#### Supplement to Actualism

## Qualitative Essences and a Final Defense for Plantinga

There is one final possibility that Plantinga could pursue. On the assumption that all logically simple properties are general, say that a property (or proposition) is*purely qualitative*if it is either logically simple or logically complex but “constructed”from purely qualitative properties, relations, and propositions, that is, if it is the conjunction, negation, modalization, quantification, etc of purely qualitative properties, relations, and propositions. For example,

**being smaller than every other prime number**is a conjunction of the properties

**being a prime number**and the quantified property (expressed somewhat awkwardly)

**being something smaller than every prime number distinct from it**— in the notation of the lambda calculus: [λ

*x*(

*Px*& ∀

*y*((

*Py*&

*x*≠

*y*) →

*Sxy*))]. Again,

**being the father of something**is the existential generalization of one of the “argument places”of the

**father of**relation. By contrast, properties that “involve”a particular individual like

**being Quine**and

**being married to Xantippe**are not purely qualitative, as they involve the individuals Quine and Xantippe.

Now, there surely are some purely qualitative individual essences,
e.g., **being smaller than every other prime number**. However, the
only clear examples of such belong to necessary beings like the number
2. The real question is whether
*contingent* beings have purely qualitative essences. Adams [1979]
has argued convincingly that they do not. His central argument is that,
given any possible world **w**, there is a world Sym(**w**) that is
“symmetrical”with respect to **w**. The idea of symmetry
here is difficult to define precisely, but the intuitive idea is that
Sym(**w**) contains two parts, each of which is a sort of
“copy” of **w**. One of these copies — call
it **C1** — is (but for properties arising from the existence of
the other copy) identical to **w** in both qualititative and
nonqualitative respects, and in particular *contains exactly the same objects*as
**w**. The other copy — call it **C2** — is an exact
*qualitative replica* of **w**, i.e., a copy that is
indistinguishable from **w** in all qualitative respects (other than
those arising from the existence of **C1**). Every object in **C1**,
and hence in **w** thus has a qualitative
“doppelgänger” in **C2**, an exact replica that has
all of its purely qualitative properties. Given this, it seems that there
is a possible world **w**′ such that ym(**w**′) =
Sym(**w**), but where now **w**′ is identical with **C2**,
and where **C1** is the replica. It follows that, for every possible
world **w**, there is another world **w**′ that is
qualitatively identical with **w**, but which contains only
doppelgängers of the objects in **w**.

Now, one might argue that all that follows from the example is that,
for any object *x* and any world **w**
containing *x*, there is a distinct/object *y* in some
other world **w**′ that has all of *x*’s
qualitative *nonmodal* properties in
**w**. That is, Adams’ argument from symmetrical worlds only
makes plausible the idea that, necessarily, every object *x* has,
as one might say, a *de facto* doppelgänger, something
qualitatively identical to it with regard to the properties it just
happens to exemplify. It does not follow that, necessarily, there is a
*complete*, or *modal* doppelgänger *y* of
*x*, i.e., that, for any world **w** in which *x* exists, there is a
*de facto* doppelgänger of *x* with respect to
**w** such that, in every other world **w**′ in
which *x* exists, there is a world **w**″ such
that *y* is a *de facto* doppelgänger
in **w**″ of *x* with respect to **w**′, and
furthermore, that *x* is a modal doppelgänger
of *y*. Hence it does not follow that there are no purely
qualitative essences -- perhaps the purely qualitative *modal*
properties of *x* are sufficient to distinguish it from any of
its *de facto* doppelgängers, i.e., that none of its *de
facto* doppelgängers are modal doppelgängers.

This is certainly a line worth pursuing. However, the central problem with
it is that there appears to be no intuitive justification for this
claim. Given that a doppelgänger *y* in
**w**′ is qualititatively identical to *x*
with respect to the nonmodal properties *x* exemplifies in
**w**, what possible ground could there be for asserting that the same
couldn’t to true of *y* with respect to any world in
which *x* exists? Intuitively, it seems, there are no such
grounds. A defender of this line would have to provide some.