First published Fri Feb 7, 2003; substantive revision Thu Jun 22, 2017

Until fairly recently secession has been a neglected topic among philosophers. Two factors may explain why philosophers have now begun to turn their attention to secession. First, in the past two decades there has been a great increase not only in the number of attempted secessions, but also in successful secessions, and philosophers may simply be reacting to this new reality, attempting to make normative sense of it. The reasons for the frequency of attempts to secede are complex, but there are two recent developments that make the prospect of state-breaking more promising: improvement in national security and liberalization of trade. As the fear of forcible annexation diminishes and trade barriers fall, smaller states become feasible, and independent statehood looks more feasible for regions within states. Second, in roughly the same time period, the idea that there is a strong case for some form of self-government for groups presently contained within states has gained ground. Once one begins to take seriously the case for special group rights for minorities—especially if these include rights of self-government—it is difficult to avoid the question of whether some such groups may be entitled to full independence.

1. Philosophical Issues of Secession

Political scientists, sociologists, and political economists attempt to describe and explain the causes and effects of secessionist movements and of states’ reactions to them. Philosophers focus on the moral issues and on clarifying the conceptual framework for thinking about secession. Philosophical work on secession can be divided into three categories: (1) attempts to articulate the conditions under which a group has the moral right to secede; (2) examinations of the compatibility or incompatibility of secession with constitutionalism, (3) attempts to determine what position international law should take regarding secession. Thus far, philosophical theories of secession have not been integrated with two areas of normative theorizing that are directly relevant to them. The first is just war theory. This is surprising, since part of what motivates systematic thinking about secession is a realization that attempts to secede often involve or provoke large-scale violence. The second is theories of territorial justice. This, too, is surprising, because ideally a theory of secession would be situated within a broader normative theory of a range of claims to territory, including, but not limited to claims to sovereign jurisdiction of the sort now associated with statehood.

It is useful to distinguish secession from other ways in which “separation” or “state-breaking” can occur. In what might be called secession in the classic sense, a group in a portion of the territory of a state attempt to create a new state there; secessionists attempt to exit, leaving behind the original state in reduced form. Second, there is irredentist secession, wherein the attempt is not to create a new state, but to merge the seceding territory with a neighboring state. This typically occurs when the majority in the seceding area are of the same ethno-national as that which is predominant in the neighboring state. A third case, exemplified by the dissolution of Czechoslovakia, occurs when there is agreement between the populations or at least the leaders of two regions (which together comprise the whole territory of the state), to split the state into two new states. A fourth case is that of externally-imposed partition of an existing state into two or more new states. In the past partition usually occurred when a deal was struck between two powerful neighboring states at the expense of the state that was partitioned, as with the partitioning of Poland between Nazi Germany and the Soviet Union. At present, externally-imposed partition is more likely to be considered as a last resort for dealing with intractable ethno-national conflict within a state. In what follows, the focus is on secession in the classical sense, but with some attention also to irredentist secession.

1.1 The distinction between a (mere) justification and having a claim-right

Though many who pursue the first project do not make this explicit, they are concerned with the moral justification of unilateral secession or the moral right to secede unilaterally, that is with secession that is undertaken without the consent of the state and without constitutional sanction. A theory of the right to unilateral secession is most urgently needed, not only because unilateral secession occurs more frequently than consensual secession, but also because it is both more controversial and more likely to result in large-scale violence.

Consensual secession is secession that results either from a negotiated agreement between the state and the secessionists (as occurred when Norway seceded from Sweden in 1905) or through constitutional processes (as the Supreme Court of Canada recently envisioned for the secession of Quebec).[1] Constitutionally sanctioned secession is achieved either by the exercise of an explicit constitutional right to secede (which only a few constitutions currently contain) or by constitutional amendment.

Sometimes it is not clear whether a theorist is advancing a theory of the conditions under which secession is morally justified, that is, the conditions under which a group has a moral liberty-right or mere moral permission to secede, or a theory of the conditions under which a group has the claim-right to secede. Talk about “the right to secede” is ambiguous between these alternatives. A claim-right includes not only a liberty-right or mere permission (i.e., that a group is justified in seceding in the sense that if they do so they do not thereby act impermissibly), but also a correlative obligation on the part of others not to interfere with the attempted secession.

The distinction between establishing that a group is morally justified in (unilaterally) seceding (in the sense of having a liberty-right) and establishing that the group has a moral claim-right to secede (unilaterally) is crucial, though rarely explicitly drawn by philosophers writing about secession. Having the liberty-right does not imply having the claim-right: A group might be morally justified in seceding and yet it might not be the case that others (including the state from which the group is seceding) are obligated to refrain from interfering with the group’s attempt to secede. Therefore, an argument that suffices to establish that a group is justified in seceding under such and such conditions may not suffice to establish that the group has a (claim-) right to secede under those conditions. Yet when philosophers attempt to develop a moral theory of secession by appealing to intuitions about hypothetical examples of secession, it is often unclear whether the intuition elicited is about the moral justifiability of the secession (the mere permissibility) or about the existence of a moral claim-right.

1.2 Constitutional theorizing about secession

Some philosophers have distinguished between the question whether and, if so, under what conditions a group has a moral claim-right to secede and the question of whether and, if so, under what conditions a constitution ought to or may include a right to secede. For example, while acknowledging that secession may sometimes be morally justified (where this presumably means the group in question has the claim-right to secede), Cass Sunstein has argued that constitutional recognition of a right to secede is incompatible with the principles of constitutionalism (or at least democratic constitutionalism)[2] (Sunstein 1991). Sunstein argues that a basic principle of constitutionalism is that political institutions, including the constitution itself, must be designed so as to encourage citizens to engage in the hard work of democratic politics, where this means competing in the public forum on grounds of principle, with a minimum of strategic bargaining. Following Albert O. Hirschman (1970), he then contends that if the constitution acknowledges a right to secede then discontent minorities will be tempted to shirk the hard work of principled, democratic politics either by actually seceding when the majoritarian decisions go against their preferences or by using the threat of secession as a strategic bargaining tool as a de facto veto over majority rule. In either case, democracy will be undermined.

However, as argued Buchanan (1991: 132), Sunstein fails even to consider the possibility that a constitution could so hedge the right to secede as to reduce the threat of exit by minorities to acceptable proportions. The analogy here is with the right of constitutional amendment as found in the United States Constitution. This right is significantly hedged: two super-majorities, one in the Congress, the other among the States, are required for amendment. Similarly, an appropriately hedged right to secede is not incompatible with the principles of constitutionalism: Well-designed procedural hurdles (super-majorities, waiting periods, etc.) can make secession sufficiently difficult to avoid an unacceptable risk of premature exit or strategic bargaining by minorities, while still making secession possible under appropriate conditions. The current Ethiopian Constitution in fact includes such a hedged right to secede, requiring not only two super-majorities in favor of secession, but also a waiting period. So although appropriate constitutional design regarding secession must cope with the risks that secession will impair democratic processes, constitutional recognition of a right to secede does not appear to be incompatible with constitutionalism.

Wayne Norman goes further, arguing that there are significant advantages to constitutionalizing conflicts over secession (Norman 2003). The Supreme Court of Canada recently took the same position, arguing that the potentially disruptive process of secession by Quebec can be subjected to the rule of law by a process of negotiation and constitutional amendment.[3]

There is yet another argument for including a right to secede in a constitution. In some cases, when a new political entity is being created out of two or more independent or semi-autonomous entities, including a right to exit in the constitution of the new entity may be necessary as an inducement to join the new union. Under conditions of uncertainty as to how the new union will work, constitutional recognition of a “bail out” option may be necessary to get the new union going[4] (Buchanan 1991: ch. 4).

There is much philosophical work to be done on the question of when and if so how the right to secede might be constitutionalized. It will require both an account of the principles of constitutionalism and of the morality of secession and an empirically-based knowledge of the conditions under which various constitutional arrangements can be reasonably expected to realize the principles of constitutionalism in a manner that is consistent with the morality of secession.

2. Theories of the Right to Secede

In the philosophical literature a distinction is drawn between two theories of the right to secede (understood as a unilateral claim-right): Remedial Right Only Theories and Primary Right Theories.[5] Remedial Right Only Theories analogize the right to secede to the right to revolution, understanding it as a right that a group comes to have only as a result of violations of other rights. On this view secession is justified only as a remedy of last resort for persistent and serious injustices. The right to unilateral secession thus understood is not primary, but rather derivative upon the violation of other, more basic rights; hence the label ‘remedial right only’. Sometimes the term “Just Cause Theories” is used to refer to Remedial Right Only Theories and the term “Choice Theories” to refer to Primary Right Theories.

Different versions of Remedial Right Only Theories specify different lists of the injustices that can ground the remedial right. Consider, for example, a Remedial Right Only Theory that includes among the grounds for the (unilateral) right to secede the following: (a) large-scale and persistent violations of basic human rights, (b) unjust taking of the territory of a legitimate state (where secession is simply the taking back of wrongly taken territory, as with the secession of the Baltic Republics from the Soviet Union in 1991), and (c) in certain cases, the state’s persisting violation of agreements to accord a minority group limited self-government within the state (Buchanan 2004). A more austere Remedial Right Only Theory would recognize only (a), persistent, large-scale violations of basic human rights (in the most extreme case, genocide or other mass killings) as sufficient to justify unilateral secession.[6]

Primary Right Theories of the unilateral right to secede recognize that a group can have a right to secede on remedial grounds, but they contend that the (unilateral) right to secede can exist even when the group has not been subject to any injustice. This second type of theory thus holds that there is a right to unilateral secession over and above whatever remedial and hence derivative right there may be.

Primary Right Theories are of two types: Ascriptivist (predominantly nationalist) Theories and Plebiscitary (or majoritarian) Theories. The former hold that certain groups whose memberships are defined by what are sometimes called ascriptive characteristics, simply by virtue of being those sorts of groups, have a unilateral (claim-)right to secede. Ascriptive characteristics are those that are ascribed to individuals independently of their choice and include being of the same nation or being a “distinct people”. The most common form of Ascriptivist theory holds that nations as such have a right of self-determination that includes the right to secede in order to have their own state.

Plebiscitary Theories in contrast hold that a unilateral moral claim-right to secede exists if a majority residing in a portion of the state chooses to have their own state there, regardless of whether or not they have any common characteristics, ascriptive or otherwise, other than the desire for independence. They need not be co-nationals or members of a distinct society.

What the two types of Primary Right Theories have in common is that they do not require injustice as a necessary condition for the existence of a unilateral (claim-)right to secede. They are Primary Right Theories because they do not make the unilateral (claim-)right to secede derivative upon the violation of other, more basic rights, as the Remedial Right Only Theories do.[7]

No attempt will be made here to provide a comprehensive comparative evaluation of these rival theories (see Buchanan 1997). Instead we will only identify only their major strength and weaknesses.

2.1 The right to secede as a right to territory

As Lea Brilmayer has rightly stressed, secession is not simply the formation of a new political association among individuals or the repudiation by a group of persons of their obligation to obey the state’s laws (Brilmayer 1991). It is the taking of a part of the territory claimed by an existing state. Accordingly, rival theories of secession must be understood as providing alternative accounts of what it takes for a group to come to have a claim to territory that is at the time included in the territory of an existing state. We discover below that the most serious objections to the two varieties of Primary Right Theories question the cogency of their accounts of exactly what it is that gives a group within this state a claim to a portion of the territory claimed by the state. In contrast, the Remedial Right Only approach appears to provide a more cogent account of the secessionists’ claim to territory.

2.2 Remedial Right Only Theories

This approach to unilateral secession recognizes at least two ways a group can have the requisite valid claim to territory: (a) by reclaiming territory over which they were sovereign but which was unjustly taken from them (as with the Baltic Republics’ secession from the Soviet Union in 1991); or (b) by coming to have a claim to sovereignty over the territory as a result of availing themselves of a last resort remedy against serious and persistent violations of basic human rights. A more expansive reading of (b) would include among the injustices that can ground a unilateral right to secede, not only the violation of basic human rights, but also the state’s major violations of, or unilateral revocation of, intrastate autonomy agreements (as with Milosovic’s destruction of Kosovo’s autonomy in 1989).

With respect to (a), the basis of the secessionists’ claim to territory is straightforward: they are simply reclaiming what was recognized by international law as theirs. With respect to (b) the Remedial Right Only Theory begins with the presumption that existing states that are accorded legitimacy under international law have valid claims to their territories but then argues that such claims can be overridden or extinguished in the face of persistent patterns of serious injustices towards groups within the state. The idea is that the validity of the state’s claim to the territory cannot be sustained when secession is the only remedy that can assure that the fundamental rights of the group will be respected.

Given the tendency for unilateral secession to provoke massive violence, the obvious strength of the Remedial Right Only approach is that it places a significant constraint on unilateral secession—namely, the requirement of a serious and persistent grievance of injustice suffered by the secessionists. To that extent, it captures the intuition that nonconsensual state-breaking, like revolution, is a grave affair requiring a weighty justification. More specifically, this view provides a plausible explanation of how the state can come to lose its entitlement to the territory: it does so by failing to do what gives states a moral claim to control territory in the first place, namely, providing justice for those within its jurisdiction.

Another strength of the Remedial Right Only approach is that it appears to provide the right incentives: States that are just (or at least do not persist in very serious injustices) are immune to legally permitted unilateral secession and entitled to international support in maintaining their territorial integrity. On the other hand, if, as the theory recommends, a unilateral right to secede as a remedy for serious and persistent injustices is acknowledged, this will give states an incentive to act more justly.

Some critics have complained that the Remedial Right Only approach to unilateral secession is disturbingly irrelevant to the concerns of many groups seeking self-determination. They say that in most cases it is nationalism that fuels the quest for self-determination, not grievances of injustice per se (Moore 1998a). An advocate of the Remedial Right Only view might respond that the latter is only an account of unilateral secession, not a comprehensive theory of self-determination. Thus the Remedial Right Only approach to unilateral secession is compatible with a fairly permissive stance toward intrastate autonomy, including various forms of self-government for national minorities within the state. The point is to uncouple the unilateral (claim-)right to secede from the various legitimate interests that groups—including national minorities—can have in various forms of self-determination short of statehood.

Moreover, the Remedial Right Only approach need not reject claims to independence on the part of nations; it only rejects the much stronger assertion that nations as such have a unilateral right to secede. In many cases the groups that suffer persistent grave injustices are in fact nations, and therefore would be accorded the right to secede by the Remedial Right Only Theory. To that extent it is inaccurate to say that this type of theory ignores the realities of national self-determination movements. But just as important, the Remedial Right Only Theory, when integrated into a comprehensive theory of self-determination that includes a principled account of when intrastate autonomy arrangements warrant international support, will address the concerns of national minorities in cases in which they do not have a unilateral right to secede.

What the Remedial Right Only approach does not do is concede that nations as such—independently of any persisting pattern of grave injustices—have a unilateral right to secede. But it can be argued that this is a virtue of the account, not a defect. It thereby avoids the objection to which Ascriptivist Theories are vulnerable, namely, that they endorse a unilateral right to secede for all nations in a world in which virtually every state contains more than one nation and in which nations are not neatly sorted into discrete regions of the state’s territory, but instead claim the same territories. The point is not simply that the Ascriptivist view is unfeasible; in addition its support for the idea of the ethnically exclusive state is an incitement to ethnic cleansing if not genocide. However, this line of argument can supply an effective reply to the objection that Remedial Right Only Theories neglect the importance of nationalism only if the account of the right to secede they advance is properly situated in a plausible, more comprehensive theory of self-determination.

2.3 Plebiscitary Theories

The appeal of Plebiscitary Theories is that they appear to make the determination of boundaries a matter of choice or, more accurately, of majority rule. To that extent they seek to bask in the popularity of democracy (Philpott 1995). Plebiscitary Theories typically add another necessary condition, beyond majority preference (in the region in question) for secession: Both the seceding unit and the remainder state must be able adequately to perform the basic functions that justify or legitimize states in the first place. Call this the State Viability Requirement.

The appeal of Plebiscitary Theories is two-fold. First, they avoid a problem that afflicts the other main type of Primary Right Theory, Ascriptivist Theories, because they do not require either an account of what constitutes a nation or an explanation of why nations have a right to their own state. Second, they are less conservative than Remedial Right Only Theories, allowing a democratic path to the redrawing of state boundaries, and this may be appealing, given the fact, as noted earlier, that existing boundaries may reflect national security needs and the need for large internal markets—considerations that are no longer as important in an era in which interstate wars are quite rare and markets extend across state borders.

However, given what is at stake in secession, it is far from clear that the mere fact that a majority of persons residing in a portion of a state desire independence should be a sufficient reason to give them a unilateral right to secede, in the absence of any grievances. Why should one assume that the mere fact of residence in an area authorizes persons to decide by majority vote not only to change their own citizenship but also to deprive others (the nonsecessionists) of their citizenship and to remove a part of the territory of the state without the consent of the citizens who happen to live outside the area in question?

In short, a serious weakness of existing Plebiscitary Theories, as Brilmayer (1991) emphasizes, is that they provide no account of the normative implications of occupancy of territory. The most developed versions of Plebiscitary Theories ground the right to secede in a right of political association, but the right of political association considered in itself tells us nothing about the right to territory. What is needed is an account of why the fact that a group that happens to find itself in a particular region of the state has the right to transform their political association in that particular piece of territory into sovereign jurisdiction over it.

To put the point bluntly, the Plebiscitary Theory seems to fly in the face of the doctrine of popular sovereignty. According to that doctrine, which lies at the core of the liberal-democratic conception of the state, the state’s territory is properly conceived of as the territory of the people as a whole, not just those who at a particular time happen to reside in a portion of it. But if this is so, it is hard to understand how the mere fact that a majority of citizens in a certain portion of the peoples’ territory desire to have that territory become an independent state could confer on them the right unilaterally to appropriate it.

Absent an account of the normative significance of the fact of occupancy, Plebiscitary Theories do not make a convincing case that majority preference plus satisfaction of the State Viability Proviso imply the right to independent statehood. Notice that it will not due for the Plebiscitary Theorist to add the premise that a group that is entitled (by the right to political association) to have its own territory. That would not explain why they have a right to the particular territory they happen to occupy.

In addition, critics of the Plebiscitary view have pointed out that the justifications for democratic governance within given political boundaries do not support the thesis that boundaries may be redrawn simply by majority rule (Buchanan 1998a). There are two chief justifications for democratic governance. The first is that democracy is intrinsically valuable from the standpoint of a very basic principle of morality, namely, that all persons are entitled to equal consideration. The core idea is that the basic moral equality of persons requires that they have an equal say in the decisions that determine the basic character of their polity. But it appears that this justification for democracy does not imply that the decision whether to secede should be determined unilaterally by a majority in favor of secession in a portion of the territory of an existing state as opposed to being determined by a majority of all the citizens.

The first justification for democracy tells us that all who are members of a particular polity—all who must live under one system of rules that determine the fundamental character of social life—should have an equal say or should participate as equals in deciding what those rules are to be. But the principle of democratic rule cannot tell us what the boundaries of the polity should be, because in order to implement the democratic rule we must already have fixed the boundaries of the polity. The right to democratic governance is a principle that specifies a relation of equality among members of the same polity, not a right to determine the membership of polities or their territorial boundaries.

The second chief justification for democracy is instrumental: It holds that democratic governance tends to promote important goods, including peace, freedom, and other dimensions of well-being. Once again, the force of the justification depends upon the assumption that what is being justified is a process of decision making for a polity. The claim is that the well-being of all the citizens will be best served if all the citizens are allowed to express their preferences through voting, at least on fundamental matters that affect all. Plainly, this argument cannot support the assertion that only some citizens (those in a particular portion of the polity) ought to be able unilaterally to decide a matter that will affect all citizens of the polity. Hence it cannot support the Plebiscitary Right view of the unilateral right to secede. Because neither of the justifications for democracy supports the Plebiscitary view, the latter is not entailed by the commitment to democracy.

There is one more problem that proponents of the Plebiscitary approach have not addressed, at least not explicitly. A successful secession can create security risks for the remainder state, and it is not clear that this eventually is adequately taken into account in the Plebiscitary Theory’s State Viability Proviso. The issue is clearest in the case of irredentist secession. Suppose that a portion of the territory of a state, S, whose inhabitants are predominantly members of minority ethnic group E1, secede in order to merge that territory with the territory of a neighboring state S1, in which the E1 ethnic group is the majority. Depending on the relationship between S1 and S2—perhaps there is a history of conflicts as is the case with India and Pakistan—the result of the secession may be an intolerable threat to S1’s security. (Perhaps the seceding territory contains natural barriers to invasion from S2 and expensive fortifications). It is at least worth asking whether the interest that the secessionist group have in linking up with their ethnic comrades in S2 is morally weightier than the interest of the majority of the citizens of S1 in national security. (Remember that by hypothesis, the secessionist group has not suffered injustices at the hands of S1). Even if S2 does not invade S1, the new security situation created by the change of borders (and the augmentation of S2s population) may make S1 subject to domination by S2. It is not clear that the Plebiscitary Theory’s state viability criterion provides adequate resources for addressing this problem. It is not that S1 lacks the capacity to perform the legitimizing functions of a state; rather, the problem is that it has become vulnerable as a result of the secession.

Reflections on the security problem lead to a methodological point. The contours of a moral right to secede may depend on what institutional resources exist outside the state for protecting the interests of the secessionists and/or of the people of the remainder state. If international or regional organizations can provide effective guarantees to S1 that if part of its territory secedes and becomes part of a neighboring state it will not face a security risk, then it will be harder for S1 to justify forcibly resisting the session. In contrast, if international security arrangements are weak, then in cases where there is a serious security risk for the state if irredentist secession occurs, the irredentist group’s right to secede looks more doubtful. Similarly, if regional or international organizations can be counted on to provide support for intrastate autonomy arrangements short of full independence, then it may be reasonable to conclude that a group that can significantly benefit from such arrangements does not have the right to secede. In contrast, if a dissatisfied minority group cannot rely on such external resources to protect its interests by securing some meaningful form of self-determination within the state, then it may have a stronger case for seceding. In Section 4 we develop this line of thought further, introducing a distinction between theories of secession that assume that only features of the state and the new state that would be formed from it by secession are relevant to determining the contours of the moral right to secede and theories that recognize that facts about regional and international institutions can be relevant.

2.4 Ascriptivist Theories

This approach to unilateral secession has a long pedigree, reaching back at least to Nineteenth Century nationalists such as Mazzini, who proclaimed that every nation should have its own state. Critics of the Ascriptivist variant of Primary Right Theory (Buchanan 1991, Gellner 2008) argue that it would legitimize virtually unlimited unilateral, forcible border changes because it confers an entitlement to its own state on every nation (or “people” or distinct society). For reasons noted above this appears to be not only unfeasible, but a recipe for increasing ethno-national conflict.

However, those who advocate the Ascriptivist Theory reply that it does not require every nation (or distinct people) to exercise its unilateral right to secede and have conjectured that were their theory generally accepted not every group upon which it confers this entitlement would choose to secede. Nevertheless, given the historical record of ethno-nationalist conflict, the worry remains that institutionalizing the principle that every nation is entitled to its own state would exacerbate ethno-national violence, along with the human rights violations it inevitably entails. Thus the moral costs of incorporating the Ascriptivist version of Primary Right Theory into international law may appear prohibitive—especially if there are less risky ways to accommodate the legitimate interests of nations, such as better compliance with human rights norms and recourse to intrastate autonomy arrangements.

There are variants of Ascriptivist theory that go some distance toward allaying the worry that acceptance of the theory would add fuel to the fires of ethno-national conflict by qualifying the unilateral right of secession for nations (or distinct peoples) in various ways. For example, the Ascriptivist may hold that there is a presumption in favor of each nation or distinct people having a right to its own state if it so desires, or a prima facie unilateral right to secede for all such groups, but the international legal system is justified in requiring some groups to settle for autonomy arrangements short of full independence to avoid dangerous instability or to accommodate similar claims by other groups to the same territory. This way of responding to the worry about adding fuel to ethno-national conflicts comes at a price: What was originally billed as a unilateral right of every nation as such to its own state now looks more like a highly defeasible presumption in favor of independence for nations. And unless a fairly concrete account of the conditions under which the presumption is not defeated is provided, it is hard to know what the practical implications of this qualified Ascriptivist view are. What is needed is an account of how the putative presumption in favor of statehood for nations is to be weighed against competing claims and values. So far, proponents of Ascriptivist Theories have not provided this.

Earlier, we observed that critics of the Ascriptivist version of Primary Right Theory tend to focus on the potential costs in terms of exacerbated ethno-national conflict of incorporating the view into international law. However, it is not enough to note the potential costs of acceptance of the Ascriptivist Theory and its incorporation into international law. It is also necessary to understand the putative benefits of having a system in which the rights of nations to their own states is acknowledged. Accordingly, David Miller has usefully distinguished two ways in which Ascriptivist theories can be supported: by arguments to show that nations need states or by arguments to show that states need to be mono-national (Miller 1995).

The first type of argument has two variants: One can argue that nations need to have their own states, either (1) in order to be able to protect themselves from destruction or from forces that threaten their distinctive character, or (2) in order for co-nationals to have the institutional resources to be able to fulfill the special obligations they owe one another as members of an “ethical community”, in Miller’s phrase. Both of these considerations can, under certain circumstances, weigh in favor of some form of political self-determination for nations, but it is not clear that either is sufficient to ground a general right of all nations to full independence and hence a unilateral right to secede. Indeed Miller marshals them in support of a weaker conclusion: that nations have a “strong claim” to self-determination, but does not specify when the claim constitutes a full-fledged right.

The second type of justification for the view that nations are entitled to their own states also has two variants: The first, which dates back at least to John Stuart Mill’s Considerations On Representative Government (Mill [1861] 1991), asserts that democracy can only flourish in mono-national states, because states in which there is more than one nation will be lacking in the solidarity, trust, or shared sentiments and values that democracy requires. The second, advanced by David Miller, asserts that states need to be mononational in order to achieve distributive justice, because distributive justice requires significant redistribution of wealth among citizens and the better off will only be willing share their wealth with their less fortunate fellow citizens if they see them as co-nationals (Miller 1995). Both forms of the “states need to be mononational”argument raise very interesting questions about the motivational conditions necessary if crucial state functions are to be successfully performed.

Mill apparently based his judgment that multination states are incompatible with democracy on historical experience. However, some would argue that there are cases of multinational democratic states: Canada, Belgium, and perhaps Switzerland (depending upon whether one regards the last as multinational or merely multi-ethnic). One might also add the United States, since most Indian tribes have a legal status that approaches sovereignty.

Of course modern proponents of Mill’s argument would be quick to point out that the continued existence of Belgium and Canada are in doubt due to nationalist secession movements. (However, at present the secession of Quebec seems very unlikely.) On the other hand, it could be argued that Mill’s generalization is prematurely pessimistic: genuine democracies are a very recent phenomenon and until even more recently there have been almost no serious attempts, even on the part of democratic states, to recognize the claims of nations within states, through various forms of autonomy arrangements.[8] So as a justification for acknowledging a right to independent statehood for all nations, with the risk of instability and violence this might entail, Mill’s pessimism about multinational democracies may seem to some to be premature. The most reasonable strategy would seem to be to do more to ensure that states respect the human rights of their minorities and to encourage intrastate autonomy agreements rather than giving up on the idea of multinational states.

The second version of the “states need to be mono-national” argument also faces serious objections. First, whether or not nationalism will facilitate or instead block large-scale redistribution of wealth will depend upon the character of the nationalism in question. Nationalist solidarity may not extend to willingness to redistribute wealth. As socialists from Marx onward have observed, the privileged minority has often been quite adept at appealing to nationalism to counteract the redistributive impulse. Second, even in cases where nationalist sentiment facilitates redistribution, one must ask: what else does it facilitate? Miller appears to argue from the fact that a morally pristine, highly idealized nationalism would facilitate distributive justice (or democracy) to the conclusion that nations as such are entitled to their own states or at least to a presumption thereof. But there are many historical instances in which the national unity that Miller assumes will be harnessed for the pursuit of distributive justice has been ferociously directed toward conquest and against non-nationals and dissenting members of the nation itself.

The foregoing comparative evaluation of the main types of theories of the unilateral (claim-)right to secede suggests that the Remedial Right Only approach is superior. However, at present it is fair to say that none of the rival types of theories is sufficiently worked out for a definitive comparative evaluation to be possible. For each type of theory there are unanswered questions and potential objections. For example, Remedial Right Only Theories that include unjust annexations of territory among the injustices that ground a unilateral (claim-)right to secede must provide a satisfactory solution to what has elsewhere been called the moral statute of limitations problem (Buchanan 1991: 88): how durable are claims to independence based on past unjust takings—how far back in history may a group go in making the case that they are entitled to their own state because they previously had one?

More importantly, a Remedial Right Only Theory of the unilateral right to secede will only be defensible in the end if it rests upon a plausible account of what entitles a state to control over a territory in the first place. Without such an account the Remedial Right Only view appears arbitrarily to privilege the status quo by requiring secessionists to bear the burden of showing that they have suffered serious and persistent injustices in order to establish their claim to territory. To answer this objection, the Remedial Right Only theorist would have to provide a justice-based theory of legitimacy, arguing that what grounds the state’s claim to territory is its provision of justice, and that it is for this reason that only serious injustices can void that claim (such an account of legitimacy is in Buchanan 2013).

All three types of theories must address satisfactorily what may be called the problem of authentic voice. For Ascriptivist and Remedial Right Only Theories this means providing a reasoned answer to the question “what counts as an authentic decision to attempt to secede?” (Is there some nonarbitrary way of specifying what sort of majority is required in favor of secession before it can be said that the group in question has chosen to exercise its right to secede?). Similarly, Plebiscitary Right theorists must provide a principled account of how large a majority in favor of secession must exist, before it can be said that the right to secede exists.

In addition, all three types of theories must articulate a plausible account of the rights of those within the seceding territory who oppose secession. For example, are there circumstances in which the anti-secessionists should be granted dual citizenship, so that they can preserve their citizenship in the state from which the secession is occurring? Are there circumstances in which they deserve compensation for losses they incur when a new state, perhaps with different property laws, is created?

Finally, as suggested earlier, the implications of each type of theory for international law regarding secession should be explained. In the next section, we explore briefly the relationship between views about the moral (claim-)right to unilateral secession and the question of what position international law should take on unilateral secession.

2.5 Situating theories of secession within theories of Territorial Justice

The discussion thus far indicates that all three types of theories suffer a serious incompleteness: They do not situate their position on secession within the context of a comprehensive theory of territorial justice. A theory of territorial justice would provide a coherent account of valid moral claims to territory of various types, from claims to full sovereign jurisdiction, to claims to the more limited jurisdictional control needed for various forms of intrastate autonomy (modes of self-determination short of full independence), to claims to participation in various forms of joint jurisdiction, to claims to permanent occupancy. Ascriptivist theories need such a theory in order to explain why nations (as opposed to other types of groups) have the most robust claim to territory, the jurisdiction over territory that constitutes sovereignty. Plebiscitary Theories, as we have already seen, need such a theory to explain why the fact that a group is a majority in a particular territory gives it a claim to sovereignty over that territory—and why the fact that those residing in the same territory who do not support secession have no special claim to that territory, not even one that falls short of the claim the majority has. Remedial Right Only Theories need an account of what forms of control over territory, short of full sovereignty, are appropriate for which groups, given the nature of the injustices they have suffered at the hands of the state. All existing theories of secession include accounts of what gives a group a claim to sovereignty over territory, but to make these accounts fully plausible, they also need to explain what grounds less robust claims to territory, and that requires integrating a theory of secession into a comprehensive theory of territorial justice. The first efforts at developing systematic views on territorial justice have appeared only recently, and their significance for philosophical controversies about the right to secede is not yet clear (Kolers 2009; Meisels 2009; Nine 2012).

2.6. Narrowly versus Widely Institutional Theories

There is another way of sorting theories of secession that is also illuminating. As noted in subsection 2.3, some theories assume that only facts about the institutional resources of the remainder state and the new state created by secession are relevant to determining the contours of the moral right to secede and others recognize that facts about other institutions, whether regional or international can be relevant. The Plebiscitary Theory developed by Altman and Wellman (2009), is an instance of the former type of theory; Buchanan’s Remedial Right Only theory is an instance of the latter.

According to Altman and Wellman, whether a group has the right to secede depends only on its preference for independent statehood and on whether the new state it creates and the remainder state will be able adequately to perform the basic functions of government. On this view, the effects this group seceding or of other parties agreeing that it has the right to secede on future secessionist attempts or on the well-functioning of the international order are completely irrelevant to determining whether this group has the right to secede. In effect, this theory treats secession as strictly a two-party affair, so far as the interest relevant to determining whether a group has the right to secede is concerned. Buchanan’s theory, in contrast, recognizes that other parties can have legitimate interests that are relevant to determining what the rights of the primary parties are.

Altman and Wellman might reply that their State Viability Proviso does take the interests of third parties into account. More specifically, the fulfillment of the Proviso serves the interests of third parties in having viable states and in the provision of justice that comes with the discharging of basic state functions.

The problem with this reply is that, while acknowledging that third-party interests can be relevant to determining whether a group has the right to secede, it offers no reason as to why legitimate third-party interests should be thus restricted. Why are not the interests that other states and their populations have in a stable order of states and in avoiding security crises of the sort that irredentist secessions can create (as sketched above) also relevant to determining the contours of the right to secede? After all, whether a group has the (claim-)right to secede depends on whether other parties have sufficient reason to refraining from trying to prevent the secession and that in turn can depend on whether the secession is likely to have a negative impact on various legitimate interests, including, but not limited to the interest in the remainder state and the new state being viable.

Suppose that a group within a legitimate, reasonably just state, is a majority in a portion of the state’s territory and prefers to have its own state. Whether they have the right to secede depends on whether there are sufficient reasons for other states to refrain from interfering with their attempt at secession (because the right in question is a claim-right). But whether other states ought to refrain from interfering with a secession or not interfere with the state’s attempt to prevent a secession can depend on whether behaving in this way is likely to help establish a new norm of customary international law that permits territorially-concentrated majorities unilaterally to form their own states without interference. In the absence of impartial institutions to determine when the conditions for justified secession according to the Plebiscitary Theory are met, such a new, much more permissive norm of customary international law would be dangerous—it would encourage secessions that do not meet the Plebiscitary Theories own criteria. So, as in the case of irredentist secessions noted above, it appears that in these circumstances as well, whether other states ought to interfere with an attempted secession, and hence whether a group has the right to secede, can depend on factors other than those the Plebiscitary Theory allows to count.

If, as we have suggested, a range of legitimate interests is relevant to determining the nature of the moral right to secede and if the extent that these interests are impacted by secession depends on the existing institutional resources, including not just those of the remainder state and the new state, but also those of regional and international organizations, then it follows that a theory of the moral right to secede must take into account existing institutional realities at all levels. And if that is so, then contrary to what theorists like Altman and Wellman assume, probing our moral intuitions about quite different phenomena in which the institutional context is quite different will not be a reliable guide to understanding the nature of the moral right to secede. For example, analogizing the decision of a minority group to break away and form their own state to the decision of two individuals to marry will not be very illuminating, because the supposed analogy omits any reference to the relevant institutional facts.

3. Secession and Just War Theory

A more serious lacuna in the philosophical literature on secession than the failure to integrate it into a comprehensive theory of territorial justice is the absence of a connection with just war theory. In real-world conflicts in which a group asserts the right to secede and the state denies the validity of the claim, either one or both of the parties often resorts to force. But merely establishing that a group has the right to secede does not settle whether it is justified in using force to achieve its goal of independent statehood. (In general, merely having a right to X does not entail being justified in using force to secure X). Similarly, if the group does not have the right to secede, it may still not be justifiable for the state to use force to prevent it from seceding. Remarkably, philosophical theories of secession have not distinguished between having the right to secede and being justified in using force to exercise the right. Nor have they discussed the conditions under which states have the right to use force to resist secessions when the secessionists have no moral right to secede. This is especially surprising, given the resurgence of philosophical theorizing about just war.

The key point here is that mainstream just war theory does not endorse the assertion that the violation of any right can justify force nor the assertion that force is justified if it is required for the successful exercise of any right. Instead, the dominant view is that the list of just causes (legitimate ends to be served by going to war) is more constrained than that and should reflect the conviction that the use of force is only justified if it is required to remedy very serious injustices or for the exercise of very important rights.

It is far from obvious how just war theory and the theory of secession should be connected. It appears, however, the use of force by secessionists would be more problematic on some theories of secession than on others. Suppose, for example, that a majority of the people in a portion of a legitimate state’s territory decide that they want their own state there, in spite of the fact that they are not victims of any injustices at the hands of the state. On the Plebiscitary Theory, they have the right to secede (so long as the new unit and the remainder state will be able adequately to perform the basic functions of government). If the state refuses to vacate its facilities in that region, turn over control over that portion of the border to the secessionists, etc., is it justifiable for the secessionists to use force against the agents of the state? Does the mere preference for their own state justify engaging in a course of action that is likely to result in large-scale violence? The problem here is that the purpose the secessionists can invoke to justify a course of action seems not to fit well with the usual understandings of just cause. In contrast, remedial Right Only Theories would seem to be consistent, at least in principle, with mainstream just war theory, because the latter recognizes redress of serious injustices (and not the mere desire to have one’s own political unit) as a just cause. Nonetheless, a fully-developed Remedial Right Only Theory would have to provide an account of when injustices are sufficiently serious to warrant secession under conditions in which there is a significant risk of large-scale violence. Regardless of which type of theory one embraces, one would also need an account of the conditions under which the state would be justified in using force to block secession. For as we have already noted, the mere fact that the group attempting to secede does not have a right to secede does not imply that it is justifiable for the state to use force to prevent them from seceding. A moral theory of secession should not be limited, then, to articulating and defending characterization of the moral right to secede. It should also provide an account of the morality of using force in conflicts over secession and one that is consistent with its view of the right to secede.

4. Secession and the Philosophy of International Law

There is yet another desideratum for a theory of secession: As suggested earlier, the implications of each type of theory for international law regarding secession should be explained. In the next section, we explore briefly the relationship between views about the moral (claim-)right to unilateral secession and the question of what position international law should take on unilateral secession.

The deficiencies of existing international law regarding secession motivate the project of developing principled proposals for reform. At present international law recognizes only a very narrow set of circumstances under which the unilateral right to secede exists as an international legal right, namely, when a group is subject to colonial domination. The difficulty with this conception of the international legal right to unilateral secession is that, while clearly embodying the idea that serious and persistent injustices can generate a right to unilateral secession, it arbitrarily restricts the injustices that generate the right to the special case of classical colonialism, where a metropolitan power dominates a racially and/or ethnically distinct group in an overseas colony. Another difficulty is that while international legal practice has confined the unilateral right to secede to the so-called “saltwater decolonization” case, several important international legal documents include reference to an apparently much broader “right of self-determination of all peoples” which is said to include the right to choose full independence, and hence the right to secede.[9] One way to conceive of the chief task for a moral theory of international law regarding secession is that it must provide a reasoned basis for removing the arbitrary restriction from which the current law suffers, while avoiding the dangerously expansive notion that all “peoples” are entitled to their own states, in a world in which virtually every existing state includes more than one “people”, in which several “peoples” claim the same territory, and in which there are no international institutional principles or mechanisms for sorting out these conflicting claims.

An important choice for the moral theorist of international law regarding secession regards the scope of the right itself. On one view, international law should simply acknowledge, under certain conditions to be specified by the theory, a group’s right to its own state; on the other view, international law should distinguish between (a) the conditions under which a group should be accorded the right to repudiate the jurisdiction of the state over a portion of the state’s territory and to attempt to establish its own control there and (b) the conditions under which international law should recognize the secessionist entity as a legitimate state, with all the rights, immunities, privileges, and obligations this entails.

The difference between these two options can be appreciated if we take the example of a Remedial Right Only approach to proposals for reforming international law regarding secession. For simplicity, suppose that the Remedial Right Only theory under consideration recognizes only large-scale and persistent violations of basic human rights as grounding the unilateral right to secede, and suppose that group G has suffered such violations. On the first view, the proposal is that international law should simply acknowledge that G has the right to its own legitimate state if forming a new state is the remedy of last resort for large-scale, persistent violations of the basic human rights of members of G, where this means that other states should recognize the new entity as having all the rights, privileges, immunities, powers, and obligations this status entails. On the second view, there are two distinct questions the international law of secession should address: First, has G suffered large-scale and persistent violations of basic human rights and second, does G satisfy the conditions for recognitional legitimacy, for being recognized as a legitimate state? The second view would maintain that although the group’s having suffered large-scale and persistent violations of basic human rights is sufficient for acknowledging its right to repudiate the state’s jurisdiction and attempt to set up its own state, something more is required before international law should recognize the new entity as a legitimate state; in particular, the new state should provide credible assurances that it will respect the rights of minorities within its territory.

Making recognition of legitimate statehood dependent in this way upon satisfying basic requirements of justice obviously coheres with the Remedial Right Only theory’s approach to secession, which involves rewarding states that respect rights. But there is much to be said for distinguishing, regardless of which theory of the right to secede is adopted, between the right to secede (understood as the right to repudiate the state’s authority over a portion of its territory and to attempt to set up a new state there) and the right to recognition as a legitimate state. New entities created through secession typically are keen to receive recognition of their legitimacy because of the benefits this confers, including access to favorable trade regimes, loans and credits from international agencies such as the World Bank and International Monetary Fund, and the ability to participate as an equal with other states in the making of international law. Distinguishing between whether a group has the right to secede (to repudiate the state’s jurisdiction and attempt to establish its own state) and whether it has the right to recognition as a legitimate state enables the international legal system to impose normative conditions on recognition in circumstances in which new states have strong incentives to satisfy them.

A fully-developed philosophical theory of what the international law of secession ought to be would be quite ambitious and complex. It would have to include not only an account of the connection between the right to secede and the right to recognition, but also a theory of justified intervention in support of or against secession that would cohere with a more general position on the legitimate use of force across borders.

5. Conclusion

Philosophical work on secession falls into three main categories: (1) attempts to develop an account of the moral right to secede (understood either as a claim-right or as a mere liberty), (2) investigations of the compatibility or incompatibility of secession with constitutionalism, and (3) attempts to determine what posture international law should adopt concerning secession. In each of these areas of inquiry, as well as in the connections among them, exploration of the moral issues of secession provides a powerful lens through which to examine some of the most important issues of moral-political theory, including perhaps the most fundamental issue of all: what gives a state a valid claim to its territory?


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Other Internet Resources

  • The Liechtenstein Institute on Self-Determination, Princeton University,
    [This site links to numerous academic centers, think tanks, international organizations, government agencies, NGOs, journals and news organizations dealing with self-determination and secession.]

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Allen Buchanan <>

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