Supplement to Actualism

Background Assumptions for Plantinga's Account

There are several background assumptions that are required for Plantinga's solution to be adequate

(P1) Worlds are (maximal possible) states of affairs.

That is, Plantinga adopts the approach on which possible worlds are abstract states of affairs that actually exist but (in general) don't obtain. (See the supplement on an account of abstract possible worlds.) Plantinga thus avoids the first aspect of the possibilist challenge.

(P2) Properties are "first-class citizens"; that is, they are legitimate objects of reference and (first-order) quantification;

If individual essences are to play the role that possibilia play in Kripke's account, then, clearly, it must be possible to quantify over them directly with first-order quantifiers. Plantinga is a platonist — properties, propositions, and states of affairs are as real as any concrete particular, it's just that they are abstract. Hence, they can be quantified over no less than their concrete counterparts. The advantages of this move are clear. As noted above, Kripke's account fails to be actualist because it quantifies over possibilia in the metalanguage. By replacing possibilia with individual essences, quantifiers range over essences, and hence only over actually existing things.

(P3) Properties, propositions, and states of affairs all exist necessarily.

As noted in the main document, unlike (most, at least) concrete particulars, properties are necessary beings for Plantinga; it is not possible that there be a property that might fail to exist. Consequently, necessarily, any property that exists in any possible world exists in all possible worlds. (That is, in terms of Plantinga's actualist reconstruction of worlds, necessarily, if a property's existence is entailed by any possible world, it is entailed by all possible worlds.) It follows, in particular, that individual essences are necessary beings.

Why is (P3) needed? After all, in general, not all possibilia exist in every possible world in Kripke's semantics and hence, it would seem, they are not necessary beings; more formally, NE is not a logical truth in Kripke's system. However, the fact that NE fails in Kripke's theory is simply an artifact of his semantics for the quantifiers — quantifiers at a given world w range only over the things that exist in w, and hence, that NE is not a logical truth in Kripke's system only reflects the fact that not all possibilia exist in, i.e., are actual in, every possible world. However, all possibilia are in a clear sense there at each world all the same; Kripke could just as easily have defined the semantics of the quantifiers so that they ranged over all of them. (Indeed, in his original model theory, a 1-place predicate at a world w can have possibilia that do not exist in w in its extension.) He chose not to define the semantics of the quantifiers in this way simply to avoid validating BF, CBF, and NE and thus to have at least an actualistically acceptable proof theory. Thus, although there is no object language theorem expressing that possibilia are necessary beings, this is clearly an important metaphysical consequence of his semantics, and hence it needs to be reflected in Plantinga's solution.

The necessity of individual essences is still not enough, though. For if individual essences are to replace possibilia, then we must be assured that there are enough of them, that, crudely put, for "every possible individual" there is a corresponding individual essence. This is guaranteed by the following principle:

(P4) Necessarily, every object has an individual essence.

Copyright © 2014 by
Christopher Menzel <>

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