) emphasizes, this leaves an important puzzle about why each agent’s counterfactual, more fully rational self, would have desires about what her actual self does.

3. Direct, Extensional Arguments

Fortunately we do not ordinarily need to turn to a metaethical theory to tell us what reasons we have. People have a robust set of intuitions about what is and what is not a reason for a given agent to perform a given action. All nontrivial versions of reasons internalism and externalism have substantive implications concerning the extension of agents’ reasons, and for the most part theory here is answerable to common sense and aims at accommodating it. Some of the most significant and compelling arguments for and against versions of internalism are therefore extensional, that is to say, based on what reasons agents actually have. An internalist account’s predictions about what is and what is not a reason for a particular agent can be tested against our prior judgments about what reasons there are.

3.1 For Externalism

3.1.1 Undergeneration Arguments

We have already encountered one of the most powerful sources of extensional opposition to nontrivial versions of reasons internalism in the form of the Central Problem. The Central Problem is that it seems that some actions are wrong for everyone no matter what they are like, and that their wrongness for someone requires that that person have a reason not to do them. But many kinds of internalism—in particular Actual State views—say that an agent has a reason only if she satisfies a certain condition, and hence that her reason depends on what she is like. We can even frame the Central Problem by divorcing it from Moral Rationalism and Moral Absolutism, and simply insisting that for at least some actions (perhaps paradigmatic wrong actions among them), there is a reason for anyone not to do those actions, no matter what she is like. This leads to a direct argument against many forms of internalism: that they undergenerate reasons, by providing negative verdicts in cases in which intuitively there really are reasons.

Because this sort of argument has not always gotten a grip on those skeptical about the objective authority of morality, one important development since the 1970s is the observation that a similar sort of problem arises for prudential reasons (e.g. Nagel 1970). If I am going to travel to Israel in six months’ time and will regret not knowing any Hebrew once I get there, then I have a reason to study Hebrew now, even if I don’t now care about my future regrets or about whether I will know Hebrew while I am in Israel. Yet internalist theses place constraints on what I now have a reason to do, on the basis of what my actual psychology is like now, or on the basis of what counterfactuals are true of me now. So they appear to have a problem in getting these intuitive judgments about reasons right. This argument is thought to produce extra dialectical leverage, because these intuitions about prudential reasons are thought to be harder to give up than corresponding intuitions about moral reasons.

3.1.2 Defenses Against Undergeneration Arguments

Two lines of response are open to the internalist here. One, proposed by Mark Schroeder (2007b) in defense of the Humean Theory of Reasons, denies that internalism is genuinely incompatible with the inescapability of some moral or prudential reasons. If there are some actions that would serve any possible desire (or, on an alternative internalist account, that any agent would be motivated towards under the relevant counterfactual conditions), then the internalist can accommodate reasons that any agent has no matter what they are like: such reasons are massively overdetermined. In this way the internalist can seek to reconcile Moral Rationalism with Moral Absolutism (see section 1.2). The idea is that even if internalism is true, it might still be the case that we all have reasons to avoid moral wrongdoing, no matter what we are like—because reasons to avoid moral wrongdoing are generated from any set of desires or dispositions. While this solution is formally available, it remains to be seen whether it can plausibly generate the robust set of moral and prudential reasons posited by ordinary intuitions, and it appears reasonable to be pessimistic on this count; plausibly there are actual or possible sets of desires and dispositions that would not support any reasons to avoid breaking promises made to those powerless to retaliate, or to confess to one’s crime for which somebody else has already been convicted, for example.

Generally, however, internalists bite the bullet and reject the data of these ‘intuitions’. They might simply challenge whether those intuitions really exist or, more audaciously, maintain that they are all false. It is not denied that speakers ascribe external reasons to agents, and so internalists are compelled to offer diagnoses of this practice. The bluntest is to adopt an error theory, and suggest that these practices manifest a mistaken understanding of the kinds of reasons that there are. This forces a confrontation between internalism and ordinary practice; most internalists dislike the odds in this matchup and seek to explain away the evidence.

A provocative diagnosis of external reasons claims is as a bluff or a rhetorical device designed to influence the behavior and attitudes of others (Williams 1979). On this view external reasons claims are all false but stem from an attempt to apply nonrational persuasion on others rather than from error; recently some philosophers have argued that we either do (Kalderon 2005) or should (Joyce 2001) use moral claims as convenient fictions for this purpose. In later work (1989), Williams proposes, more temperately, that they may be ‘optimistic internal reasons claims’: likely false statements made in the hope that they may become true through the intended audience’s contemplation of them.

A more conciliatory strategy is to claim ambiguity in the notion of a ‘reason’. In one sense there are external reasons; we might call them ‘institutional’ or ‘pseudo’-reasons (Mackie 1977; Joyce 2001). But the spirit of internalism is preserved in the claim that these are not genuine practical reasons, about which an internalist thesis is correct. Recognizing the legitimacy of ascribing these other kinds of reasons may suggest softening the distinction between internal and external reasons even further; it has been proposed that what counts as a ‘genuine reason’ is determined by the concerns characterizing the context of discourse (Finlay 2006). So, for example, we may appropriately judge that the pain a certain action would cause is a reason for a sadist not to perform the action, because the salient concern in the context is our compassion for others. This view would prompt us to abandon existence internalism about practical ‘reasons’ (reasons claims are made relative to the concerns salient in the conversation, and not necessarily to the motivations of the agent). On this view of reasons, however, an agent can have reasons that count as genuine in a given context, but that he can ignore without irrationality. Such a view can preserve the spirit of internalism by claiming that the rational force of these reasons for any agent depends upon his desires or motivations.

These strategies aim to reconcile internalism, as much as possible, with the apparently externalist tendencies in ordinary practices of ascribing reasons. Externalists claim they are unsuccessful; ordinary practice is committed to genuine (and genuinely authoritative) external reasons, and rightly so. But internalists remain optimistic. The issue is very much unresolved.

3.1.3 Overgeneration Arguments

The literature is also full of extensional arguments against theories which resemble internalism, but on the grounds that they overgenerate, rather than undergenerate, reasons. Many famous and colorful examples—about people who want to eat saucers of mud, or count blades of grass, or who have a disposition to turn on radios—are offered to show that not every desire or motivation is of the right kind to generate practical reasons (Anscombe 1959, Quinn 1993). Strictly speaking, however, such cases only create objections to views which postulate a sufficient condition for the existence of reasons, and internalism itself postulates only necessary conditions, and no such sufficient condition, as Bernard Williams makes clear (1989), for example.

There may, of course, be philosophical reasons why many theorists who accept some version of internalism as a necessary condition on reasons are also inclined to accept a sufficient condition of this kind, and we will consider one such philosophical reason in the next section. So these may end up being good indirect arguments against internalism. But no sufficient condition is part of internalism by itself, so there are no direct overgeneration arguments against internalism.

3.2 For Internalism

3.2.1 The Significance of Apparent Internal Reasons

So far we have considered extensional arguments against internalism. But there are also extensional arguments in favor of internalist theses. Setting aside peculiarly moral reasons, common sense suggests that ordinary practical reasons exhibit a high degree of agent-relativity. It is also natural to think that in at least many cases, different agents have different reasons because they want different things. If A desires chocolate ice cream, and B desires strawberry ice cream, then intuitively A has a reason to purchase the chocolate, and B has a reason to purchase the strawberry. Many have thought that the Humean Theory of Reasons is more than suggested by this sort of extensional data.

The idea behind this reasoning is that if we have to agree that some reasons depend on desires, then we should give serious consideration to the theory according to which all reasons do, as being simpler and more explanatory than the theory according to which some reasons derive from our desires but others do not. This may even provide a promising analytical hypothesis about what claims about reasons mean, or reductive hypothesis about what reasons are. This kind of argument is anticipated by Williams’ claim that the issue is whether there are both internal and external reasons, or internal reasons only (1979; see also Schroeder 2007b). We now discuss three kinds of externalist objection to this argument.

3.2.2 Three Objections

One line of objection holds that no reasons derive from our desires. It seems plausible that they do only because desire is closely connected to something else, which often is a source of reasons: something like pleasure or enjoyment (Bond 1983, Millgram 1997, Scanlon 1998). Reasons that seem to derive from desires can arguably be more plausibly explained by pleasure, which can also serve to explain reasons that desire cannot explain: reasons deriving from pleasures that the agent does not actually desire. It may therefore be a better and more explanatory hypothesis that something like pleasure grounds our agent-relative reasons. However proponents of this kind of objection often take hedonic states like pleasure to be merely one instance of something possessing intrinsic value, and offer as rivals to HTR theories of reasons as based on intrinsic value (see the entry on intrinsic vs. extrinsic value).

In response, Humeans can observe that in ordinary cases agents want pleasure, and that thereby HTR can accommodate such reasons. This line of objection needs a case in which an agent has a reason to do not just something that she does not already desire to do, but something that would not serve any desire whatsoever that she already has. Since any given action may serve many different possible desires, and agents who do not desire (e.g.) pleasure are rare and peculiar, it is difficult to control for these kinds of factors. Externalists can claim that an agent would have a reason to do what is pleasurable even in the absence of any such general desire, but this is something that an internalist may be able to deny without absurdity—although here intuitions seem to differ radically.

A related objection consists in the complaint that agents can have desires that clearly do not generate any practical reasons because they are for worthless objects. Prominent examples in the literature include a desire to drink a saucer of mud or a can of paint, and a disposition to turn on radios whenever they are off. As noted in section 3.1.3, these examples can’t provide direct counterexamples to any sort of reasons internalism, because reasons internalism itself places only a necessary condition on reasons and not a sufficient condition, and these examples are proposed counterexamples to a sufficient condition. But they are highly relevant to the theoretical argument for internalism that is our concern in this section. If we advance as our case for internalism the explanatory power of the thesis that reasons depend on desire or motivation, then it is a significant problem if this relation isn’t consistent and desire or motivation don’t always generate reasons. Some explanation of this inconsistency is needed, and when we find it we may find that it reveals that something other than desire or motivation is the genuine source of our reasons.

These cases are taken to show that desires are only connected with reasons if they are also connected with something else, for example intrinsic value, and they do not yield reasons otherwise. Against this the internalist can again challenge intuitions and defend the consistency of the connection, by insisting (e.g.) that a desire to drink a saucer of mud is sufficient for having a reason to do so. Such a reason need not be a good or strong one, after all, and the peculiarity of claiming that there is such a reason may be explained away as being merely pragmatic. In cases in which the reasons for an action are dwarfed by the considerations against it, it is usual to report that there is no reason for the action at all; ‘there is a reason to do A’ typically communicates that there is a relatively weighty reason to do A. Whether or not agents have desire-based reasons in these circumstances remains a contested issue.

A different version of this same sort of objection works by granting a special connection between reasons and desire but suggesting that this exists because desires involve judgments or perceptions that something is a reason (e.g. Anscombe 1963, Stampe 1987, Quinn 1993, Millgram 1997, Scanlon 1998). Scanlon labels these ‘desires in the directed-attention sense’; on this view, (apparent) reasons are explanatory of desires, and not the reverse. This hypothesis would explain why agents tend to have relevant desires whenever they believe themselves to have reasons, but it does not seem well-placed to explain why agents would have these desires whenever they actually have reasons. If we are disposed to ascribe reasons to others in correspondence with their desires, the Humean hypothesis is better.

A third kind of objection (Hampton 1998) insists that though it is true that some reasons derive from our desires, this is only because of more fundamental reasons which themselves do not derive from our desires. Proponents of this view hold that there is a fundamental reason to do what you desire and that changes in what you desire simply affect what you need to do in order to go about doing so. This view admits that our desires can sometimes affect our reasons but insists that they only do so because there is a further reason, which does not depend on any desire. Philosophers who accept this view are unmoved by the argument that Actual State forms of reason internalism can provide a more unified explanation of reasons. They don’t deny the existence of ‘internal’ reasons (which do derive from desires), but do hold that internal reasons are simply derivative from and hence are explained by a special case of external reasons (which do not derive from or depend on desires at all). A similar dialectic goes for Actual State views which appeal to a more general kind of state than ‘desire’.

3.3 Relative Explanatory Power

Any evaluation of whether Actual State reasons internalism is simpler, more elegant, or explanatorily more powerful than any possible externalist view will have to turn on an evaluation of this kind of externalist explanatory strategy. If internal reasons could be simply derivative from external reasons, and external reasons could be independently explained, then Actual State reasons internalism will have very little traction on these grounds. If the derivation of internal reasons from external reasons turns out to be unsuccessful, however, or external reasons themselves are difficult to explain, then Actual State reasons internalism will gain traction as an explanatory hypothesis. Schroeder (2007b) attacks the derivation of internal reasons from external reasons; here we can go on to consider whether external reasons are themselves harder to explain than internal ones.

Many philosophers have held that external reasons are, in fact, harder to explain than internal ones; even some who were no skeptics about external reasons, like Immanuel Kant (see the entry on Kant’s moral philosophy.) So what makes external reasons so puzzling? One idea is that they are puzzling because they leave so little on the basis of which to explain why they are reasons for the people for whom they are reasons. Internal reasons are shared only by certain people—people with the requisite desires. So Max’s desires can be used to explain why he has the internal reasons that he has. But categorical external reasons like those Kant was concerned about (and which are required in order to reconcile Moral Rationalism with Moral Absolutism) are supposed to be reasons for any agent, no matter what she is like. So the only thing to which we can appeal in order to explain why Max has these reasons is the fact that Max is an agent. Some philosophers have accordingly invested great energy in developing robust enough accounts of agency to be able to explain moral reasons. For example, Christine Korsgaard (1996) maintains that reasons derive from the demands of autonomy, or being regulated by stable principles that define ones’ self, which she identifies as a necessary condition for acting at all.

However, even accounts that derive reasons from the nature of agency may ultimately vindicate some form of internalism. David Velleman (1996), for example, argues that agency is characterized by a particular higher-order inclination—to ‘behave in, and out of, a knowledge of what you’re doing.’ Although this is a kind of desire, it is distinct from the contingent desires that might be satisfied by particular actions and which internalists usually identify as the source of our reasons. Velleman accordingly describes his view as a ‘fainthearted externalism’, but it remains a form of internalism according to the scheme presented here.

Some advocates of various forms of internalism have complained that advocacy of external reasons amounts to nothing more than ‘bluff’ (Williams 1979). A natural way to understand this idea is as the complaint that external reasons theorists leave us with too few constraints on what reasons could be, and hence are able to make whatever claims about reasons they want (so long as they endorse them in a serious enough tone of voice, perhaps), with no independent way of checking their plausibility. This complaint could be a fair one against externalists who are willing to offer no general theory about or constraints on reasons, but it is unfair in general. Externalists may simply look for discipline and unity in their views about reasons from a source distinct from facts about motivation or motivational psychology. Value-based theorists, for example, tie their claims about reasons to commitments about what is valuable. So their claims about what we have reasons to do are checked by the plausibility of the corresponding theses about what is valuable.

4. The Debate Today

The debate over internal and external reasons is very much alive today, open on nearly all of the fronts that we have considered in this article. Or more accurately, we should say that the debates over internal and external reasons are very much alive today. As we saw, there are important differences between State and Motivation forms of internalism, between Counterfactual and Actual forms of internalism, and between versions that give rise to the Central Problem and those that do not. There are also important further differences in precisely how to formulate any given version of reasons internalism, and we have not precisely formulated any single version in this article.

What is clear is that there are two main varieties of internalist view, each of which faces its own class of problems. Most internalist views encounter the Central Problem, and hence have difficulty in allowing for some of the important reasons that we pre-theoretically are inclined to think that there are. Though other arguments have been offered against them, this challenge is at the heart of their difficulties. We saw that some Counterfactual versions of internalism avoid the Central Problem, by claiming that the relevant counterfactuals are not grounded in any features of agents’ actual psychologies, but rather are explained in some other way. The challenge facing these views is to provide such an explanation without collapsing into triviality, as with the view that the relevant counterfactual condition is ‘that the agent is motivated by all of her reasons’.

Externalist views, on the other hand, avoid the Central Problem and hence do well with moral reasons, but critics worry that external reasons are more mysterious, and that such theories cannot provide as attractive an explanation of why some reasons do appear to be internal. An attractive way forward may have to show entrenched parties how to achieve some of the important advantages of each side of the debate.


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Other Important Works

  • Anomaly, J., 2007. “An Argument Against External Reasons,” Sorites, 18: 56–9.
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