First published Tue May 18, 2004; substantive revision Fri Jul 21, 2017

Throughout history, suicide has evoked an astonishingly wide range of reactions—bafflement, dismissal, heroic glorification, sympathy, anger, moral or religious condemnation—but it is never uncontroversial. Suicide is now an object of multidisciplinary scientific study, with sociology, anthropology, psychology, and psychiatry each providing important insights into suicide. Particularly promising are the significant advances being made in our scientific understanding of the neurological and genetic bases of suicidal behavior (Stoff and Mann 1997, Jamison 2000, Joiner 2010, 228–236) and the mental conditions associated with it. Nonetheless, many of the most controversial questions surrounding suicide are philosophical. For philosophers, suicide raises a host of conceptual, moral, and psychological questions. Among these questions are: What makes a person’s behavior suicidal? What motivates such behavior? Is suicide morally permissible, or even morally required in some extraordinary circumstances? Is suicidal behavior rational? This article will examine the main currents of historical and contemporary Western philosophical thought surrounding these questions.

1. Characterizing Suicide

Surprisingly, philosophical difficulties emerge when we attempt to characterize suicide precisely, and attempts to do so introduce intricate issues about how to describe and explain human action. In particular, identifying a set of necessary and sufficient conditions for suicide that fits well with our typical usage of the term is especially challenging. A further challenge is that due to suicide’s strong negative emotional or moral connotations, efforts to distinguish suicidal behavior from other behavior often clandestinely import moral judgments about the aims or moral worth of such behavior. That is, views about the nature of suicide often incorporate, sometimes unknowingly, views about the prudential or moral justifiability of suicide and are therefore not value-neutral descriptions of suicide (Paterson 2003, 353, Cholbi 2011, 17–20). For example, Hitler, most people contend, was clearly a suicide, but Socrates and Jesus were not (though on Socrates, see Frey 1978). This illustrates that suicide still carries a strongly negative subtext, and on the whole, we exhibit a greater willingness to categorize self-killings intended to avoid one’s just deserts as suicides than self-killings intended to benefit others (Beauchamp & Childress 1983, 93–94).

Such conceptual slipperiness complicates moral arguments about the justifiability of suicide by permitting us to ‘define away’ self-killings we believe are justified as something other than suicide, whereas it would be desirable to identify first a defensible non-normative conception of suicide and then proceed to discuss the moral merits of various acts of suicide (Stern-Gillett 1987, Kupfer 1990). In other words, ‘suicide’ should not be equatable with wrongful self-killing in the way that ‘murder’ is equated with wrongful killing of another, lest we render ourselves unable to refer even to the possibility of a morally justified self-killing.

If a purely descriptive account of suicide is possible, where should it begin? While it is tempting to say that suicide is any self-caused death, this account is vulnerable to obvious counterexamples. An individual who knows the health risks of smoking or of skydiving, but willfully engages in these behaviors and dies as a result, could be said to be causally responsible for her own death but not to have died by suicide. Similarly, an individual who takes a swig of hydrochloric acid, believing it to be lemonade, and subsequently dies causes her own death but does not engage in suicidal behavior. Moreover, not only are there self-caused deaths that are not suicides, but there are behaviors that result in death and are arguably suicidal in which the agent is not the cause of her own death or is so only at one remove. This can occur when an individual arranges the circumstances for her death. A terminally ill patient who requests that another person inject her with a lethal dose of tranquilizers has, intuitively, died by suicide. Though she is not immediately causally responsible for her death, she appears morally responsible for her death, since she initiates a sequence of events which she intended to culminate in her death, a sequence which cannot be explained without reference to her beliefs and desires. (Such a case exemplifies voluntary euthanasia.) Likewise, those who die via ‘suicide by cop,’ where an armed crime is committed in order to provoke police into killing its perpetrator, are responsible for their own deaths despite not being the causes of their deaths. In these kinds of cases, such agents would not die, or would not be at an elevated risk for death, were it not for their initiating such causal sequences. (See Brandt 1975, Tolhurst 1983, Frey 1981, but for a possible objection see Kupfer 1990.)

Furthermore, many philosophers (Fairbairn 1995, chapter 5) doubt whether an act’s actually resulting in death is essential to suicide at all. Just as there can be attempted murders or attempted acts of deception, so too can there be ‘attempted’ suicides, instances where because of agents’ false beliefs (about the lethality of their behavior, for example), unforeseen factual circumstances, others’ interventions, etc., an act which might have resulted in an agent’s death does not.

Hence, suicidal behavior need not result in death, nor must the condition that hastens death be self-caused. Definitions according to which suicide occurs when a person acts knowing that her act will cause her own death (Durkheim (1897)) thus fail to capture how death is in some respect an aim of suicidal behavior. Second, what appears essential for a behavior to count as suicide is that the person in question chooses to die. Suicide is an attempt to inflict death upon oneself and is “intentional rather than consequential in nature” (Fairbairn 1995, 58). These conditions imply that suicide must rest upon an individual’s intentions, where an intention implicates an individual’s beliefs and desires about her action. (See Brandt 1975, Graber 1981 Tolhurst 1983, Frey 1978, O’Keeffe 1981, McMahan 2002, 455, Paterson 2003, Cholbi 2011, 20–31, Hill 2011) An intention-based account of suicide would say, roughly, that

  1. A person S’s behavior B is suicidal iff
    1. S believed that B, or some causal consequence of B, would make her death at least highly likely, and
    2. S intended to die by engaging in B.

This account renders the notion of suicide as self-inflicted attempted death more precise, but it is not unproblematic.

Condition (a) is a doxastic condition. It is meant to show that deaths (or increased risks for death) resulting from an individual’s act that causes death (or the risk thereof) are not suicides if the individual acts in ignorance of the relevant risks of her behavior (for example, when an individual accidentally takes a lethal dose of a prescription drug). At the same time, (a) accounts for cases such as the aforementioned terminally ill patient whose death is caused only indirectly by her request to die. Condition (a) does not require that S know that B will put her at a significantly greater risk for death, nor even that S’s beliefs about B’s lethality be true or even justified. Suicidal individuals sometimes have false beliefs about the lethality of their chosen suicide methods, greatly overestimating the lethality of over the counter painkillers while underestimating the lethality of handguns, for instance. An individual could believe falsely, or on the basis of inadequate evidence, that placing one’s head in an electric oven significantly increases one’s chances of dying, but that behavior is nonetheless suicidal. The demand that S believe that B makes death highly likely is admittedly inexact, but it permits us to navigate between two extreme and mistaken views. On the one hand, it implies that behavior which is in fact only marginally more likely to cause a person’s death is not suicidal (you are more likely to die driving your car than in your living room, but driving your car hardly qualifies as ‘suicidal’). On the other hand, to demand that S believe that B certainly or almost certainly will cause S’s death is too strict, since it will rarely be the case (given the possibility of intervening conditions, etc.) that B will necessarily cause S’s death, and in fact many suicidal individuals are ambivalent about their actions (Cholbi 2011, 31–35), an ambivalence which is in turn reflected in their selecting suicide methods that are far from certain to cause death. It also allows us to distinguish genuinely suicidal behavior from suicidal gestures, in which individuals engage in behavior they believe is not likely to cause their death but is nonetheless associated with suicide attempts, while in fact having some other intention (e.g., gaining others’ sympathy) in mind.

Condition (b), however, is far more knotty. For what is it to intend that death result from one’s behavior? There are examples in which condition (a) is clearly met, but whether (b) is met is more problematic. For instance, does a soldier who leaps upon a live grenade tossed into a foxhole in order to save his comrades engage in suicidal behavior? Many, especially partisans of the doctrine of double effect would answer ‘no’: Despite the fact that the soldier knew his behavior would likely cause him to die, his intention was to absorb the blast so as to save the other soldiers, whereas his death was only a foreseen outcome of his action. Needless to say, whether a clear divide exists between foreseen and intended outcomes is controversial, and critics raise the worry that almost any outcome can be described as foreseen (Glover 1990, ch. 6). (It is of course possible that whether death is foreseen or intended has no bearing on whether an act counts as suicide but still bears on whether that suicide is justified.) Some would argue that given the near certainty of his dying by jumping on the grenade, his death was intended, for even though death is not the justifying aim of his action and he may prefer not to die, his dying nevertheless has his endorsement in the circumstances in which he acts (Tolhurst 1983, Cholbi 2011, 26–31). A further complication is that current psychological evidence suggests that suicide is often an ambivalent act in which individuals who wish to die must nevertheless overcome the ordinary human fear of death (Cholbi 2011, 31–34, Joiner 2010, 62–70). Given this ambivalence, it may be difficult to determine precisely whether an act that poses an apparently lethal threat to the agent who performs it was in fact an act in which death was intended. When a person dies in such circumstances, it may prove difficult whether to classify the death as resulting from suicide (i.e., intentional self-killing) or as accidental. Such cases might indicate the need for a third category besides intentional suicide and accidental death (Cholbi 2007).

The essential logical difficulty here resides in the notion of intending to die, for acting so as to produce one’s death nearly always has some other aim or justification. That is, death is generally not chosen for its own sake, or is not the end of suicidal behavior. Suicidal behavior can have any number of objectives: the relief of physical pain, the relief of psychological anguish, martyrdom in the service of a moral cause, the fulfillment of perceived societal duties (e.g., suttee and seppuku), the avoidance of judicial execution, revenge on others, protection of others’ interests or well-being. (See Fairbairn 1995, ch. 9, for a taxonomy of the varieties of suicide.) Therefore, it is not the case that suicidal individuals intend death per se, but rather that death is perceived, rightly or wrongly, as a means for the fulfillment of another of the agent’s aims (Graber 1981, 56). In short, there do not appear to be any compelling examples of “noninstrumental” self-killings in which “the overriding intention is simply to end one’s life and there is no further independent objective involved in the action” (O’Keeffe 1981, 357). Nor does requiring that the individual wish to be dead (Fairbairn 1995, ch. 6) address this issue, since again, what one wishes is presumably not death itself but some outcome of death. Both the grenade-jumping soldier and the depressed individual may wish not to die insofar as they might prefer that their desires could be satisfied without dying or without putting themselves at the risk thereof. However, this is consistent with their willingly choosing to die in order to satisfy their aims.

Some (e.g., Beauchamp 1992, Cholbi 2011, 35–37) might wish to add a further condition to (a) and (b) above:

  1. S was not coerced into B-ing.

Yet again, both the concept of coercion and its applicability to instances of risky or self-harming behavior is unclear. Typically, coercion denotes interference by others. So, according to condition (c), a spy threatened with torture lest he relinquish crucial military secrets who then poisons himself did not die by suicide, some would contend, since the spy’s captors compelled him to take his life. However, one can imagine a similar situation in which the agent of “coercion” is not another person. An extremely ill patient may opt to take his own life rather than face a future fraught with physical pain. But why should we not say that this patient was ‘coerced’ by his situation and therefore did not die by suicide? Because of their desires, loyalties, and values, both the spy and the ill patient saw themselves as having no other alternative, given their ends, but to cause their own deaths. In both instances, what the individual has reason to do was modified by circumstances outside their control so as to make death a rational option where it previously was not. Thus, there does not appear to be grounds for restricting coercion only to interference by other people, since factual circumstances can be similarly coercive. Either any factor, natural, human, or otherwise, that influences an individual’s reasoning so as to make death the most rational option counts as coercion, at which point condition (c) hardly functions as a restriction at all, or cases such as the spy facing torture are suicides too and (c) is unnecessary. (See Tolhurst 1983, 113–115.) Nor is it obvious that coercion necessarily changes the nature of a coerced act. A person coerced into singing is nevertheless singing. Hence, an act that is otherwise suicidal remains suicidal even if it is coerced (Paterson 2003).

This brief attempt at conceptual analysis of suicide illustrates the frustrations of such a project, as the unclear notion of suicide is apparently replaced by equally unclear notions such as intention and coercion. We may be attracted to increasingly convoluted analyses of suicide (Donnelly 1998, 20) or accept that suicide is an ‘open textured’ concept instances of which are bound together only by weak Wittgensteinian family resemblance and hence resistant to analysis in terms of necessary and sufficient conditions (Windt 1981).

An alternative to providing necessary and sufficient conditions for suicidal behavior is to view it along a continuum. In the psychological sciences, many suicidologists view suicide not as an either/or notion but as a gradient notion, admitting of degrees based on individuals’ beliefs, strength of intentions, and attitudes. The Beck Scale for Suicidal Ideation is perhaps the best example of this approach. (See Beck 1979.)

2. Highlights of Historical Western Thought

This section outlines the main currents of historical philosophical thought about suicide in ‘the West’ (Europe, the Middle East, and North America). Such an emphasis should not obscure the rich traditions of thought originating outside those geographical confines, however. Important thinkers from Africa, Asia, and the indigenous populations of the Western hemisphere took a philosophical interest in suicide. Little appears to unite philosophical thinking about suicide from these traditions aside from the fact that they are far less influenced by monotheism than is the Western tradition. Some of the ethical considerations concerning suicide raised in these traditions are also found in Western thought. For instance, the claim that suicide may violate ethical duties to others is addressed by Confucius, who primarily views the matter through the lens of filial piety (Confucius 2003). Others, for example the Jain practice of sallekhana, a type of spiritual fasting intended to hasten death, do not seem to have correlates in the Western tradition (Umaswati 1992). Unfortunately, the diversity of positions within the non-Western traditions preclude easy summation. Those interested in these traditions are urged to consult Battin (2015). (The online archive of Battin (2015) is particularly useful in this regard; users can search for philosophical writings on suicide based on geographic origin and intellectual tradition.)

2.1 Ancient and Classical Views of Suicide

Western philosophical discourse about suicide stretches back at least to the time of Plato. Still, prior to the Stoics at least, suicide tended to get sporadic rather than systematic attention from philosophers in the ancient Mediterranean world. As John Cooper has noted (Cooper 1989, 10), neither ancient Greek nor Latin had a single word that aptly translates our ‘suicide,’ even though most of the ancient city-states criminalized self-killing.

Plato explicitly discussed suicide in two works. First, in Phaedo, Socrates expresses guarded enthusiasm for the thesis, associated with the Pythagoreans, that suicide is always wrong because it represents our releasing ourselves (i.e., our souls) from a “guard-post” (i.e., our bodies) the gods have placed us in as a form of punishment (Phaedo 61b-62c). Later, in the Laws, Plato claimed that suicide is disgraceful and its perpetrators should be buried in unmarked graves. However, Plato recognized four exceptions to this principle: (1) when one’s mind is morally corrupted and one’s character can therefore not be salvaged (Laws IX 854a3–5), (2) when the self-killing is done by judicial order, as in the case of Socrates, (3) when the self-killing is compelled by extreme and unavoidable personal misfortune, and (4) when the self-killing results from shame at having participated in grossly unjust actions (Laws IX 873c-d). Suicide under these circumstances can be excused, but, according to Plato, it is otherwise an act of cowardice or laziness undertaken by individuals too delicate to manage life’s vicissitudes. Aristotle’s only discussion of suicide (Nicomachean Ethics 1138a5–14) occurs in the midst of a discussion of the possibility of treating oneself unjustly. Aristotle concludes that self-killing does not treat oneself unjustly so long as it is done voluntarily because the harm done to oneself is consensual. He concludes that suicide is somehow a wrong to the state or the community, though he does not outline the nature of this wrong or the specific vices that suicidal individuals exhibit.

To contemporary readers, the most striking feature of Plato’s and Aristotle’s texts on suicide is their relative absence of concern for individual well-being or rights. Both limit the justifications for suicide largely to considerations about an individual’s social roles and obligations. In contrast, the Stoics held that whenever the means to living a naturally flourishing life are not available to us, suicide may be justified, regardless of the character or virtue of the individual in question. Our natures require certain “natural advantages” (e.g., physical health) in order for us to be happy, and a wise person who recognizes that such advantages may be lacking in her life sees that ending her life neither enhances nor diminishes her moral virtue.

When a man’s circumstances contain a preponderance of things in accordance with nature, it is appropriate for him to remain alive; when he possesses or sees in prospect a majority of the contrary things, it is appropriate for him to depart from life…. Even for the foolish, who are also miserable, it is appropriate for them to remain alive if they possess a predominance of those things which we pronounce to be in accordance with nature (Cicero, III, 60–61).

Hence, not only may concerns related to one’s obligations to others justify suicide, but one’s own private good is relevant too. The Roman Stoic Seneca, who was himself compelled to engage in suicide, was even bolder, claiming that since “mere living is not a good, but living well”, a wise person “lives as long as he ought, not as long as he can.” For Seneca, it is the quality, not the quantity, of one’s life that matters.

2.2 The Christian Prohibition

The advent of institutional Christianity was perhaps the most important event in the philosophical history of suicide, for Christian doctrine has by and large held that suicide is morally wrong, despite the absence of clear Scriptural guidance regarding suicide. Although the early church fathers opposed suicide, St. Augustine is generally credited with offering the first justification of the Christian prohibition on suicide (Amundsen 1989). He saw the prohibition as a natural extension of the fifth commandment:

God’s command ‘Thou shalt not kill,’ is to be taken as forbidding self-destruction, especially as it does not add ‘thy neighbor’, as it does when it forbids false witness, ‘Thou shalt not bear false witness against thy neighbor.’ (Augustine, book I, chapter 20)

Suicide, Augustine determined, was an unrepentable sin. St. Thomas Aquinas later defended this prohibition on three grounds. (1) Suicide is contrary to natural self-love, whose aim is to preserve us. (2) Suicide injures the community of which an individual is a part. (3) Suicide violates our duty to God because God has given us life as a gift and in taking our lives we violate His right to determine the duration of our earthly existence (Aquinas 1271, part II, Q64, A5). This conclusion was codified in the medieval doctrine that suicide nullified human beings’ relationship to God, for our control over our body was limited to usus (possession, employment) where God retained dominium (dominion, authority). Law and popular practice in the Middle Ages sanctioned the desecration of the suicidal corpse, along with confiscation of the individual’s property and denial of Christian burial.

The rediscovery of numerous texts of classical antiquity was one of the spurs of the Renaissance, but for the most part, Renaissance intellectuals generally affirmed the Church’s opposition to suicide and were not sympathetic to the more permissive attitudes toward suicide found among the ancient pagans. Two intriguing sixteenth century exceptions were Thomas More and Michel de Montaigne. In his Utopia, More appears to recommend voluntary suicide for those suffering from painful and incurable diseases, though the satirical and fantastical tone of that work makes it doubtful that More supported this proposal in reality. In his Essais, Montaigne relates several anecdotes of individuals taking their own lives and intersperses these anecdotes with quotations from Roman writers praising suicide. While his general skepticism prevented Montaigne from staking out a firm moral position on suicide, he gives only a nod to the orthodox Christian position and conceptualizes the issue not in traditional theological terms but as a matter of personal judgment or conscience (Minois 1999, 89–92).

The Protestant Reformers, including Calvin, condemned suicide as roundly as did the established Church, but held out the possibility of God treating suicide mercifully and permitting repentance. Interest in moral questions concerning suicide was particularly strong in this period among England’s Protestants, notably the Puritans (Sprott 1961). Nonetheless, the traditional Christian view prevailed well into the late seventeenth century, where even an otherwise liberal thinker such as John Locke echoed earlier Thomistic arguments, claiming that though God bestowed upon us our natural personal liberty, that liberty does not include the liberty to destroy oneself (Locke 1690, ch. 2, para. 6).

In all likelihood, the first comprehensive modern defense of suicide was John Donne’s Biathanatos (c. 1607). Not intended for publication, Biathanatos drew upon an array of classical and modern legal and theological sources to argue that Christian doctrine should not hold that suicide is necessarily sinful. His critique is in effect internal, drawing upon the logic of Christian thought itself to suggest that suicide is not contrary to the laws of nature, of reason, or of God. Were it contrary to the law of nature mandating self-preservation, all acts of self-denial or privation would be similarly unlawful. Moreover, there may be circumstances in which reason might recommend suicide. Finally, Donne observes, not only does Biblical Scripture lack a clear condemnation of suicide, Christian doctrine has permitted other forms of killing such as martyrdom, capital punishment and killing in wartime (Minois 1999, 20–21).

2.3 The Enlightenment and Modern Developments

Donne’s casuistical treatise was an early example of the liberalized Enlightenment attitudes of the 1700s. The Thomistic natural-law stance on suicide came under increasing attack as suicide was examined through the lens of science and psychology. Where Christian theology has understood suicide as “an affair between the devil and the individual sinner” (Minois 1999, 300), Enlightenment philosophers tended to conceive of suicide in secular terms, as resulting from facts about individuals, their natural psychologies, and their particular social settings. David Hume gave voice to this new approach with a direct assault on the Thomistic position in his unpublished essay “Of suicide” (1783). Hume saw traditional attitudes toward suicide as muddled and superstitious. According to the Thomistic argument, suicide violates the order God established for the world and usurps God’s prerogative in determining when we shall die. Hume’s argument against this thesis is intricate and rests on the following considerations:

  1. If by the ‘divine order’ is meant the causal laws created by God, then it would always be wrong to contravene these laws for the sake of our own happiness. But clearly it is not wrong, since God frequently permits us to contravene these laws, for he does not expect us not to respond to disease or other calamities. Therefore, there is not apparent justification, as Hume put it, for God’s permitting us to disturb nature in some circumstances but not in others. Just as God permits us to divert rivers for irrigation, so too ought he permit us to divert blood from our veins.
  2. If by ‘divine order’ is meant the natural laws God has willed for us, which are (a) discerned by reason, (b) such that adherence to them will produce our happiness, then why should not suicide conform to such laws when it appears rational to us that the balance of our happiness is best served by dying?
  3. Finally if by ‘divine order’ is meant simply that which occurs according to God’s consent, then God appears to consent to all our actions (since an omnipotent God can presumably intervene in our acts at any point) and no distinction exists between those of our actions to which God consents and those to which He does not. If God has placed us upon the Earth like a “sentinel,” then our choosing to leave this post and take our lives occurs as much with his cooperation as with any other act we perform.

Furthermore, suicide does not necessarily violate any duties toward other people, according to Hume. Reciprocity may require that we benefit society in exchange for the benefits it provides, but surely such reciprocity reaches its limit when by living we provide only a “frivolous advantage” to society at the expense of significant harm or suffering for ourselves. In more extreme situations, we are actually burdens to others, in which case our deaths are not only “innocent, but laudable.”

Finally, Hume rejects the thesis that suicide violates our duties to self. Sickness, old age, and other misfortunes can make life sufficiently miserable that continued existence is worse than death. As to worries that people are likely to attempt to take their lives capriciously, Hume replies that our natural fear of death ensures that only after careful deliberation and assessment of our future prospects will we have the courage and clarity of mind to kill ourselves.

In the end, Hume concludes that suicide “may be free of imputation of guilt and blame.” His position is largely utilitarian, allied with a strong presumption of personal liberty. The Enlightenment was of course not univocal in its comparatively permissive attitudes toward suicide. The most noteworthy opponent of suicide in this period was Immanuel Kant. Kant’s arguments, though they reflect earlier natural law arguments, draw upon his view of moral worth as emanating from the autonomous rational wills of individuals (Cholbi 2000, 2010). For Kant, our rational wills are the source of our moral duty, and it is therefore a kind of practical contradiction to suppose that the same will can permissibly destroy the very body that carries out its volitions and choices. Given the distinctive worth of an autonomous rational will, suicide is an attack on the very source of moral authority.

To annihilate the subject of morality in one’s person is to root out the existence of morality itself from the world as far as one can, even though morality is an end in itself. Consequently, disposing of oneself as a mere means to some discretionary end is debasing humanity in one’s person… (Kant 423)

(For a contemporary expression of this Kantian view of suicide, see Velleman 1999.)

The nineteenth and early twentieth centuries brought several developments that, while not explicitly philosophical, have shaped philosophical thought about suicide. The first was the emergence, in novels by Rousseau, Goethe, and Flaubert, of a Romantic idealized ‘script’ for suicide, according to which suicide was the inevitable response of a misunderstood and anguished soul jilted by love or shunned by society (Lieberman 2003). The second was the emergence of psychiatry as an autonomous discipline, populated by experts capable of diagnosing and treating melancholy, hysteria and other ailments responsible for suicide. Lastly, largely thanks to the work of sociologists such as Durkheim and Laplace, suicide was increasingly viewed as a social ill reflecting widespread alienation, anomie, and other attitudinal byproducts of modernity. In many European nations, the rise in suicide rates was thought to signal a cultural decline. These latter two developments made suicide prevention a bureaucratic and medical preoccupation, leading to a wave of institutionalization for suicidal persons. All three conspired to suggest that suicide is caused by impersonal social or psychological forces rather than by the agency of individuals.

3. The Morality and Rationality of Suicide

3.1 Moral Permissibility

The principal moral issue surrounding suicide has been

  1. Are there conditions under which suicide is morally justified, and if so, which conditions?

Several important historical answers to (1) have already been mentioned.

This question should be distinguished from three others:

  1. Should other individuals attempt to prevent suicide?
  2. Should the state criminalize suicide or attempt to prevent it?
  3. Is suicide ever rational or prudent?

Obviously, answers to any one of these four questions will bear on how the other three ought to be answered. For instance, it might be assumed that if suicide is morally permissible in some circumstances, then neither other individuals nor the state should interfere with suicidal behavior (in those same circumstances). However, this conclusion might not follow if those same suicidal individuals are irrational and interference is required in order to prevent them from taking their lives, an outcome they would regret were they more fully rational. Furthermore, for those moral theories that emphasize rational autonomy, whether an individual has rationally chosen to take her own life may settle all four questions. In any event, the interrelationships among suicide’s moral permissibility, its rationality, and the duties of others and of society as a whole is complex, and we should be wary of assuming that an answer to any one of these four questions decisively settles the other three.

3.2 The Deontological Argument from the Sanctity of Life

The simplest moral outlook on suicide holds that it is necessarily wrong because human life is sacred. Though this position is often associated with religious thinkers, especially Catholics, Ronald Dworkin (1993) points out that atheists may appeal to this claim as well. According to this ‘sanctity of life’ view, human life is inherently valuable and precious, demanding respect from others and reverence for oneself. Hence, suicide is wrong because it violates our moral duty to honor the inherent value of human life, regardless of the value of that life to others or to the person whose life it is. The sanctity of life view is thus a deontological position on suicide.

The great merit of the sanctity of life position is that it reflects a common moral sentiment, namely, that killing is wrong in itself. The chief difficulties for the sanctity of life position are these:

First, its proponents must be willing to apply the position consistently, which would also morally forbid controversial forms of killing such as capital punishment or killing in wartime. But it would also forbid forms of killing that seem intuitively reasonable, such as killing in self-defense. To accept the sanctity of life argument seems to require endorsing a thoroughgoing pacifism.

Secondly, the sanctity of life view must hold that life itself, wholly independent of the happiness of the individual whose life it is, is valuable. Many philosophers reject the notion that life is intrinsically valuable, since it suggests, e.g., that there is value in keeping alive an individual in a persistent vegetative state simply because she is biologically alive. It would also suggest that a life certain to be filled with limitless suffering and anguish is valuable just by virtue of being a human life. Peter Singer (1994) and others have argued against the sanctity of life position on the grounds that the value of a continuing life is not intrinsic but extrinsic, to be judged on the basis of the individual’s likely future quality of life. If the value of a person’s continued life is measured by its likely quality, then suicide may be permissible when that quality is low (see section 3.5) (This is not to suggest that quality of life assessments are straightforward or uncontroversial. See Hayry 1991 for discussion).

Finally, it is not obvious that adequate respect for the sanctity of human life prohibits ending a life, whether by suicide or other means. Those who engage in suicidal behavior when their future promises to be extraordinarily bleak do not necessarily exhibit insufficient regard for the sanctity of life (Dworkin 1993, 238). To end one’s life before its natural end is not necessarily an insult to the value of life. Indeed, it may be argued that suicide may be life-affirming in those circumstances where medical or psychological conditions reduce individuals to shadows of their former fully capable selves (Cholbi 2002).

3.3 Religious Arguments

Two general categories of arguments for the moral impermissibility of suicide have emerged from the Christian religious tradition. The first of these is the aforementioned Thomistic natural law position, critiqued by Hume (see section 2.3) According to this tradition, suicide violates the natural law God has created to govern the natural world and human existence. This natural law can be conceived of in terms of (a) natural causal laws, such that suicide violates this causal order, (b) teleological laws, according to which all natural beings seek to preserve themselves, or (c) the laws governing human nature, from which it follows that suicide is ‘unnatural’ (Pabst Battin 1996, 41–48). These natural law arguments are no longer the main focus of philosophical discussion, as they have been subjected to strenuous criticism by Hume and others (though see Gay-Williams 1996). These criticisms include the following: (1) the natural law arguments cannot be disentangled from a highly speculative theistic metaphysics; (2) the claims of natural law are confuted by observations of human nature (e.g., the existence of self-destructive human behaviors casts doubt on the claim that we “naturally” preserve ourselves); and (3) other acts (e.g., religious martyrdom) which God is assumed not to condemn, also violate these natural laws, making the prohibition on suicide appear arbitrary.

The second general category of religious arguments rest on analogies concerning the relationship between God and humanity. For the most part, these arguments aim to establish that God, and not human individuals, has the proper moral authority to determine the circumstances of their deaths. One historically prominent analogy (suggested by Aquinas and Locke) states that we are God’s property and so suicide is a wrong to God akin to theft or destruction of property. This analogy seems weak on several fronts. First, if we are God’s property, we are an odd sort of property, in that God apparently bestowed upon us free will that permits us to act in ways that are inconsistent with God’s wishes or intentions. It is difficult to see how an autonomous entity with free will can be subject to the kind of control or dominion to which other sorts of property are subject. Second, the argument appears to rest on the assumption that God does not wish his property destroyed. Yet given the traditional theistic conception of God as not lacking in any way, how could the destruction of something God owns (a human life) be a harm to God or to his interests (Holley 1989, 105)? Third, it is difficult to reconcile this argument with the claim that God is all-loving. If a person’s life is sufficiently bad, an all-loving God might permit his property to be destroyed through suicide. Finally, some have questioned the extent of the duties imposed by God’s property right in us by arguing that the destruction of property might be morally justified in order to prevent significant harm to oneself. If the only available means to saving myself from a ticking bomb is to stash it in the trunk of the nearest car to dampen the blast, and the nearest car belongs to my neighbor, then destroying his property appears justified in order to avoid serious harm to myself. Likewise, if only by killing myself can I avoid a serious future harm to myself, I appear justified in destroying my life even if it is God’s property.

Another common analogy asserts that God bestows life upon us as a gift, and it would be a mark of ingratitude or neglect to reject that gift by taking our lives. The obvious weakness with this “gift analogy” is that a gift, genuinely given, does not come with conditions such as that suggested by the analogy, i.e., once given, a gift becomes the property of its recipient and its giver no longer has any claim on what the recipient does with this gift. It may perhaps be imprudent to waste an especially valuable gift, but it does not appear to be unjust to a gift giver to do so. As Kluge (1975, 124) put it, “a gift we cannot reject is not a gift”. A variation of this line of argument holds that we owe God a debt of gratitude for our lives, and so to kill ourselves would be disrespectful or even insulting to God, (Ramsey 1978, 146) or would amount to an irresponsible use of this gift. Yet this variation does not really evade the criticism directed at the first version: Even if we owe God a debt of gratitude, disposing of our lives does not seem inconsistent with our expressing gratitude for having lived at all (Beauchamp 1992). Furthermore, if a person’s life is rife with misery and unhappiness, it is far from clear that she owes God much in the way of gratitude for this apparently ill-chosen “gift” of life. Defenders of the gift analogy must therefore defend the claim that life, simply because it is given to us by a loving God, is an expression of God’s benevolent nature and is therefore necessarily a benefit to us (Holley 1989, 113–114).

In addition, there is a less recognized undercurrent of religious thought that favors suicide. For example, suicide permits us to reunite with deceased loved ones, allows those who have been absolved of sin to assure their entrance to heaven, and releases the soul from the bondage of the body. In both Christian and Asian religious traditions, suicide holds the promise of a vision of, or union with, the divine (Pabst Battin 1996, 53–64).

3.4 Libertarian Views and the Right to Suicide

For libertarians, suicide is morally permissible because individuals enjoy a right to suicide. (It does not of course follow that suicide is necessarily rational or prudent.) Libertarianism, which has historical precedent in the Stoics and in Schopenhauer, is strongly associated with the ‘anti-psychiatry’ movement of the last half century. According to that movement, attempts by the state or by the medical profession to interfere with suicidal behavior are essentially coercive attempts to pathologize morally permissible exercises of individual freedom (Szasz 2002).

Libertarianism typically asserts that the right to suicide is a right of noninterference, to wit, that others are morally barred from interfering with suicidal behavior. Some assert the stronger claim that the right to suicide is a liberty right, such that individuals have no duty to forego suicide (i.e., that suicide violates no moral duties), or a claim right, according to which other individuals may be morally obliged not only not to interfere with a person’s suicidal behavior but to assist in that behavior. (See the entry on rights.) Our having a claim right to suicide implies that we also have rights of noninterference and of liberty and is a central worry about physician-assisted suicide (Pabst Battin 1996, 163–164). Since whether we have a liberty right to suicide concerns whether it violates other moral obligations, including obligations to other people, I shall leave discussion of that issue to section 3.5 and focus here on whether there is a right of noninterference. (Whether suicidal individuals have a claim right to others’ assistance is addressed in section 3.8.)

A popular basis supporting a right to suicide is the idea that we own our bodies and hence are morally permitted to dispose of them as we wish. (Recall from section 3.3 that some religious arguments for the impermissibility of suicide depend on God’s ownership of our bodies.) On this view, our relationship to our bodies is like that of our relationship to other items over which we enjoy property rights: Just as our having a right to a wristwatch permits us to use, improve, and dispose of it as we wish, so too does our having a right to our bodies permit us to dispose of them as we see fit. Consequently, since property rights are exclusive (i.e., our having property rights to a thing prohibits others from interfering with it), others may not interfere with our efforts to end our lives. The notion of self-ownership invoked in this argument is quite murky though. What enables us to own ordinary material items is their metaphysical distinctness from us (Cholbi 2011, 84–86). We can own a wristwatch only because it is distinct from us. Materialist philosophers, who hold that we are identical to our bodies, would deny that our bodies are distinct from ourselves, and even under the most dualistic views of human nature, our selves are sufficiently dependent upon our bodies to make ownership of the body by the self an implausible notion. Indeed, the fact that certain ways of treating ordinary property are not available to us as ways of treating our bodies (we cannot give away or sell our bodies in any literal sense) suggests that self-ownership may be only a metaphor meant to capture a deeper moral relationship (Kluge 1975, 119). In addition, uses of one’s property, including its destruction, can be harmful to others. Thus, in cases where suicide may harm others, we may be morally required to refrain from suicide. (See section 3.5 for arguments concerning duties to others.)

Another rationale for a right of noninterference is the claim that we have a general right to decide those matters that are most intimately connected to our well-being, including the duration of our lives and the circumstances of our deaths. On this view, the right to suicide follows from a deeper right to self-determination, a right to shape the circumstances of our lives so long as we do not harm or imperil others (Cholbi 2011, 88–89). As presented in the “death with dignity” movement, the right to suicide is the natural corollary of the right to life. That is, because individuals have the right not to be killed by others, the only person with the moral right to determine the circumstances of a person’s death is that person herself and others are therefore barred from trying to prevent a person’s efforts at self-inflicted death.

This position is open to at least two objections. First, it does not seem to follow from having a right to life that a person has a right to death, i.e., a right to take her own life. Because others are morally prohibited from killing me, it does not follow that I am permitted to kill me. This conclusion is made stronger if the right to life is inalienable, since in order for me to kill myself, I must first renounce my inalienable right to life, which I cannot do (Feinberg 1978). It is at least possible that no one has the right to determine the circumstances of a person’s death! Furthermore, as with the property-based argument, the right to self-determination is presumably circumscribed by the possibility of harm to others.

3.5 Social, Utilitarian, and Role-Based Arguments

A fourth approach to the question of suicide’s permissibility asks not whether others may interfere with suicidal behavior but whether we have a liberty right to suicide, whether, that is, suicide violates any moral duties to others. Those who argue that suicide can violate our duties to others generally claim that suicide can harm either specific others (family, friends, etc.) or is a harm to the community as a whole.

No doubt the suicide of a family member or loved one produces a number of harmful psychological and economic effects. In addition to the usual grief, suicide “survivors” confront a complex array of feelings. Various forms of guilt are quite common, such as that arising from (a) the belief that one contributed to the suicidal person’s anguish, or (b) the failure to recognize that anguish, or (c) the inability to prevent the suicidal act itself. Suicide also leads to rage, loneliness, and awareness of vulnerability in those left behind. Indeed, the sense that suicide is an essentially selfish act dominates many popular perceptions of suicide (Fedden 1938, 209). Still, some of these reactions may be due to the strong stigma and shame associated with suicide, in which case these reactions cannot, without logical circularity, be invoked in arguments that suicide is wrong because it produces these psychological reactions (Pabst Battin 1996, 68–69). Suicide can also cause clear economic or material harm, as when the suicidal person leaves behind dependents unable to support themselves financially. Suicide can therefore be understood as a violation of the distinctive “role obligations” applicable to spouses, parents, caretakers, and loved ones. However, even if suicide is harmful to family members or loved ones, this does not support an absolute prohibition on suicide, since some suicides will not leave survivors, and among those that do, the extent of these harms is likely to differ such that the stronger these relationships are, the more harmful suicide is and the more likely it is to be morally wrong. Besides, from a utilitarian perspective, these harms would have to be weighed against the harms done to the would-be suicide by continuing to live a difficult or painful life. At most, the argument that suicide is a harm to family and to loved ones establishes that it is sometimes wrong (Cholbi 2011, 62–64).

A second brand of social argument echoes Aristotle in asserting that suicide is a harm to the community or the state. One general form such arguments take is that because a community depends on the economic and social productivity of its members, its members have an obligation to contribute to their society, an obligation clearly violated by suicide (Pabst Battin 1996, 70–78, Cholbi 2011, 58–60). For example, suicide denies a society the labor provided by its members, or in the case of those with irreplaceable talents such as medicine, art, or political leadership, the crucial goods their talents enable them to provide. Another version states that suicide deprives society of whatever individuals might contribute to society morally (by way of charity, beneficence, moral example, etc.) Still, it is difficult to show that a society has a moral claim on its members’ labor, talents, or virtue that compels its members to contribute to societal well-being no matter what. After all, individuals often fail to contribute as much as they might in terms of their labor or special talents without incurring moral blame. It does not therefore seem to be the case that individuals are morally required to benefit society in whatever way they are capable, regardless of the harms to themselves. Again, this line of argument appears to show at most only that suicide is sometimes wrong, namely, when the benefit (in terms of future harm not suffered) the individual gains by dying is less than the benefits she would deny to society by dying.

A modification of this argument claims that suicide violates a person’s duty of reciprocity to society (Cholbi 2011, 60–62). On this view, an individual and the society in which she lives stand in a reciprocal relationship such that in exchange for the goods the society has provided to the individual, the individual must continue to live in order to provide her society with the goods that relationship demands. Yet in envisioning the relationship between society and the individual as quasi-contractual in nature, the reciprocity argument reveals its principal flaw: The conditions of this “contract” may not be met, and also, once met, impose no further obligations upon the parties. As Baron d’Holbach (1970, 136–137) pointed out, the contract between an individual and her society is a conditional one, presupposing “mutual advantages between the contracting parties.” Hence, if a society fails to fulfill its obligations under the contract, namely to provide individuals with the goods needed for a decent quality of life, then the individual is not morally required to live in order to reciprocate an arrangement that society has already reneged on. Moreover, once an individual has discharged her obligations under this societal contract, she no longer is under an obligation to continue her life. Hence, the aged or others who have already made substantial contributions to societal welfare would be morally permitted to engage in suicide under this argument.

3.6 Suicide as a Moral Duty?

To this point, we have addressed arguments that concern whether a moral permission to engage in suicidal behavior exists, and indeed, it is this question that has dominated ethical discussion of suicide. Yet the social arguments against suicide are fundamentally consequentialist, and some act-utilitarians have discussed the correlative possibility that the good consequences of suicide might so outweigh its bad consequences as to render suicide admirable or even morally obligatory (Cosculluela 1995, 76–81). In fact, in some cases, suicide may be honorable. Suicides that are clearly other-regarding, aiming at protecting the lives or well-being of others, or at political protest, may fall into this category (Kupfer 1990, 73–74). Examples of this might include the grenade-jumping soldier mentioned earlier, or the spy who takes his life in order not to be subjected to torture that will lead to his revealing vital military secrets. Utilitarians have given particular attention to the question of end-of-life euthanasia, suggesting that at the very least, those with painful terminal illnesses have a right to voluntary euthanasia (Glover 1990, chs. 14–15, Singer 1993, ch. 7). Yet utilitarian views hold that we have a moral duty to maximize happiness, from which it follows that when an act of suicide will produce more happiness than will remaining alive, then that suicide is not only morally permitted, but morally required.

However, the thesis that there may exist a “duty to die” need not be defended by appeal to overtly consequentialist or utilitarian reasoning. In the course of articulating what he terms a “family-centered” approach to bioethics, the philosopher John Hardwig (1996, 1997) has argued that sometimes the burdens that a person imposes on others, particularly family members or loved ones, by continuing to live are sufficiently great that one may have a duty to die in order to relieve them of these burdens. Hardwig’s argument thus seems to turn not on the overall balance of costs and benefits that result from a person living or dying, but on the fairness of the burdens that a person imposes on others by continuing to live.

While generally acknowledging Hardwig’s suggestion that duties to others have been neglected in discussion of the ethics of suicide, critics of morally required suicide raise a number of objections to his proposal. (See Hardwig et al. 2000, Humber & Almeder 2000.) Some doubt that the duty of beneficence to which Hardwig appeals justifies anything stronger than a permission to take one’s own life when continuing to live is burdensome to others (Cholbi 2010b). Others worry that a moral requirement to engage in suicide raises the sinister and totalitarian prospect that individuals may be obliged to engage in suicide against their wishes (Moreland & Geisler 1990, 94, Pabst Battin 1996, 94–95). This worry may reflect an implicit acceptance of a variation of the sanctity of life view (see section 3.2) or may reflect concerns about infringements upon individual’s autonomy (see section 3.6). Other critics suggest that even if there is a duty to die, this duty should not be understood as a duty that entails that others may compel those with such a duty to take their lives (Menzel 2000, Narveson 2000). Questions about social justice and equality (whether, for example, especially vulnerable populations such as women or the poor might be more likely to act on such a duty) are also raised. One utilitarian response to these objections is to reject a duty to die on rule utilitarian grounds: Suicide would be morally forbidden because general adherence to a rule prohibiting suicide would produce better overall consequences than would general adherence to a rule permitting suicide (Brandt 1975, Pabst Battin 1996, 96–98).

3.7 Autonomy, Rationality, and Responsibility

A more restricted version of the claim that we have a right to noninterference regarding suicide holds that suicide is permitted so long as—leaving aside questions of duties to others—it is rationally chosen. In a similar vein, Kantians might claim that suicidal choices must be respected if those choices are autonomous, that is, if an individual chooses to end her life on the basis of reasons that she acknowledges as relevant to her situation. Such positions are narrower than the libertarian view, in that they permit suicide only when it is performed on a rational basis (or a rational basis that the individual acknowledges as relevant to her situation) and permits others to interfere only when it is not performed on that basis.

One initial challenge to the possibility of rational suicide rests on the notion that suicide, being a choice to end one’s life, is necessarily irrational. The thought here is that any coherent judgment of suicide’s rationality requires comparing the state of being alive (or continuing to live) with being dead. But either because no one has sufficient knowledge of the state of being dead (Devine 1978) or because suicide ensures that the suicidal person has no future to look forward to (Cowley 2006), judgments that ending one’s life is rational are incoherent or misplaced.

In recent years, this ‘two-state’ requirement (that death can only be judged rational or irrational if it is possible to compare the state of being alive with the state of being dead) has been widely rejected. In particular, the rationality of the decision to end one’s life need not be construed in terms of the value of being alive versus the value of being dead (Luper 2009, 82–88). What those contemplating ending their lives are considering are different durations of their lives, or as Richard Brandt put it:

The person who is contemplating suicide is obviously making a choice between future world-courses: the world-course that includes his demise, say, an hour from now, and several possible ones that contain his demise at a later point… The basic question a person must answer in order to determine which world-course is best or rational for him to choose, is which he would choose under conditions of optimal use of information, when all of his desires are taken into account. (Brandt 1975)

Hence, on this view, a rational judgment about one’s own death requires a comparison between the overall goodness of one’s life as it would be if it continued on its present course and the overall goodness of one’s life if that life ended before its present course. This view has given rise to a rich philosophical literature trying to identify the conditions under which a person’s decision to die is rational. For the most part, this literature divides the conditions for rational suicide into cognitive conditions, conditions ensuring that individuals’ appraisals of their situation are rational and well-informed, and interest conditions, conditions ensuring that suicide in fact accords with individuals’ considered interests.

Examples of this approach include Glenn Graber, who states that a suicide is rationally justified “if a reasonable appraisal of the situation reveals that one is better off dead.” (Graber 1981, 65). An appraisal is reasonable, according to Graber, if it results from a clearheaded assessment of how suicide would further or impede one’s overall interests, including one’s present and probable future values and preferences. Margaret Battin identifies three cognitive conditions for rational suicide (a facility for causal and inferential reasoning, possession of a realistic world view, and adequacy of information relevant to one’s decision), along with two interest conditions (that dying enables one to avoid future harms, and that dying accords with one’s most fundamental interests and commitments) (Pabst Battin 1996, 115).

For the most part, suicidal individuals do not manifest signs of systemic irrationality, much less the signs of legally definable insanity, (Radden 1982) and engage in suicidal conduct voluntarily. However, these facts are consistent with the choice to engage in suicidal behavior being irrational, and serious questions can be raised about just how often the conditions for rational suicide are met in actual cases of self-inflicted death. Indeed, the possibility of rational suicide requires that certain assumptions about suicidal individuals’ rational autonomy be true which may not be in many cases. A person’s choice to undertake suicidal behavior may not be a reflection of her considered interests and her self-inflicted death could be an act that she would, in calmer and clearer moments, recoil at. In other words, even if there is a right to suicide rooted in the value of rational autonomy, it seems to imply a right to suicide only when one makes that determination on minimally rational grounds, and there are numerous factors that may compromise a person’s rational autonomy and hence make the decision to engage in suicidal behavior not a reflection of one’s considered values or aims. Some of these factors cognitively distort agents’ deliberation about whether to engage in suicide. Though many suicidal persons engage in extensive planning for their own deaths, the final determination to end one’s life is often impulsive, reflecting the intense psychological vulnerability of suicidal persons and their proclivity toward volatility and agitation (Cholbi 2002, Joiner 2010, 70–84). Suicidal persons can also have difficulty fully acknowledging the finality of their death, believing that (assuming there is no afterlife) they will somehow continue to be subjects of conscious experience after they die.

Particularly worrisome is the evident link between suicidal thoughts and mental illnesses such as depression. While disagreement continues about the strength of this link (Pabst Battin 1996, 5) little doubt exists that the presence of depression or other mood disorders greatly increases the likelihood of suicidal behavior. Some studies of suicide indicate that over 90% of suicidal persons displayed symptoms of depression before death, while others estimate that suicide is at least 20 times more common among those with clinical depression than in the general population. In cases of suicide linked with depression, individuals’ attitudes toward their own death are colored by strongly negative and occasionally distorted beliefs about their life situations (career prospects, relationships, etc.). As Brandt (1975) observed, depression can “primitivize one’s intellectual processes,” leading to poor estimation of probabilities and an irrational focus on present suffering rather than on possible good future states of affairs. The suicidally depressed can also exhibit romanticized and grandiose beliefs about the likely effects of their deaths (delusions of martyrdom, revenge, etc.) Furthermore, suicidal persons are often hesitant about their own actions, hoping that others will intervene and signaling to others the hope that they will intervene (Shneidman 1985). Finally, although repeated suicide attempts by the same individual are common, the impulse to suicidal behavior is often transient and dissipates of its own accord (Blauner 2003). Taken together, these considerations indicate that the scope of suicidal conduct that genuinely manifests fully informed and rational self-evaluation may be rare and so only occasionally will suicide be rational or morally permissible. Moreover, if suicide is frequently not an expression of individuals’ rational appraisal of their own well-being, that suggests that others may have a prima facie reason to interfere with suicidal behavior and so is there is no general right to noninterference. (See section 3.7.)

3.8 Duties Toward the Suicidal

With the exception of the libertarian position that each person has a right against others that they not interfere with her suicidal intentions (Szasz 2002) each of the moral positions on suicide we have addressed so far would appear to justify others intervening in suicidal plans, at least on some occasions. Little justification is necessary for actions that aim to prevent another’s suicide but are non-coercive. Pleading with a suicidal individual, trying to convince her of the value of continued life, recommending counseling, etc. are morally unproblematic, since they do not interfere with the individual’s conduct or plans except by engaging her rational capacities (Cosculluela 1994, 35; Cholbi 2002, 252). The more challenging moral question is whether more coercive measures such as physical restraint, medication, deception, or institutionalization are ever justified to prevent suicide and when. In short, the question of suicide intervention is a question of how to justify paternalistic interference (Kleinig 1983, 96–104).

As mentioned in section 3.6, the impulse toward suicide is often sporadic, ambivalent, and influenced by mental illnesses such as depression, all indicators that suicide may be undertaken with less than full rationality. And while individuals usually have the right to make bad or irrational decisions on their own behalf, these indicators, when juxtaposed with the stakes of the decision to end one’s life (that death is irreversible, that continued life is a condition of all other goods, etc.), justify intervention in others’ suicidal plans on the ‘soft’ paternalist grounds that suicide is not in the individual’s interests as they would rationally conceive those interests. We might call this the ‘no regrets’ or ‘err on the side of life’ approach to suicide intervention (Martin 1980; Pabst Battin 1996, 141; Cholbi 2002). Since most situations in which another person intends to kill herself will be ones where we are unsure of whether she is rationally choosing to die, it is better to temporarily prevent “an informed person who is in control of himself from committing suicide” than to do “nothing while, say, a confused person kills himself, especially since, in all likelihood, the would-be suicide could make another attempt if this one were prevented and since the suicidal option is irreversible if successful” (Cosculluela 1994, 40). Further psychiatric or medical examinations may settle the matter regarding the rationality of the suicidal individual’s decision. The coerciveness of the measures used should be proportional to the apparent seriousness of the suicidal person’s intention to die (Cholbi 2011, 122–129).

Lastly, if there is sometimes a duty to prevent acts of suicide, is it ever morally permissible, or even morally obligatory, to aid others in ending their lives? (This possibility is directly related to physician-assisted suicide and the larger question of whether the right to suicide is a claim right.) If there are circumstances that justify our intervening to prevent suicide undertaken irrationally or contrary to a person’s self-interest, then the same paternalistic rationale would justify our helping to promote or enable those suicides that are rational and in accordance with a person’s self-interest.

Critics of a duty to assist in suicide assert that the widespread moral acceptance of aiding others in suicide invites the prospect of a ‘slippery slope,’ wherein assisted suicide becomes so commonplace that individuals (particularly members of vulnerable populations such as the aged, the disabled, or socially marginalized populations) for whom suicide is not rational could nevertheless be susceptible to various forms of abuse, manipulation, or undue pressure, By giving license for others to assist in suicides, critics allege, we may unwittingly permit them to encourage suicides not because those suicides are in fact in the best interests of the individual in question, but because those suicides advance the interests of other people or of institutions.(Pabst Battin 1996, 145–157). Whether such ‘slippery slope’ worries are warranted is an empirical matter, and existing studies of societies that have legalized assisted suicide by medical personnel do not provide unequivocal support for these worries (Cholbi 2011, 148–157).

3.9 Suicide, Virtue, and Life’s Meaning

Sections 3.1-3.8 largely address suicide as a question of interpersonal morality, that is, as a question about our duties to one another (though it should be noted that Kant’s opposition to suicide was rooted in his belief that it violates duties we owe to ourselves rather than duties we owe to others). However, suicide also raises what might be termed ethical questions, such as whether suicide exemplifies virtue. Bogen (1980) observes that even when we have adequately determined that a given act of suicide is morally permissible, questions remain about whether that act represents “the best way to live and to end one’s life.” A full normative account of suicide may thus require us to supplement the language of interpersonal obligation and rights with the language of virtues and vices: Under what conditions does an act of suicide exhibit such virtues as courage, generosity, or justice? Conversely, under what conditions does an act of suicide exhibit such vices as cowardice, selfishness, or rashness? While such questions are germane to whether suicide is defensible all things considered, they are infrequently addressed in the philosophical literature (though see van Zyl 2000; Hardwig 1997 can plausibly be read as claiming that continuing to live is sometimes selfish).

Suicide also raises other normative questions that are not obviously moral, such as how suicide may contribute to or detract from the meaningfulness of an individual’s life. For the twentieth century existentialists, suicide was not a choice to be made mainly by appeal to moral considerations but by analyzing whether suicide is an appropriate response to the absurdity or meaninglessness of the world and of human endeavor. Albert Camus illustrated this absurdity in his philosophical essay The Myth of Sisyphus. For Camus, Sisyphus heroically does not try to escape his absurd task of endlessly and futilely pushing a rock up a mountain, but instead perseveres and in so doing resists the lure of suicide. Suicide, Camus contends, tempts us with the promise of an illusory freedom from the absurdity of our existence, but is in the end an abdication of our responsibility to confront or defy that absurdity head on (Campbell and Collinson 1988, 61–70). Jean-Paul Sartre was likewise struck by the possibility of suicide as an assertion of authentic human will in the face of absurdity. Suicide represents, according to Sartre, an opportunity to stake out our understanding of our essence as individuals in a godless world. Questions of whether a life saturated with pain or suffering can be meaningful have also played a part in recent debates about the justification of assisted suicide (Little 1999, Varelius 2013).

4. Conclusion

As the foregoing discussion indicates, suicide has been and continues to be a rich field of philosophical investigation. Recent advances in medical technology are responsible for the extensive philosophical attention paid to one kind of suicide, euthanasia or physician-assisted suicide (PAS), while more “run-of-the-mill” suicide motivated by psychological anguish is somewhat overlooked. This is somewhat unfortunate: Euthanasia and physician-assisted suicide raise issues beyond those associated with other suicides, including the allocation of health care resources, the nature of the medical profession, the patient-physician relationship, and the prospect that allowing relatively benign forms of killing such as voluntary euthanasia of PAS will lead down a “slippery slope” to more morally worrisome killings. However, many of the same issues and concerns that surround PAS and euthanasia also surround run-of-the mill suicide, and many writers who address the former often disregard the vast literature on the latter. (In addition to the entry on voluntary euthanasia, Dworkin et al. 1998, Barry 2007, Pabst Battin 2003, and Cholbi 2011, 139–61, provide overviews of the moral debates surrounding euthanasia and PAS.)

Not only is suicide worthy of philosophical investigation in its own right, it is a source of insight for various philosophical subdisciplines: moral psychology, ethical theory, social and political philosophy, the metaphysics of personhood, and action theory. Suicide is also an area where philosophical interests intersect with those of the empirical sciences. The collective efforts of philosophers and others continue to illuminate one of the most enigmatic of human behaviors.


A. Historical (pre-1900) Works Cited

  • Aquinas, St. Thomas, 1273, Summa Theologica, in Basic Writings of Saint Thomas Aquinas, Anton Pegis (ed.), New York: Random House, 1945.
  • Aristotle, c. 330 BCE, Nicomachean Ethics, Roger Crisp (trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000.
  • Augustine, St., c. 413-426 CE, City of God, Gerald G. Walsh, Demetrius B. Zema, Grace Monahan, Daniel J. Honan (trans.), Garden City, N.Y.: Image Books, 1958.
  • Cicero, 45 BCE, De Finibus, H. Rackham (trans.), London: William Heinemann, 1914.
  • Confucius, 5th century BCE, Analects, E. Lang Harris (trans.), Indianapolis: Hackett, 2003.
  • Donne, J., 1608, Biathanatos, A Declaration of that Paradoxe, or Thesis, that Selfe-homicide is not so naturally Sinne, that it may never be Otherwise, London: Humphrey Moseley, 1648.
  • Durkheim, E., 1897, Le Suicide, Paris: G. Baillière.
  • d’Holbach, Baron, 1770, The System of Nature, or Laws of the Moral and Physical World, Volume 1, Robinson (trans.), New York: Burt Franklin, 1970.
  • Hume, D., 1783, Of Suicide, New York: Penguin, 2005. [Available online].
  • Kant, I., 1785, Metaphysics of Morals, M. Gregor (trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996.
  • Locke, J., 1690, Second Treatise of Civil Government in Locke’s Two Treatises of Government, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1960.
  • Montaigne, M., 1595, Essais Fortunat Strowski et al. (eds.), 5 vols., Bordeaux: Pech, 1906–1933.
  • More, T., 1516, Utopia, George Logan and Robert Merrihew (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002.
  • Plato, c. 340 BCE, Phaedo, David Gallop (trans.), Oxford, Oxford University Press, 1975.
  • –––, c. 340 BCE, Laws, 2 vols., R.G. Bury (trans.), New York: G.P. Putnam’s Sons, 1926.
  • Seneca, c. 60 CE, “On the Proper Time to Slip the Cable,” L. Annaei Senecae Ad Lucilium Epistulae Morales, L.D. Reynolds (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1965.
  • Umaswati, A., 2nd-5th centuries CE, Tattvartha Suttra, S.A. Jain (trans.), Reality: English Translation of Srimat Pujyapadacarya’s Sarvarthasiddhi, Jwalamalini Trust, 1992.

B. Works Cited, 1900–Present

  • Amundsen, D., 1989, “Suicide and Early Christian Values”, in Suicide and Euthanasia: Historical and Contemporary Themes, B. Brody (ed.), Dordrecht: Kluwer.
  • Barry, V., 2007, Philosophical Thinking about Death and Dying, Belmont: Wadsworth.
  • Beauchamp, T. and Childress, J., 1983, Principles of Biomedical Ethics, 2nd edition., New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Beauchamp, T.L., 1992, “Suicide”, in Matters of Life and Death, T. Regan (ed.), New York: McGraw-Hill.
  • Beck, A.T., Kovacs, M., and Weissman A., 1979, “Assessment of Suicidal Ideation: The Scale for Suicidal Ideation”, Journal of Consulting and Clinical Psychology, 47(2): 343–352.
  • Blauner, S.R., 2002, How I Stayed Alive When My Brain Was Trying to Kill Me: One Person’s Guide to Suicide Prevention, New York: HarperCollins.
  • Bogen, J., 1980, “Suicide and Virtue”, in Battin, M. and Mayo, D. (eds.), Suicide: The Philosophical Issues. New York: St. Martin’s.
  • Brandt, R., 1975, “The Morality and Rationality of Suicide”, in A Handbook for the Study of Suicide, S. Perlin (ed.) Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Campbell, R., and Collinson, D., 1988, Ending Lives, Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
  • Camus, A. 1975, The Myth of Sisyphus. New York: Penguin.
  • Cholbi, M., 2000, “Kant and the Irrationality of Suicide”, History of Philosophy Quarterly, 17(2): 159–176.
  • –––, 2002, “Suicide Intervention and Non-ideal Kantian Theory”, Journal of Applied Philosophy, 19: 245–259.
  • –––, 2007, “‘Self-manslaughter’ and the Forensic Classification of Self-inflicted Deaths,” Journal of Medical Ethics, 33: 155–157.
  • –––, 2010a, “A Kantian Defense of Prudential Suicide,” Journal of Moral Philosophy, 7: 489–515.
  • –––, 2010b, “The Duty to Die and the Burdensomeness of Living,” Bioethics, 24: 412–420.
  • –––, 2011, Suicide: The Philosophical Dimensions, Peterborough, Ontario: Broadview.
  • Cooper, J. M., 1989, “Greek Philosophers on Suicide and Euthanasia”, in Suicide and Euthanasia: Historical and Contemporary Themes, B. Brody (ed.), Dordrecht: Kluwer.
  • Cosculluela, V. 1994, “The Ethics of Suicide Prevention”, International Journal of Applied Philosophy, 9: 35–41.
  • –––, 1995, The Ethics of Suicide, New York: Garland.
  • Cowley, C., 2006, “Suicide Is Neither Rational Nor Irrational”, Ethical Theory and Moral Practice, 9: 495–504.
  • Devine, P.E., 1978, “On Choosing Death”, in The Ethics of Homicide, Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Donnelly, J., 1998, “Introduction,” in Suicide: Right or Wrong?, J. Donnelly (ed.), Amherst, N.Y.: Prometheus.
  • Dworkin, G., Frey, R.G., and Bok, S., 1998, Euthanasia and Physician-Assisted Suicide:For and Against, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Dworkin, R., 1993, Life’s Dominion, New York: Knopf.
  • Fairbairn, G., 1995, Contemplating Suicide: The Language and Ethics of Self-Harm, London: Routledge.
  • Fedden, H.R., 1938, Suicide: A Social and Historical Study, London: Peter Davies.
  • Feinberg, J., 1978, “Voluntary Euthanasia and the Inalienable Right to Life”, Philosophy and Public Affairs, 7 (1978).
  • Frey, R.G., 1978, “Did Socrates Commit Suicide?”, Philosophy, 53: 106–108.
  • –––, 1981, “Suicide and Self-Inflicted Death”, Philosophy, 56: 193–202.
  • Gay-Willliams, J., 1996, “The Wrongfulness of Euthanasia”, in Intervention and Reflection: Basic Issues in Medical Ethics, R. Munson (ed.), Belmont: Wadsworth.
  • Glover, J., 1990, Causing Death and Saving Lives, London: Penguin.
  • Graber, G.C., 1981, “The Rationality of Suicide” in Suicide and Euthanasia: The Rights of Personhood, S. Wallace and A. Eser (eds.), pp. 51–65., Knoxville: U. Tennessee Press.
  • Hayry, M., 1991, “Measuring the Quality of Life: Why, How and What?”, Theoretical Medicine, 2: 97–116.
  • Hardwig, J., 1996, “Dying at the Right Time: Reflections on Assisted and Unassisted Suicide,” in Ethics in Practice, H. LaFollette (ed.), New York: Blackwell.
  • –––, 1997, “Is There a Duty to Die?”, Hastings Center Report, 27: 34–42
  • Hardwig, J. et al., 2000, Is There a Duty to Die?:And Other Essays in Bioethics, New York: Routledge.
  • Hill, D.J., 2011, “What is It to Commit Suicide?”, Ratio, 24: 192–205.
  • Holley, D.M., 1989, “Voluntary Death, Property Rights, and the Gift of Life”, Journal of Religious Ethics, 17: 103–121.
  • Humber, J., and Almeder, R. (eds.), 2000, Is There a Duty to Die?, Totowa, NJ: Humana Press.
  • Jamison, K. R., 2000, Night Falls Fast: Understanding Suicide, New York: Vintage Books.
  • Joiner, T., 2010, Myths about Suicide , Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Kleinig, J., 1983, “Attempted Suicide”, in his Paternalism, Manchester: Manchester University Press.
  • Kluge, E.W., 1975, The Practice of Death, New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • Kupfer, Joseph, 1990, “Suicide: Its Nature and Moral Evaluation”, Journal of Value Inquiry, 24: 67–81.
  • Lieberman, L., 2003, Leaving You: The Cultural Meaning of Suicide, Chicago: Ivan R. Dee.
  • Little , M., 1999, “Assisted Suicide, Suffering, and the Meaning of Life”, Theoretical Medicine and Bioethics, 20: 287–298.
  • Luper, S., 2009, Philosophy of Death, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Martin, R.M., 1980, “Suicide and False Desires”, in Suicide: The Philosophical Issues, M. Battin and D. Mayo (eds.), New York: St. Martin’s.
  • Menzel, P.T., 2000, “The Nature, Scope, and Implications of a Personal Moral Duty to Die,” in Humber, J., and Almeder, R. (eds.), Is There a Duty to Die?, Totowa, NJ: Humana Press.
  • McMahan, J., 2002, The Ethics of Killing: Problems at the Margins of Life, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Minois, G., 1999, History of Suicide: Voluntary Death in Western Culture, Baltimore: Johns Hopkins University Press.
  • Moreland, J.P. and Geisler, N.L., 1990, The Life and Death Debate, Westport: Greenwood Press.
  • Narveson, J., 2000, “Is There a Duty to Die?” in Humber, J., and Almeder, R. (eds.), Is There a Duty to Die?, Totowa, NJ: Humana Press.
  • O’Keeffe, T.M., 1981, “Suicide and Self-Starvation”, Philosophy, 56: 349–363.
  • Pabst Battin, M., 1996, The Death Debate. Ethical Issues in Suicide, Upper Saddle River, NJ: Prentice-Hall.
  • –––, 2003, “Euthanasia and Physician-Assisted Suicide,” in H. LaFollette (ed)., Oxford Handbook of Practical Ethics, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2015, The Ethics of Suicide: Historical Sources, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Paterson, C., 2003, “On Clarifying Terms in Applied Ethics Discourse: Suicide, Assisted Suicide and Euthanasia”, International Philosophical Quarterly , 43(3): 351–358.
  • Radden, J., 1982, “Diseases as Excuses : Durham and the Insanity Defense”, Philosophical Studies, 42(3): 349–362.
  • Ramsey, P., 1978, Ethics at the Edges of Life, New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • Shneidman, E., 1985, Definition of Suicide, New York: Wiley & Sons.
  • Singer, P., 1993, Practical Ethics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 1994, Rethinking Life and Death, New York: St. Martin’s.
  • Sprott, S.E., 1961, The English Debate on Suicide from Donne to Hume, LaSalle, Ill.: Open Court.
  • Stern-Gillett, S., 1987, “The Rhetoric of Suicide”, Philosophy and Rhetoric, 20(3): 160–170.
  • Stoff, D.M. and Mann, J.J., 1997, “The Neurobiology of Suicide: From the Bench to the Clinic.” Annals of the New York Academy of Sciences, 836.
  • Szasz, T., 2002, Fatal Freedom: The Ethics and Politics of Suicide, Syracuse: Syracuse University Press.
  • Tolhurst, W.E., 1983, “Suicide, Self-sacrifice, and Coercion”, Southern Journal of Philosophy, 21: 109–121.
  • Tong, R., 2000, “Duty to Die,” in Humber, J., and Almeder, R. (eds.), Is There a Duty to Die?, Totowa, NJ: Humana Press.
  • van Zyl, L., 2000, Death and Compassion: A Virtue-based Approach to Euthanasia, London: Ashgate.
  • Varelius, J., 2013, “Ending Life, Morality, and Meaning”, Ethical Theory and Moral Practice, 16: 559–574.
  • Velleman, J.D., 1999, “Is There a Right of Self-Termination?”, Ethics, 109: 606–628.
  • Windt, P., 1981, “The Concept of Suicide”, in Suicide: The Philosophical Issues, M. Pabst-Battin and D.J. Mayo (eds.), London: Peter Owen.

C. Further Reading

  • Alvarez, A., 1982, The Savage God: A Study of Suicide. New York: Bantam.
  • Battin, M. and Mayo, D. (eds.), 1980, Suicide: The Philosophical Issues. New York: St. Martin’s.
  • Donnelly, J. (ed.), 1998, Suicide: Right or Wrong? Amherst, NY: Prometheus.
  • Hecht, J.M., 2013, Stay: A History of Suicide and the Philosophies Against It. New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • Joiner, T., 2005, Why People Die by Suicide. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • Maltsberger, J.T., and Goldblatt, M., 1996, Essential Papers on Suicide, New York: New York University Press.
  • Mayo, D., 1986, “The Concept of Rational Suicide”, Journal of Medicine and Philosophy, 2: 143–155.
  • Nagel, T., 1970, “Death”, Noûs, 4: 73–80.
  • Novak, D., 1976, Suicide and Morality: The Theories of Plato, Aquinas, and Kant and Their Relevance for Suicidology, Scholars Studies Press.
  • Shneidman, E.S., 1998, The Suicidal Mind, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

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