Medieval Skepticism

First published Mon Jan 12, 2009; substantive revision Tue Jun 27, 2017

Overarching surveys of the history of philosophy often leave the impression that philosophical skepticism—roughly, the position that nothing can be known—had many adherents in the Ancient and Hellenistic Periods, disappeared completely as a topic of intellectual interest during the Middle Ages, and returned as a viable position in the Renaissance and Early Modern Periods.

As a survey, this is quite understandable, since no thinker from the Middle Ages professed an active allegiance to a systematic philosophical skepticism. But a closer examination of Medieval Philosophy shows that despite skepticism’s disappearance as an overt philosophical movement, it continued to swirl in the thoughts of many of the best philosophers of the period. A very few, including most prominently Augustine and Al-Ghazali, claimed to have been systematic skeptics at some points in their pasts. Many others held skeptical views about localized issues such as one’s ability to know an efficient cause. And even more discussed and attempted to refute commonplace skeptical arguments in defense of their own, anti-skeptical positions.

Chronologically speaking, skeptical issues were most prominently considered in works from both the leading and tail ends of the Middle Ages. Augustine’s 4th and 5th century attacks against the Academic Skeptics mark the beginning of such discussions, and a smattering of treatments of skeptical issues appears periodically throughout the next 800 years. From the late 13th century onwards, however, skeptical issues began to exert a dominant and wide influence on epistemological discussions, as seen in the works of such important figures as Henry of Ghent, John Duns Scotus, William of Ockham, Peter Auriol, John Buridan, and Nicholas of Autrecourt.

Though medieval discussions of skepticism are often found buried within larger, formulaic discussions of theological topics, these treatments had influence beyond the academic circles within which they were originally created and considered. Among Early Modern philosophers, Descartes in particular owes a debt to these earlier accounts of skepticism: versions of both his cogito and Evil Demon arguments may be found in the works of medieval philosophers.

In what follows we will briefly examine the relevant views of a few representative figures from each tradition and era. Though none claims to be inclusive of the entire Middle Ages, the best scholarly overviews of important aspects of the medieval epistemological tradition are Tachau (1988), Pasnau (1997), Perler (2006), and Lagerlund (2010a).

1. Ancient and Hellenistic Sources

There were many varieties of skepticism extant during the Ancient and Hellenistic periods, but two were particularly important to the later history of topic: Pyrrhonian Skepticism, especially as presented by Sextus Empiricus, and the Academic Skepticism of Cicero.

Pre-medieval adherents of both types of skepticism not only held particular skeptical positions, but also participated in a skeptical way of life, taking their arguments and positions as part of an overarching ethical worldview. Skeptics took their radical views of knowledge as means to the end of reaching the state of tranquility. By using common argumentative moves called tropes, skeptics sought to elevate themselves and others to a state of suspension of belief (epochê). And once this was reached, they held, one’s worries about philosophical matters would dissolve in tranquility.

Because of these ethical excellences, skeptics held themselves up as wise men. The more radical Pyrrhonian Skeptics, who doubted the truth of all claims, quickly ran afoul of the following objection, which has been given in various forms throughout the history of philosophy: a thoroughgoing skeptic, it seems, cannot live his or her skepticism. If one doubts (and thus fails to act) on the truth of such claims as “Food is necessary for human life”, it would follow that one could not live at all. Academic Skeptics attempted to avoid this objection by arguing that though skepticism precluded living by the truth, since the truth could not be known, nevertheless one could live by the truthlike or plausible. Hence theirs was a more practical version of skepticism.

1.1 Pyrrhonian Skepticism

Pyrrhonian Skepticism, which was to play such an central role in the Renaissance and Early Modern Philosophy, had no significant, direct influence on later medieval thinkers, since texts exploring the position (primarily the works of Sextus Empiricus, and to a much lesser extent, Diogenes Laertius) were not in wide circulation. Floridi (2002) and Wittwer (2016) explore the textual transmission of Sextus’s works; Floridi notes that there are only seven known Latin manuscripts from the period, though Wittwer has found further evidence to supplement this.

A few scattered references to Pyrrhonian skepticism have been found in the Latin West, in the works of Bede (early 8th century), Rabanus Maurus (9th century), and Peter of Auvergne (late 13th century). More was known of it to Byzantine and Islamic philosophers, since knowledge of Greek was preserved in their intellectual communities, and since they had access to a greater range of ancient texts that addressed the topic.

1.2 Academic Skepticism

Academic Skepticism, so-called because of its birth among scholars working in Plato’s Academy, was the type most known to the medievals. Academic skepticism was presented through the sympathetic works of Cicero (De Natura Deorum and Academica, primarily), and especially through many of Augustine’s anti-skeptical arguments, such as those found in his Contra Academicos. In fact, for most of the Middle Ages—at least up through the 1430s—the term scepticus wasn’t used in the Latin tradition; academicus was the most common term for the skeptic. Further complicating matters, the medievals failed to recognize the distinction between Academic and Pyrrhonian Skepticism. See Floridi (2002) and Schmitt (1972).

Schmitt’s (1972) study of the textual transmission of Cicero’s skeptical works brings out many interesting aspects of its history. As was the case with Sextus, there were few manuscripts of Cicero’s Academica extant in the Middle Ages. In addition, there were two versions of it in circulation, and the medievals had only parts of each. And yet another problem for those who had access to the texts was that Cicero’s position was often confused with that of one of his interlocutors in the work, Lucullus.

Henry of Ghent (late 13th C.) is the first medieval philosopher both to have obvious knowledge of the Academica, and to have made a serious philosophical attempt to come to grips with the views expressed there. When John Duns Scotus critiques Henry’s epistemology, he shows no evidence of knowing Cicero’s text. And for the most part, later medievals were equally ignorant of it. Their discussions of skepticism seem not to have been based on an examination of or engagement with skepticism as presented by ancient authors; it was a skepticism of its own sort, as will be detailed below.

2. Skepticism in Pre-Scholastic Christian Philosophy

2.1 Augustine

Augustine of Hippo (354–430) was a classically trained rhetorician who explored many different schools of thought (Platonism, Manicheanism, and Skepticism) before converting to Christianity. After his conversion, he began to write philosophical and theological works addressing some of the views from these schools. The most important anti-skeptical work was his Contra Academicos (Against the Academicians), which has been discussed by Matthews (1977 and 1992), Burnyeat (1982), King (1995), Curley (1997), O’Daly (2001), Bolyard (2006), and Dutton (2016).

In Contra Academicos, Augustine targets a few key Academic claims: (a) that appealing to truthlikeness or plausibility is coherent; (b) that skeptics are wise; (c) that nothing can be known; and finally (d) that skepticism leads to tranquility.

According to Augustine, three of the four claims can be relatively quickly dispatched. The first claim, concerning truthlikeness, cannot function alone as a standard, since one cannot know that something is like the truth without also knowing the truth itself. Second, skeptics cannot be wise, since wisdom requires knowledge of some sort. Third, skepticism leads away from tranquility, rather than towards it, since it puts one at odds with the morals of the rest of society, which in turn is likely to lead to strife.

The most important claim for the epistemological history of the problem is the third: that nothing whatsoever can be known. Augustine treats of it in some detail.

He casts the issue as follows. The skeptic argues that a wise man must retreat to skepticism since nothing can be known. This inability is due to the fact that knowledge of a truth—at least as understood by certain Stoics—is only possible if that truth could not possibly be caused to appear mentally by something different than what it is in fact caused by. For example, if an internal mental image or concept of a tree’s being beside a house could be caused by a dream, then the tree’s being beside the house cannot be known, even if the tree is in fact beside the house. With these stringent causal requirements, it is unsurprising to find that Academic Skeptics take the line they do: since no appearance meets this strict standard, they argue, it follows that nothing at all can be known.

Augustine thinks this standard can be met, however, at least in some cases. Augustine aims to uncover propositions about which doubt is an utter impossibility. He soon finds the following four disjunctive statements:

I still know something about physics. For I am certain that (1) there is either one world or not. And (2) if there is not just one, the number of them is either finite or infinite… In the same way, I know that (3) our world is disposed as it is either by the nature of bodies or by some plan. And I know that (4) (a) either it always did exist and always will, or (b) it started to exist and will never stop, or (c) it did not start in time but will have an end, or (d) it started and will not last forever…These truths are [logical] disjunctions, and no one can confuse a likeness of something false with them. (Contra Academicos 3.10.23)

In short, Augustine challenges the skeptic to convince him that such exhaustive, disjunctive propositions can be confused with, or have a likeness of, what is false.

At this point that the skeptic counters with external world skepticism: “How do you know this world exists…if the senses are fallible?” In other words, the skeptic argues, these disjunctive statements about the external, physical world all assume the existence of an external world, and thus they cannot be known to be true if the external world itself cannot be known to exist. If external world skepticism can be maintained, it follows that Augustine’s disjunctions can be mistaken for what is false, and thus this particular argument against global skepticism will fail.

Augustine’s primary response to the external-world skeptic is Augustine’s claim that things “seem” to him, and that these seemings constitute the world. He supports this view by arguing that seemings are required in order for error to occur—otherwise, what would we be mistaken about? And since the possibility of error is the main impetus for skeptical doubt, skepticism requires the admission that things seem. In other words, for Augustine, one cannot doubt that one has mental content, even if one might have doubt about whether this content corresponds to anything external to the mind.

Augustine gives further, more central arguments against global skepticism as Contra Academicos continues, claiming mathematical truths (e.g., “2 + 3 = 5”) and logical truths (e.g., “nothing both is and is not”) to be undoubtedly true. As with the physical disjunctions, such truths can be known without knowing external objects with any determinacy.

Beyond his discussions in the Contra Academicos, Augustine frequently tackles epistemological topics in other works. Most famously, Augustine makes proto-Cartesian moves frequently, arguing that the mere fact that he doubts and has various other mental happenings proves his own existence:

…who would doubt that he lives, remembers, understands, wills, thinks, knows, and judges? For even if he doubts, he lives; if he doubts, he remembers why he doubts; if he doubts, he understands that he doubts; if he doubts, he wishes to be certain; if he doubts, he thinks; if he doubts, he knows that he does not know; if he doubts, he judges that he ought not to consent rashly. Whoever then doubts about anything else ought never to doubt about all of these… (On the Trinity 10.10.14)

Later, Augustine will draw on his theory of illumination to provide the grounds for certainty. According to this theory, God’s Divine Ideas serve as the guarantors of certainty, and they function in much the way that Plato’s Forms do. Augustine first presents this view in De Magistro (On the Teacher), and he makes other references to it in later works. Augustinian Illumination has been widely discussed in the secondary literature, and Nash (1969) still remains one of the best introductions to the position.

2.2 Other Pre-Scholastics

There is little interest in skepticism exhibited in Christian philosophy until the rise of the Universities in the 13th century. Hadoardus (9th C.) includes many quotations from the Academica in his compilation of Cicero’s views generally, but he did no philosophical work with these quotations. John of Salisbury (12th C.) discusses Academic Skepticism to some degree in his Policraticus, but there’s no evidence that he had direct access to Cicero’s text; he most likely got the information either from Augustine or from some other secondary source.

3. Skepticism in Islamic and Jewish Philosophy

3.1 Islamic Philosophy

Two Islamic thinkers are particularly important to the history of medieval skepticism. Al-Ghazali (Algazel to the Latin-speaking world) (ca. 1058–1111) travelled throughout the Middle East, but spent most of his time in what are now Iran and Iraq. Al-Haytham (= Alhazen) (965–1039), who was born in what is now Basra, Iraq, wrote widely on various scientific and mathematical subjects. In addition, while the Persian philosophers Rāzī (1149–1210) and Ṭūsī (1201–1274) are not skeptics, their concerns with global skepticism and the knowledge of first principles lead them to have extended discussions of skeptical arguments. For more on Rāzī and Ṭūsī, see Fatoorchi (2013).

3.1.1 Al-Haytham

Al-Haytham’s Kitab al-Manazir (Book of Optics) was of particular importance for the later history of skepticism. Beyond his Arabic-speaking audience, it widely read in the Latin West under the title Perspectiva or De aspectibus, beginning with such philosophers as Roger Bacon (ca. 1214–1294). His views about the perceptual process had a wide influence throughout the later Middle Ages.

Al-Haytham held that many perceptions are inferential, and he explains his views in II.3 of the Optics. Rather than always grasping sensed things in an unmediated way, he argues, we sometimes grasp them through sudden, “imperceptible” inferences. These inferences proceed so rapidly as to seem immediate, and thus we usually don’t notice that they are occurring at all. Al-Haytham even argues that seemingly self-evident propositions such as “the whole is greater than its [proper] part” are inferential. Given this inferential process, cognitive error becomes a more reasonable possibility.

He catalogued a number of optical illusions as well (Optics III.7), examining such problems as the way the moon when low on the horizon appears larger than it does when higher in the sky, and the way that when one is in a boat floating down a river, the trees on the shore appear to be moving. Though Al-Haytham was not a skeptic himself, these illusory experiences provided fertile material for later thinkers to consider. Tachau (1988) discusses his wide influence on the scholastic tradition.

3.1.2 Al-Ghazali

Al-Ghazali sounds surprisingly Cartesian in an important section of his Munkidh min al-Dalal (Deliverance from Error). He begins by declaring his desire to reach certain knowledge, which he explains as “that in which what is known is laid bare in such a way as to leave no room for doubt, and is unaccompanied by the possibility of error or illusion, to the point that the mind cannot even conceive it.” (Deliverance 82)

He gives a (by now) familiar list of reasons for doubting the certainty of things. First, disagreement among competing theories gives some initial doubt. Second, a few cases of sensory skepticism (e.g., a shadow cast by the sun appearing to remain still, when in fact it is slowly moving as the day passes; the apparently small size of celestial bodies) lead him to lose confidence in all of his sensory beliefs. This distrust of his senses also suggests, third, that another of his faculties—reason itself—may be faulty, and he wonders whether even apparent logical truths might be false. And finally, he concludes by invoking dream skepticism. After setting up these doubts, he says the following:

When these notions occurred to me and made an impression on my mind, I sought a cure but found none. For they could only be rebutted with a proof, and a proof can only be constructed by combining the first [principles of] knowledge. If these are not given, then it is impossible to arrange a proof. This disease defied all cure and lasted for almost two months, during which I embraced the [skeptical] creed in actual fact, though not in speech or expression. Eventually, God cured me of this disease and my mind was restored to health and balance. The rational necessary beliefs were once again accepted and trusted, both securely and certainly. This did not come about by composing a proof or by an arrangement of words, but rather by a light that God almighty cast into my breast, which is the key to the greater part of cognizance. Whoever supposes that enlightenment depends upon explicit proofs has narrowed the expanse of God’s mercy. (Deliverance 86)

Beyond this, Ghazali also questions the nature of causation in his Incoherence of the Philosophers (Tahafut al-falasifa). Though he ultimately holds that all causation can be traced to God, he argues that our observations of so-called natural causes are not sufficient for proving a direct causal link between the apparent cause and that which is caused. This Humean-leaning position has been discussed widely in the secondary literature. See, e.g., Halevi (2002) for a recent treatment. For another recent account that does much to situate Ghazali’s discussion of skepticism within a broader Islamic intellectual conversation about the subject, and downplays the supposed connections between Ghazali and the Early Moderns, see Kukkonen (2010).

3.2 Jewish Philosophy

There is no strong evidence of any significant skeptical tendencies or interests among medieval Jewish philosophers. Judah Halevi (ca. 1075–1141) discuses skepticism briefly in his Kuzari I.4–8; in this passage, a character in the poem professes skepticism about religious truths, and presents his requirements for what would count as knowledge. See Kogan (2003).

There has also been limited discussion of Maimonides as a skeptic. Some of it focuses, e.g., on his claims in the Guide for the Perplexed 2.24 that humans cannot have knowledge of heavenly things. To take this to imply either a thoroughgoing skepticism or a thoroughgoing concern with skepticism, however, is probably too strong an inference. For more on this issue, see Ivry (2008).

4. Scholasticism and Skepticism

4.1 Thirteenth Century

The thirteenth century saw the birth of Scholasticism in the Latin West. As Universities began to develop in such important centers of learning as Paris and Oxford, so too did highly formalized and argumentative styles of debate and writing. At the same time, some of the intellectual consequences of the Crusades came to play an important role in the history of skepticism: Muslim and Jewish scholars and writings came to the attention of Christians working on similar topics. Of particular importance was the translation of all of Aristotle’s works into Latin, along with many commentaries on them (as well as original works) by Ibn-Rushd (Averroes) and Ibn-Sina (Avicenna).

With these texts came others (such as Al-Haytham’s Optics), and Christian scholars such as Roger Bacon began to investigate the cognitive process more thoroughly in their own writings. The dominant Augustinian theory of knowledge began to come under attack as the wealth of new accounts were contrasted, rejected, or synthesized. And as Augustine was reinterpreted, so too was his rejection of skepticism.

4.1.1 Thomas Aquinas and Siger of Brabant

Thomas Aquinas (ca. 1225–1274) and Siger of Brabant (ca. 1240–ca. 1282) were philosophers of vastly different reputations (the first was declared a saint and holds a preeminent place in Catholic theology; the second was accused of heresy and died under mysterious circumstances). Yet they both shared a deep commitment to synthesizing the new Aristotelian texts into their respective views.

Aquinas, as with Aristotle, exhibits no serious concerns with skepticism or with skeptical arguments. He occasionally makes references to sensory illusions, e.g., but he sees them as no epistemological threat. Baertschi (1986) and Pasnau (1997) treat of this issue briefly. Indeed, most of the secondary literature on Aquinas focuses on the question of why he has no such interest in skepticism. Varying accounts are given, and among them is Aquinas’s Aristotelian belief that the cognitive process is fundamentally a reliable one. For the most part, Aquinas and most later medievals aim to explain the processes by which knowledge is acquired, rather than aiming to justify knowledge.

Furthermore, many scholars argue that the Aristotelian doctrine of the formal identity of knower and known plays a significant role for Aquinas in particular. If (on this interpretation) the knower quite literally takes on the form of the known object, and thus becomes identical to the known object in this formal way, then there is no chance for error. The knower is not at a remove from the known object at all, on this account. There is considerable disagreement about Aquinas’s motivations here; for a few representative views, see Gilson (1986), MacDonald (1993), Pasnau (1997), Jenkins (1997), and Hibbs (1999).

Siger of Brabant, on the other hand, dealt directly with skepticism and skeptical arguments in his Impossibile 2 and his Questions on the Metaphysics. Though, as Côté (2006) argues, he also declines to take skepticism to be a serious threat, he does take the time to address it. Most notably, Siger raises the following question for consideration in Impossibile 2: “everything that appears to us are illusions and similar to dreams, so that we are not certain of the existence of anything.” Siger has various responses in his discussions, but his most important claims are (a) that a failure of the senses in some cases does not automatically imply failure in all cases; and (b) that if a sense report is not contradicted by another, more reliable sense report, then it itself is reliable. Furthermore, Siger gives a rather unconvincing reductio, arguing that if the senses are unreliable, no knowledge at all is possible. Taking this as a reductio of skepticism obviously would do little to assuage the worries of the committed skeptic.

Siger’s responses, though somewhat unsatisfying, do indicate the beginning of a growing interest in skeptical problems. Henry of Ghent shows this interest even more starkly.

4.1.2 Henry of Ghent and the Condemnation of 1277

Henry of Ghent (ca. 1217–1293) was one of the most important theological masters of his day, and he was a contemporary of both Aquinas and Siger. Beyond his own philosophical work, Henry was a central figure in one of the crucial events in medieval intellectual history: the Condemnation of 1277, which will be discussed at the end of this section. Brown (1973), Marrone (1985), Pasnau (1995), and Adams (1987) discuss Henry’s views in some detail.

Henry’s most concentrated attention to skeptical issues occurs in the first two questions of his Summa Quaestionum Ordinariarum (Ordinary Questions). Henry’s discussion of skepticism stands out when placed alongside other works from the same period. Though Augustine’s Contra Academicos was extant, and though Augustine’s De Trinitate echoed many of the anti-skeptical arguments from his own earlier work, the vast majority of Henry’s scholastic contemporaries (including Aquinas) took no serious interest in skepticism. Various explanations of this general attitude can be given. Perhaps Augustine’s self-proclaimed refutation of Academic skepticism was taken to be the final word on the subject; Aristotle’s dismissive attitude towards skepticism would have reinforced this idea. But for whatever reason, Henry thought the issue of skepticism important enough to raise it in the opening question of his own most important theological work.

Henry lists a number of different skeptical arguments, drawing from the critical accounts of Aristotle, Cicero, Augustine, and Averroes, and mentioning the support skepticism garners from the views of Heraclitus, Zeno, Protagoras, and Democritus, and Plato. He gives no evidence here of having direct access to any of the texts of the latter five thinkers, though he knows of their views through the works of others.

He begins by listing preliminary arguments both for and against the possibility of knowledge. On the skeptic’s side, Henry discusses cases of sensory relativism (what seems sweet to one person does not seem sweet to another, e.g.); the changeable nature of the sensory world; and the Learner’s Paradox from the Meno. Among the anti-skeptical arguments is Aristotle’s view (Metaphysics IV) that in denying knowledge, one is thereby claiming certainty that one does not know, and thus the skeptic must admit to knowing something. He also pulls from Augustine’s oft-repeated claim that in doubting, one knows that one doubts (De vera religione xxxix.73).

Henry then argues in a number of different ways that knowledge is in fact possible. First, he draws from Augustine and Cicero. His weakest claim here is that we can rely upon the testimony of others; otherwise, he says, knowledge of the distant past, or of places that one has never visited, would be impossible. He also explains that one can trust the veracity of a given sense experience provided it hasn’t been contradicted by a more reliable sense experience. In addition, he says that even if one is dreaming, one still knows that one lives. As with many who follow him, Henry cites the certainty of the law of non-contradiction as well.

In the final section of the question, Henry replies directly to the skeptical arguments he outlined in the beginning. Though he gives too many responses to detail here, Henry’s core idea is that though the senses grasp only changeable things, one has the ability to abstract what he calls the “created exemplar” from the objects of the senses; from this created exemplar, we can obtain a low-level knowledge of external objects (he calls this knowledge of the “true” or of the “truth”). Knowledge in the full sense—that is, knowledge of the “pure truth”—requires knowledge of the “uncreated exemplar”, or Divine Idea. Because the created exemplar is mutable in itself, it is only by seeing how it accords with the uncreated exemplar in God’s mind that full and certain knowledge is possible. In short, Henry follows Augustine in spirit, even if not in detail: for both philosophers, knowledge is impossible without Divine Illumination.

In the second question of his Summa, Henry explores Illumination in more detail. As he begins to explain things, it sounds as if God’s general background influence is sufficient to explain human knowledge. Later, however, Henry limits his optimistic outlook. First, he argues that God illuminates each person

according to his condition and capacity, unless someone by displaying great malice merits that it be taken away from him altogether. Such a person, as a result, would not see any truth at all…but would dissipate into the error that he deserves. (Summa I.2.134)

Echoing some of Augustine’s remarks in the De Magistro, Henry here seems to restrict epistemic certainty to those who are morally worthy. Second, Henry diverges even further from his initial argument, saying that God offers the “rules of the eternal light”—that is, the Divine Ideas—

to whomever he wants and takes them away from whomever he wants… Thus God sometimes bestows the eternal rules on bad people, with the result that in these rules they see many truths that the good cannot see… Sometimes, too, God takes these same rules away from such people and allows them to fall into error… [God] bestows [pure truth] through free will, on whomever he wants. (Summa I.2.131–132)

In short, according to this second argument, our ability to know with certainty is entirely dependent upon God’s whim. We will know only in cases in which God wants us to. This emphasis on God’s role in the knowing process is of a piece with the emphasis on Divine Omnipotence one finds in the Condemnation of 1277, with which Henry was intimately involved.

As the newly rediscovered Aristotelian texts began to find their way into university curricula in the thirteenth century, more conservative faculty reacted. Bonaventure and Henry were among the latter, and each argued against those who sought to replace the reigning Augustinianism with too many new Aristotelian elements. Aquinas, Siger of Brabant, and others sought to synthesize Aristotle and Christianity in a much more thoroughgoing way than Henry thought acceptable. And as part of the commission organized at the Pope’s request, Henry helped create a list of 219 propositions—some held by Aquinas himself—that were condemned as heretical to the Catholic faith in 1277 by Bishop Etienne Tempier.

If there were ever an instance of philosophical irony in the Middle Ages, this would be it. Despite Henry’s strong aversion to skepticism, and despite his arguments against it, the most important practical effect of the Condemnation of 1277 was to introduce an entirely new level of skeptical doubt. The Condemnation emphasized God’s omnipotence, and declared views that denied this to be heretical. As a result, the realm of the possible was expanded dramatically in medieval discussions. This concern quickly spreads throughout most Christian epistemological discussions, up through the end of the Middle Ages. If God is omnipotent, according to this concern, couldn’t he be deceiving us either in particular cases, or perhaps even globally? For a fascinating discussion of the variety of responses one finds in the 13th and 14th century treatments of this problem, see Perler (2010).

4.2 Fourteenth Century

After the Condemnation of 1277, Christian philosophers became even more focused on epistemology. Debates often centered on the medieval distinction between intuitive cognition and abstractive cognition—roughly, the distinction between knowing something as present and existent, and knowing something from a remove (e.g., through memory, or through an inference). In addition, many philosophers began to explore the nature of sensory illusions in more detail. And of course, the Evil Demon hypothesis loomed ever larger as the notion of Divine Omnipotence was explored more fully.

4.2.1 John Duns Scotus

John Duns Scotus (1265–1308) worked in Oxford, Paris, and Cologne. Living roughly a generation before Ockham, Scotus was a follower of Aristotle, and as with many of his time, Avicenna too had a profound impact on the development of his thought. As far as skepticism is concerned, Scotus is unconvinced by Henry’s anti-skeptical arguments, but he thinks the threat of skepticism dangerous enough that he devotes considerable attention to arguing against the problem. Adams (1987) and Pickavé (2010) discuss his position in connection with skepticism.

In his Ordinatio I.3.1.4, Scotus finds Henry’s created exemplar/uncreated exemplar distinction insufficient for defeating skepticism. Scotus’ critique of Henry has two main foci: Henry’s appeal to mutability, and Henry’s need for an uncreated exemplar. First, Scotus finds numerous problems with Henry’s worries about change, and he argues that change as such does not prevent knowledge, and that even if it did, much of what we know is sufficiently stable to support our knowledge claims. In defense of his initial claim he argues, e.g., that our own mutability would make knowledge utterly impossible, if Henry’s views are correct. His second claim about change also receives support in various ways, most notably by his appeal to what he calls a nature (natura), which is (roughly) the essence of a thing. Here, he argues that since natures in themselves are immutable, and since each can have what Scotus calls an immutable relation to something else, we have sufficient grounds for stability-based certainty.

Henry’s appeal to an uncreated exemplar to ground knowledge and certainty is also problematic, according to Scotus. If we understand the created exemplar as a species (roughly, an image or intentional object) formed in the soul during an act of cognition, then we are often unsure whether that created exemplar existing in the soul truly corresponds to an extramental object. Thus,

…if it cannot be judged when such a species represents itself as such and when it represents itself as an object, then [no matter] what else concurs with such a species, one cannot have [any] certitude by which the true may be distinguished from the truthlike. (Ordinatio I.

In other words, showing that the species in the soul corresponds to an uncreated exemplar—that is, a Divine Idea—does nothing to help us determine whether that species corresponds to something in the sensory world.

According to Scotus, God has created the world in such a way that knowledge is possible by means of his general, background illumination, which amounts, in Scotus’ view, to a natural process. With this in mind, we may now turn to an examination of Scotus’ positive view and its relation to skepticism.

Scotus holds that we have “necessary certitude” about four kinds of knowledge. The first type is knowledge of self-evident propositions (propositions per se notae)—such as ‘a whole is greater than its parts’—as well as knowledge of propositions derived syllogistically from them. This type of knowledge amounts to necessary, analytic truths, in his view: once one knows the terms that enter into such a proposition, and once those terms are combined into the proposition, one cannot help but assent. Scotus’ second type of knowledge is knowledge of our own contingent acts, including such propositions as ‘I am awake’ and ‘I am alive’. Scotus follows Augustine in holding that such knowledge is immune to skeptical attack because even if the senses are deceived, once these terms are grasped, we can know the truth about them in such propositional contexts.

Though much can be said about these types of knowledge, the most relevant discussions for our purposes deal with the remaining types. Our certitude here depends crucially on the following claim:

Whatever happens frequently through something that is not free, has this something as its natural per se cause. (Ordinatio I.

In other words, Scotus suggests a general inductive principle: whenever something occurs frequently over time, such repeatability cannot be due to chance. God has ordained that such regularities will occur, and thus we can reach a general principle based on those initial cases. Such regularities amount to natural occurrences, and thus require no appeal to special illumination.

Given this, his third type of certainty is discussed: what Scotus calls things knowable “through experience”—e.g., that “a certain species of herb is hot”. Such general claims, derived through our experience of numerous instances of the hotness of such herbs, are certain in virtue of the “non-free cause” principle above. Recognizing, however, that inductions don’t hold the same level of assurance that he is claiming for first two types of knowledge, Scotus backs off of his claim a bit later, calling it “the lowest degree of scientific knowledge”, and admitting that such inductions may only tell us that such regularities are “aptitudes”, not certainties (Ordinatio I.–111).

When Scotus begins discussing his fourth type of certainty—particular knowledge claims about the external world, known through the senses—he ignores this weakened conception of our senses’ reliability. Though later thinkers will be clearer in their indebtedness to the Condemnation of 1277 here, Scotus gives minimal notice of this. Instead, appealing again to his non-free cause claim, he gives explanations of two main types of such experience.

First, because it is often the case that different sense modalities agree in their judgment about an external object—e.g., when we can both touch and see the size of a ball—we have an induction of sorts running here, and thus we can infer that this regularity is enough to give us certainty regarding the object under consideration.

Second, in cases in which the sense modalities are not in agreement—either because one modality yields a different result than another modality, or because a single modality yields different results at different times—we can appeal to the intellect to adjudicate among them. Using his example, we know that a stick in water that appears broken cannot really be broken, because our intellect knows the truth of the claim ‘the harder object is not broken by the touch of something soft that gives way before it’ (Ordinatio I.–115). Thus, in such a case, we can discount the testimony of sight. Scotus makes a similar move regarding the apparent deception that occurs in dreams. In his view, “a person can tell when his faculty is disposed and when it is not”, and thus he can tell whether he is asleep or dreaming (Ordinatio I.–120).

4.2.2 Peter Auriol, William of Ockham, and Adam Wodeham

Peter Auriol (1280–1322) and William of Ockham (1285–1347) were contemporaries, though they took different paths both philosophically and ecclesiastically. Auriol spent most of his time at the University of Paris, and eventually became an Archbishop before his untimely death. Ockham studied and taught at Oxford before being brought up on charges of heresy by the papal court in Avignon; he spent the last years of his life excommunicated from the Church, after having fled to Munich. Though there is no evidence of the two having ever met, Ockham often argues against Auriol’s views in some detail. Adam Wodeham (ca. 1300–1358), who commented on both of their views, was the personal secretary of Ockham for a time, and worked at Oxford.

Auriol’s role in the history of skepticism is twofold, and he has been discussed in this connection most recently by Tachau (1988), Perler (1994), and Denery (1998). First, he develops an account of intuitive cognition that raises the possibility of sensory illusion; second, he discusses particular cases of sensory illusion in some detail in his Scriptum (prologue, q. 2 and d. 3, q. 14).

He begins by diverging from Scotus’s account of cognition. Scotus suggests that cognition of God, and cognition generally, can occur in one of two ways: either abstractively or intuitively. Intuitive cognition is meant to include a human’s more-or-less direct sensory experience of the external world. Abstractive cognition, on the other hand, is knowledge from a distance; it abstracts from the presence and existence of the thing, as when we remember a deceased acquaintance or perform astronomical calculations in a windowless room.

Auriol agrees with much of Scotus’s account of intuitive and abstractive cognition. Yet he imbues it with a psychological character that is absent in the latter’s work. For Auriol an intuitive cognition is had when one has the experience of something as if it is present and existent. It is even possible, in Auriol’s view, to have such a cognition when the thing itself is absent or non-existent. Auriol’s abstractive cognition, on the other hand, does not involve this experience or feeling of something’s presence and existence, even if the thing is both present and existent. For any given state of the extramental world, both abstractive and intuitive cognitions can occur. As a result, his position leaves him open to skeptical attack.

He realizes this possibility, and discusses many illusory experiences before developing a response. These illusory experiences include such stock examples as dreams, hallucinations, mirror images, the after-images of the sun, the bent appearance of a straight stick that is immersed in water, and the apparent motion of trees experienced by those traveling down a river. He also mentions such cases as the double image of a candle that appears when one’s eyes are distorted, the shimmering, changing appearance of colors on a dove’s neck, and most interestingly, the fiery circle that appears when a burning stick is whirled rapidly through the air. Though Auriol’s discussion stresses some experiences more than others, his basic point is that failing to identify such events as intuitive cognitions amounts to the assertion that “all things that appear, are” (Scriptum 3.14.697).

Auriol responds to these challenges by distinguishing between real being (esse reale) and apparent being (esse apparens). This distinction has perplexed most readers of Auriol, and there is considerable disagreement about how to interpret it. Even so, it is generally agreed that real being is what the object has independently of any perceiver, and also that whatever it is that is meant by esse apparens, it is to be identified with a mental or sensory appearance of some sort. Some scholars (e.g., Tachau) read Auriol as a representationalist, which of course does little to solve the skeptical problem; others (e.g., Perler) see him as a direct realist. Whatever the answer in this particular case, Auriol is no skeptic. Not only does he believe that we can know external objects; we also know many self-evident propositions with certainty (logical truths, e.g.). For more on this aspect of Auriol’s thought, see Bolyard (2000).

William of Ockham considers Auriol’s perceptual problems, but he concludes that they are not a serious threat. On his view, our perceptual process (which occurs by means of intuitive cognitions) is such that it is infallible: for any such intuitive cognition, if it is of a thing that exists, we will know this fact, and if it is not, we will know this as well. He holds this view even given the possibility that God is deceiving us about such perceptions (e.g., by destroying the object while maintaining the perception of it).

Adam Wodeham disagrees with Ockham on this point; for him, there is no clear mark by which we can distinguish a true perception from a false one in the case of a deceptive God. Nevertheless, he holds that our perceptual process is generally reliable despite these problems. For more on Ockham and Wodeham, see especially Karger (2004), Panaccio and Piché (2010), and Wood (2003); Adams (1987) and Tachau (1988) also discuss their skeptical and anti-skeptical views.

4.2.3 William Crathorn

William Crathorn (fl. 1330) was not considered by his contemporaries or later medieval commentators to be of the stature of such thinkers as Aquinas, Henry of Ghent, Scotus, or Ockham; still, his views give a window into some of the skeptical worries extant at the time. He worked at Oxford, flourishing in the generation after Scotus, and during the time of Ockham. Tachau (1988) and Pasnau (1997) discuss his views.

In his Questions on the First Book of Lombard’s Sentences, q.1, the Condemnation-inspired acknowledgment of God’s omnipotence generates and reinforces many skeptical problems for Crathorn. In response, Crathorn uses God to bring himself back from the skeptical abyss. Though not as rhetorically compelling as Descartes’ analogous moves in the Meditations, the philosophical similarities among the two are striking.

Crathorn also makes frequent appeal to God’s omnipotence and power to deceive us—nearly every page makes reference, directly or obliquely, to this possibility. A favorite non-epistemological example he uses concerns heat and fire: God, he repeatedly says, has the power to separate the heat from the fire that normally produces it. He also extends such divine powers to sensory cases. God, it seems, could maintain the vision of something even after that thing ceases to exist. And as he tells us later, God’s power to do this is vast. Here, his example is that of the lighted, fiery circle we see when a torch is rapidly twirled through the air at night:

…if God were to preserve in your head for a whole year that circular color or another like it while no color existed externally, it would appear to you seeing that circular shape that you were seeing for the whole year a flaming circle and the color of a circular shape existing outside you—when nevertheless there was no such thing. (Questions I.98–99)

Similar examples are used to show that we can be deceived in other ways as well. Afterimages of colors can remain briefly after we’ve turned away from that which caused the initial color sensation. And it is within God’s power both to preserve a sensible species of color after destroying the thing, and even to create such a sensible species even when no extramental thing ever existed. And finally, he mentions dream skepticism. Unlike Scotus and most others who discuss this problem, Crathorn explains a case in which one who is awake thinks he is dreaming.

It is here that Crathorn begins to move us out of our skeptical position, by putting limits on God’s power to deceive. First, he shows us cases in which God’s power cannot extend to the logically contradictory: even God, Crathorn says, cannot make a stone think. Second, he agrees with Scotus that seeming claims (e.g., ‘I feel hot’) and standard self-evident propositions (e.g., ‘the whole is greater than its part’) cannot be doubted. Furthermore, he follows Augustine in arguing that this inference cannot be doubted: ‘I doubt that I exist; therefore, I exist’.

For more standard sensory skepticism, however, he combines the approaches offered by Henry and Scotus. By appealing to a self-evident proposition concerning God’s goodness, Crathorn tells us, we can show that external world skepticism is incoherent. A benevolent God would not systematically deceive us in this way.

4.2.4 Nicholas of Autrecourt and John Buridan

Nicholas of Autrecourt (ca. 1300–ca. 1350) and John Buridan (ca. 1295–1361) were contemporaries at the University of Paris. While Buridan maintained a good relationship with his ecclesiastical superiors, Nicholas did not: the latter’s works were condemned and publicly burned. Of particular interest in what survives are two of his Letters to Bernard of Arezzo. Recent discussions of Autrecourt’s views may be found in Beuchot (2003), Zupko (2003), and Grellard (2007).

In his First Letter, Autrecourt argues that Bernard’s views lead to an extreme form of skepticism. As he interprets the view, it would follow that intuitive cognitions cannot guarantee their own certitude: sensory illusions and the possibility of a deceptive God preclude this. But he goes further. As he explains, “you must say that you are not certain of your own acts, for example, that you are seeing or hearing”. Furthermore, “you are not certain whether anything appears to you at all” (First Letter 11). In short, one cannot be certain about any aspect of the external world, including even its very existence. And as he goes on to say, the existence of the past is equally uncertain, as is the very existence of one’s own mind.

Autrecourt’s Second Letter seeks to temper this skepticism, but only to a degree. According to him, the only things of which we can be certain are the principle of non-contradiction (i.e., “nothing both is and is not”) and other propositions that can be derived from this principle. He maintains a causal, proto-Humean skepticism about existential inferences: “From the fact that some thing is known to be, it cannot be inferred evidently, by evidentness reduced to the first principle, or to the certitude of the first principle, that there is some other thing” (Second Letter 11). As he continues, he says that the only substance of which we can possess evident knowledge is his own soul

Nicholas of Autrecourt espoused the most radical form of skepticism found at any point during the Middle Ages, and he was punished for it. Buridan, however, argues specifically against Autrecourt in his own works.

In his Questions on Aristotle’s Metaphysics II.1, for instance, Buridan discusses various skeptical challenges, including sensory illusion, dream skepticism, skepticism about induction, and Autrecourt’s causal skepticism. Again, the deceptive possibilities of an omnipotent God play a large role in his worries here.

In response, Buridan takes a few different approaches. First, as with Autrecourt, Buridan holds the principle of non-contradiction to be undeniable, as is every proposition that can be derived from it. But he also says that there is a “virtual infinity of self-evident principles through the senses, or through experience, or through the inclusion of terms without having to be proved by means of the first principle [i.e., non-contradiction]” (Questions II.1.147, Klima trans.). In addition, Buridan drops his epistemological standards for sensory knowledge in general: because of the possibility of God’s deceptiveness, at best we are capable of “conditional evidentness”. Similar reductions in standards occur in cases of induction, causation, etc. As he says, mathematical certainty is not expected in every subject. For more on Buridan and his broader intellectual context, see Zupko (2003), Grellard (2007), Lagerlund (2010b), and Karger (2010).

5. Concluding Remarks

Medieval Skepticism was not a movement. Rather, it was a series of (sometimes isolated) worries and responses to such skeptical problems as those outlined above. While some impetus for later discussions was gained from classical skeptical sources, for the most part medieval skepticism took its own path. Among the distinctly medieval additions to the debate were an emphasis on the certainty of self-knowledge, and especially on a widespread recognition across traditions that God’s omnipotence, and thus the possibility of Divine deceit on these grounds, provides a special challenge to the epistemology of anyone who holds a theistic worldview.

The fate of skepticism in the Renaissance and Early Modern Periods has been discussed widely, but connections between these later versions and those of their medieval antecedents have been less thoroughly studied. Heider (2016) explores skeptical themes in the “Second Scholasticism” of the 16th and 17th centuries. Thinkers such as Francisco Suárez, John Poinsot, and Francisco de Oviedo continue to treat the Scotistic/Auriolian/Ockhamist issue of the intuitive cognition of non-existent objects. They do not consider global skepticism a live threat, as Descartes does, and their accounts are thus closer to those of 13th and 14th century philosophers.

For an overview of the later history of the skepticism, with a focus on canonical Early Modern philosophers, see Popkin (2003).


Primary Texts and Translations

Note: Texts in this section are alphabetized according to the first name of later medieval Latin authors, according to scholarly convention. Hence “William of Ockham”, e.g., is listed in the Ws, not the Os.

  • Adam Wodeham, “The Objects of Knowledge,” in The Cambridge Translations of Medieval Philosophical Texts, Volume 3: Mind and Knowldege, R. Pasnau (ed. and trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002, pp. 318–351.
  • –––, Opera Theologica (10 vols.), G. Gál, et al. (eds.), Franciscan Institute, 1967–1988.
  • Al-Ghazali, Al-Munqidh min adalal (Errerur et délivrance) (2nd ed.), F. Jabre (ed. and trans.), Beirut: Commission Libanaise pour la Traduction des Chefes-d’oeuvres, 1969.
  • –––, The Incoherence of thePhilosophers / Tahafut al-falasifa, a Parallel English-Arabic Text, M. E. Marmura (ed. and trans.), Provo, Utah: Brigham Young University Press, 1997.
  • –––, “The Rescuer from Error”, in Medieval Islamic Philosophical Writings, M. A. Khalidi (trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2005, pp. 59–98.
  • Al-Haytham, The Optics of Ibn Al-Haytham (2 vols.), A. I. Sabra (ed. and trans.), London: The Warburg Insitute, 1989.
  • –––, The Optics of Ibn al-Haytham, Books I-II-III: On Direct Vision. The Arabic text, edited and with Introduction, Arabic-Latin Glossaries and Concordance Tables, A. I. Sabra (ed.), Kuwait, National Council for Culture, Arts and Letters, 1983.
  • –––, The Optics of Ibn al-Haytham, Books IV-V: On Reflection and Images Seen by Reflection (2 vols.), A. I. Sabra (ed.), Kuwait, National Council for Culture, Arts and Letters, 1983.
  • Augustine, Against the Academicians and The Teacher, P. King (trans.), Indianapolis, Indiana: Hackett Publishing, 1995.
  • –––, On the Trinity, Books 8–15, G. Matthews (trans.), Cambridge University Press, 2002.
  • –––, Opera Omnia, in Patrologiae Cursus Completus, Series Latina, J.-P. Migne (ed.), Paris: 1844–1864, vols. 32–47.
  • Etienne Tempier, “Condemnation of 1277,” in Basic Issues in Medieval Philosophy (2nd ed.), R. N. Bosley and M. M. Tweedale (eds.), Broadview Press, 2006, pp. 47–50. [Partial translation].
  • –––, “Condemnation of 1277,” in Siger de Brabant et l’averroïsme latin au XIIIeme siècle (2nd ed.), P. Mandonnet (ed.), Institut Supérieur de Philosophie de L’Université de Louvain, 1908–1911, pp. 175–191.
  • Henry of Ghent, “Can a Human Being Know Anything?” and “Can a Human Being Know Anything Without Divine Illumination?” in The Cambridge Translations of Medieval Philosophical Texts, Volume 3: Mind and Knowldege. R. Pasnau (ed. and trans.), Cambridge University Press, 2002, pp. 93–135.
  • –––, Henrici de Gandavo Opera Omnia: Summa (Quaestiones Ordinariae), artt. I-V, G. A. Wilson (ed.), Leuven University Press, 2001.
  • John Buridan, “John Buridan on Scientific Knowledge,” in Medieval Philosophy: Essential Readings with Commentary, G. Klima (ed.), Blackwell, 2007, pp. 143–150.
  • –––, In Metaphysicen Aristotelis Questiones argutissimae (1588 ed.), reprinted as Kommentar zur Aristotelischen Metaphysik, Franfurt a. M.: Minerva, 1964.
  • John Duns Scotus, “Concerning Human Knowledge,” in Duns Scotus: Philosophical Writings, A. Wolter (ed. and trans.), Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing, 1987, pp. 96–132.
  • –––, Opera Omnia: Ordinatio (vols. I-VII), Civitas Vaticana: Typis Polyglottis Vaticanis, 1950-.
  • Nicholas of Autrecourt, Nicholas of Autrecourt, His Correspondence with Master Giles and Bernard of Arezzo. L. M. de Rijk (ed. and trans.), Leiden: Brill, 1994.
  • Peter Aureol, “Intuition, Abstraction, and Demonstrative Knowledge,” in The Cambridge Translations of Medieval Philosophical Texts, Volume 3: Mind and Knowldege, R. Pasnau and C. Bolyard (trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002, pp. 178–218.
  • –––, Scriptum super primum sententiarum (2 vols.), E. M. Buytaert (ed..), Franciscan Institute, 1952–1956.
  • Siger de Brabant, Écrits de logique, de morale et de physique, Philosophes Médiévaux 14, B. C. Bazán (ed.), Louvain: Publications universitaires/Paris: Béatrice-Nauwelaerts, 1974.
  • –––, Quaestiones in Metaphysicam, Philosophes Médiévaux 24, A. Mauer (ed.), Louvain: Publications universitaires/Paris: Béatrice-Nauwelaerts, 1983.
  • –––, “Some Judgments Are To Be Trusted,” in Basic Issues in Medieval Philosophy (2nd ed.), R. N. Bosley and M. M. Tweedale (eds.), Broadview Press, 2006, pp. 435–436.
  • William Crathorn, “On the Impossibility of Infallible Knowledge,” in The Cambridge Translations of Medieval Philosophical Texts, Volume 3: Mind and Knowldege, R. Pasnau (ed. and trans.), Cambridge University Press, 2002, pp. 245–301.
  • –––, Quästionen zum ersten Sentenzenbuch, F. Hoffman (ed.), in Beiträge zur Geschichte der Philosophie und Theologie des Mittelalters, NF 29, Münster: Aschendorff, 1988.
  • William of Ockham, “Apparent Being,” in The Cambridge Translations of Medieval Philosophical Texts, Volume 3: Mind and Knowldege, R. Pasnau (ed. and trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002, pp. 219–244.
  • –––, Opera Philosophica et Theologica (multiple vols.), Franciscan Institute, 1967–1989.

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