First published Thu Jul 22, 2010

“Adaptationism” refers to a family of views about the importance of natural selection in the evolution of organisms, in the construction of evolutionary explanations, and in defining the goal of research on evolution. Advocates of adaptationism or “adaptationists” view natural selection among individuals within a population as the only important cause of the evolution of a trait; they also typically believe that the construction of explanations based solely on natural selection to be the most fruitful way of making progress in evolutionary biology and that this endeavor addresses the most important goal of evolutionary biology, which is to understand the evolution of adaptations. An important alternative approach, “pluralism”, invokes historical contingency and developmental and genetic constraints, in addition to natural selection, as important causes of the evolution of a trait. Advocates of pluralism, or “pluralists” often also argue that the attempt to construct a natural-selective explanation of a trait is not the most fruitful way to make explanatory progress and that understanding adaptation is just one of several important questions in evolutionary biology. The “debate” over adaptationism is commonly understood to be the back-and-forth between adaptationists and pluralists.

Biologists and philosophers have recently made three important contributions that have led to better understanding of this debate. First, they have delineated the differences among various “flavors” of adaptationism; this has helped clarify the biological and philosophical stakes of the debate. Second, they have clarified standards of evidence for and against adaptationist claims; this provides a clearer understanding of how to structure an empirical test of a claim about natural selection and what implications the results of the test have in regard to adaptationism. This clarification has the potential, not yet fully realized, to improve both the practice of science and the philosophical understanding of this practice. Third, there is improved understanding of the potential role of non-selective influences on trait evolution.

1. History

The debate over adaptationism is often traced back to a 1979 paper by Stephen Gould and Richard Lewontin, called “The Spandrels of San Marco and the Panglossian Paradigm: A Critique of the Adaptationist Programme,” or simply the “Spandrels” paper. This paper is important but, in fact, this debate traces back to the nineteenth century, with elements of adaptationism or pluralism as currently understood being present in the work of Henry Bates, William Bateson, Charles Darwin, Ernst Haeckel, Herbert Spencer, Alfred Wallace, and August Weissman, among others (see Mayr 1982 and Ruse 2003 for some of the historical background).

In the early twentieth century, views that we now call adaptationism and pluralism were enunciated by biologists. Among them were two of the then (and now) most influential evolutionary biologists: Ronald Fisher and Sewall Wright. The central idea of Fisher's important 1930 book “The Genetical Theory of Natural Selection” is that natural selection is the only important influence on trait evolution. This is the central text of adaptationism; indeed, it has an honored place in the minds of most evolutionary biologists, no matter what their position on adaptationism (compare Grafen 2003 and Kimura 1983). Issued again in 1958 in a revised edition and in 1999 in a variorum edition, this book has garnered over 8,400 journal citations; over 7,600 have occurred since 1975 (Web of Science, June 2010).

Sewall Wright's pluralist view of evolution was presented in several places, with his 1931 paper “Evolution in Mendelian Populations” and the 1977 book “Evolution and the Genetics of Populations, Volume 3 Experimental Results and Evolutionary Deductions” being the best known. The paper has received over 3,400 citations; over 3,000 have occurred since 1975, while the book has received over 800 citations since 1977 (Web of Science, June 2010).

These works by Fisher and Wright are canonical contributions to the field of evolutionary biology. They were based partially on prior claims and counterclaims about the influence of natural selection and of non-selective forces on trait evolution, especially in species such as land snails that have easily distinguishable trait variation (see Millstein 2007a). In turn, these works stimulated continuing claims and counterclaims. The mid-1970s explosion of citations reflects the fact that the number of biologists studying ecology and evolution increased markedly as compared to the early 1960s and that evolutionary biology gained separate departmental status at many universities; these changes were in part caused by the increased societal awareness and concern at that time about pollution and the impact of humans on the environment. There were two central but mainly disjunct scientific developments that energized the proliferation and refinement of adaptationist and of pluralist views during this period. The first was the extensive development of “strategic” claims in evolutionary ecology, which in the case of a given trait, say, the allocation of energy to male and to female offspring (e.g., Hamilton 1967; see also Charnov 1982), provides an explanation as to why the observed trait is locally optimal. Such a claim invokes only natural selection as an important causal explanation of the trait. The second development was the neutral theory in population genetics, which posits that natural selection plays little or no role in determining DNA and protein sequence variation in natural populations (e.g., Kimura 1968, 1983). The former development generated little initial controversy, while the latter development immediately generated lasting controversy (see Dietrich 1994).

It is this combination of social, institutional, and scientific developments that formed the background to Gould and Lewontin's 1979 paper, which can be best understood as an important but not singular event in a long-standing debate in evolutionary biology. It is neither the beginning of the debate over adaptationism nor something much narrower, e.g., little more than “the attempted intellectual lynching” of sociobiology, cf., Queller (1995); see also Pigliucci and Kaplan (2000). Such claims are at best historically incorrect.

2. Different Flavors of Adaptationism

Recent work in the philosophy of biology (Orzack and Sober 1994a, Sober 1996, Amundson 1988, 1990, Godfrey-Smith 2001) has helped uncover three “flavors” of adaptationism; these reflect differences in beliefs among current professional developers and users of evolutionary arguments. They represent commitments about the state of nature, about the way to do science, and about what is important to study.

The first flavor, “empirical” adaptationism, is the view that natural selection is ubiquitous, free from constraints, and provides a sufficient explanation for the evolution of most traits, which are “locally” optimal, that is, the observed trait is superior to any alternative that does not require “redefining” the organism (Orzack and Sober 1994a). This is a claim about the realized influence of natural selection on the evolution of traits as compared to other evolutionary influences.

The second flavor, “explanatory” adaptationism, is the view that explaining traits as adaptations resulting from natural selection is the central goal of evolutionary biology. This is a claim about the greater importance of some kinds of explanations. Opinions differ as to whether this is a scientific claim or an aesthetic claim (see below).

The third flavor, “methodological” adaptationism, is the view that looking first for adaptation via natural selection is the most efficient approach when trying to understand the evolution of any given trait. This could be true even if adaptations are rare (although a substantial majority of biologists believe that adaptations are common). The belief that adaptations are common is quite different from the claim that only natural selection need be invoked in order to explain these adaptations.

The flavors of adaptationism are logically independent. The truth of one claim does not necessarily imply the truth of the other claims. For example, it could be true that most traits are adaptations that can be explained by invoking no more than natural selection (the first flavor) but still be false that it is most fruitful to look first for adaptation (the third flavor). In fact, realized intellectual stances are more circumscribed in that most adaptationists are advocates of empirical, explanatory, and methodological adaptationism (e.g., Charnov 1982, Dawkins 1976, Maynard Smith 1978). In addition, there are many biologists who are advocates of explanatory and methodological adaptationism, but who explicitly reject empirical adaptationism (e.g., Mayr 1983). On the other hand, some biologists reject all three flavors of adaptationism (e.g., Carroll 2005, Wagner et al. 2000, West-Eberhard 2003). There are many instances of competing adaptationist and pluralist explanations of the same biology. For example, Cain and Sheppard (1954) and Lamotte (1959) famously present competing explanations of morphological traits in land snails; Ackermann and Cheverud (2004) test adaptationist and pluralist explanations of the diversification of morphological evolution of humans and their ancestors; Millstein (2007b) illustrates the differences between adaptationism and pluralism by presenting the same biology (of a heat-shock protein) from both perspectives.

Distinguishing among the flavors of adaptationism was an important advance in our biological and philosophical understanding. These flavors of adaptationism differ in their practical implications for evolutionary biology. We now discuss each in detail.

2.1 Empirical Adaptationism

Godfrey-Smith (2001, page 336) defined empirical adaptationism as follows: “Natural selection is a powerful and ubiquitous force, and there are few constraints on the biological variation that fuels it. To a large degree, it is possible to predict and explain the outcome of evolutionary processes by attending only to the role played by selection. No other evolutionary factor has this degree of causal importance.”

This definition captures two important beliefs of adaptationists. The first is that natural selection governs all important aspects of trait evolution and that other evolutionary influences will be of little consequence at least over the long term. The second is that the order in nature is a consequence of natural selection. Parker and Maynard Smith (1990) is an important example of this approach.

Empirical adaptationism is typically regarded as descriptive of the evolution of directly observable traits such as leg length (e.g., Vella 2008). A dizzying variety of traits has been analyzed from the perspective of empirical adaptationism; many specific examples can be found in Hardy (2002), Stephens et al. (2007), and Westneat and Fox (2010). Many proponents of empirical adaptationism concede that important aspects of the evolution of DNA and protein sequences are little influenced by natural selection.

The important methodological implication of empirical adaptationism stems from the causal power that it assigns to natural selection: an apparent discrepancy between data and the predictions of an optimality model should be resolved by rejection of that model and development of a new model. This is justified by an appeal to our “always” imperfect knowledge of nature (e.g. see Cain 1989). This contrasts with the pluralist perspective: such a discrepancy might well provide evidence against natural selection.

Many views counter to empirical adaptationism have been enunciated. Some dispense with natural selection entirely (or nearly so), such as in the study of molecular evolution, where there are neutral evolutionary explanations for many features of the genome (e.g., Lynch 2007b). Some retain natural selection within populations as an important evolutionary force but endorse the importance of other forces (e.g., Crespi 2000, Goodwin 2001, Carroll 2005), while others go further and invoke natural selection among populations or species along with natural selection within populations (Gould 2002, Jablonski 2008).

2.2 Explanatory Adaptationism

Godfrey-Smith (2001, page 336) defined explanatory adaptationism in this way: “The apparent design of organisms, and the relations of adaptedness between organisms and their environments, are the big questions, the amazing facts in biology. Explaining these phenomena is the core intellectual mission of evolutionary theory. Natural selection is the key to solving these problems; selection is the big answer. Because it answers the biggest questions, selection has unique explanatory importance among evolutionary factors.”

Explanatory adaptationism is viewed by its proponents (e.g., Dawkins 1976, Dennett 1995, and Griffiths 2009) as important because it organizes research to understand how natural selection underlies the world around us. To this extent, it can be viewed as an untestable aesthetic claim, instead of as a scientific claim. At minimum, it is a claim as to the proper goal of science as a manifestation of human reason and enlightenment. Amundson (1988, 1990) claims that explanatory adaptationism is a stance about the natural world and the products of scientific inquiry, instead of being a view about biology or how best to do science. However, explanatory adaptationism may have normative implications for evolutionary biologists, if adopting it is necessary in order to construct sensible explanations in developmental biology and physiology (Griffiths 2009). Viewed as an aesthetic claim, explanatory adaptationism has no practical implications for science, but it does have implications for the public debate about the relevance of biology to our image of humanity. In particular, Dennett and Dawkins argue that this perspective counters the natural theological argument from design and vindicates a secular humanist perspective.

Biologists not advocating explanatory adaptationism view the central mission of evolutionary biology differently. For example, many systematists believe that describing the history of life is the central mission of evolutionary biology; in doing so, one might be agnostic about the evolutionary forces influencing this history (see Hull 1988 and Felsenstein 2004 for further details).

2.3 Methodological Adaptationism

Godfrey-Smith (2001, page 337) defined methodological adaptationism in this way: “The best way for scientists to approach biological systems is to look for features of adaptation and good design. Adaptation is a good ‘organizing concept’ for evolutionary research.”

This is a claim about the efficiency of tools. No matter how incorrect it may ultimately be to invoke natural selection as a sufficient explanation for a trait, it is the most direct way possible to find the true causal explanation of a trait. Methodological adaptationism differs markedly from empirical adaptationism in that the former acknowledges the possibility that natural selection may ultimately prove not to have the most influence on a given trait's evolution. In addition, a methodological adaptationist can accept that an apparent discrepancy between data and the predictions of a model of natural selection may be resolved by concluding that the trait is little influenced by natural selection, instead of by concluding that the model is incorrect.

One potential argument against methodological adaptationism is that a mixture of distinct approaches is superior at advancing knowledge as compared to a single approach (Kitcher 1993). Allowing for a division of cognitive labor could be a good thing; perhaps evolutionary biology benefits from an array of methodological strategies with differing degrees of risk. This contrasts with the view that multiple approaches with conflicting assumptions are a hindrance.

Views counter to methodological adaptationism range from strong views that deny that adaptation is a good guiding concept to weaker views that privilege different explanations. For example, Gould and Lewontin's (1979) argument for considering constraint-based “Bauplan” explanations before or along side selective explanations is an example of methodological anti-adaptationism.

3. Testing and Standards of Evidence

An important part of the adaptationism debate concerns the testing of adaptive and non-adaptive hypotheses. The belief that scientific practice in evolutionary biology does not adhere to the proper standards of evidence motivates many of the critiques of adaptationism. This concern has been taken seriously by some evolutionary biologists; for example, Rose and Lauder (1996) claimed that a central task of contemporary evolutionary biology is to articulate a “post-Spandrels adaptationism,” a task that involves improving testing methods by including comparative and molecular data, conducting careful long-term studies in both the laboratory and the wild, and incorporating a more comprehensive understanding of development and constraint.

We now discuss testing of adaptationism itself and the associated implications for testing evolutionary hypotheses generally, and the sort of epistemic difficulties that must be overcome. We highlight how the debate has led to increased understanding of the importance of phylogenetic methods, of the viability of optimality models as tools for testing adaptive hypotheses, and of whether constraint hypotheses are rivals to adaptive hypotheses or provide the backdrop against which we test hypotheses about the evolutionary process.

3.1 Testing adaptationism

Orzack and Sober (1994a, 1994b, 1996, 2001) (see also Orzack 2008) proposed an approach for testing empirical adaptationism. In their view, the truth of empirical adaptationism is a possible outcome of testing of optimality models, as opposed to being something that is decided a priori.

Their proposal, the “Adaptationism Project”, involves assembling specific kinds of analyses of traits in order to assess the relative frequency and importance of natural selection across the biological realm. In order to contribute to the ensemble test, an analysis must include an assessment of the quantitative fit of the optimality model and of the within-population heterogeneity of fit to the predictions (see below and Orzack and Sober 1994a for why these assessments are required). At present, there are very few trait analyses that contain these elements; after an extensive literature review, Orzack and Sober identified only Brockmann and Dawkins (1979), Brockmann et al. (1979), Orzack and Parker (1990), and Orzack et al. (1991) as analyses that contain the required assessments.

Of course, to conduct an ensemble test, important methodological difficulties must be confronted, including how to choose populations and species to analyze, and how many cases are necessary to provide an adequate test. The name “Adaptationism Project” is an acknowledgement of a parallel to the “Human Genome Project”; both are carried out by a consortium of investigators and require advance organization of the process by which knowledge is gathered (instead of just occurring willy-nilly). This is an ambitious project but one that is achievable, cf., the “Genome 10K” project, which is also an effort to create an unprecedented data ensemble (Genome 10K 2009).

Ensemble tests have a long precedent in biology and evolutionary biology, although none appear to have been prospectively organized. For example, we have the ensemble conclusion that “almost all” speciation occurs via geographical isolation (Mayr 1963) or that the genetic code is “nearly” universal (Crick 1968). Either or both of these claims could be true but the present empirical knowledge that generated either one is not even remotely close to being based on a sample of organisms that could be taken to be representative of all species.

Empirical adaptationism is both a claim about the relative frequency of natural selection across evolutionary histories and about the power of natural selection to overcome constraints and contingency. Orzack and Sober's (1994a,b) ensemble test of the truth of empirical adaptationism is structured in the following way for any given trait, T. In order to contribute to the ensemble test, the analysis of the trait must allow the investigator to confirm one of the following hypotheses about the power of natural selection:

(U) Natural selection played some role in the evolution of T. (U denotes ubiquitous since this proposition applies to most traits.)

(I) Natural selection was an important cause of the evolution of T. (I denotes important.)

(O) Natural selection is a sufficient explanation of the evolution of T, and T is locally optimal. (O denotes optimal.)

Orzack and Sober claimed that empirical adaptationism is a generalization of (O), namely that natural selection is a sufficient explanation for most (nonmolecular) traits and those traits are locally optimal.

Orzack and Sober provided a specific protocol to assess whether O is true for a particular trait. It involves comparing the predictive accuracy of a “censored” evolutionary model, one that invokes only natural selection, and an alternative “uncensored” model that invokes additional evolutionary influences such as genetic drift (random trait change caused by population number being finite), or constraints caused by the way the trait is determined genetically or developmentally. If the censored model is quantitatively accurate and there is no within-population heterogeneity of fit to predictions and the uncensored model fails in either regard, then one can infer that natural selection is a sufficient explanation for trait T. Optimality models embody proposition (O) in that natural selection is assumed to be the only important influence on the focal trait's evolution; the result is assumed to be the evolution of a trait that maximizes individual fitness. Of course, an optimality model, like any evolutionary model, must include background assumptions and constraints that anchor the “local” analysis of the focal trait. However, given these assumptions, natural selection is assumed to act without constraint on the trait.

There is some controversy over the protocol for testing whether natural selection is a sufficient explanation of a trait. Brandon and Rausher (1996) objected that local optimality is a distinct claim and so tests for the importance of natural selection should not use optimality models, whose use they equate to “theft”, which they believe means that such models are generically incompatible with universal aspects of the biology of organisms. They also take issue with how the predictive accuracy of censored and uncensored models should be assessed. Godfrey-Smith (2001) makes the observation that the censored and uncensored test models typically have different complexity. More complex models usually fit the data better, but risk obscuring the underlying trend or comprising predictive accuracy—there may be a problem of over-fitting lurking here (see, e.g., Gauch 2003 for an overview of the curve-fitting problem).

Extending this framework to molecular traits, where completely neutral evolution is a plausible explanation, requires expanding the set of hypotheses about natural selection. It now should include:

(N) Natural selection played no role in evolution of T. (N denotes neutral.)

Some argue that N is rarely, if ever, true (e.g., Gillespie 1991), whereas others argue otherwise (e.g., Kimura 1983, Lynch 2007a). An ensemble test involving molecular traits would help resolve this controversy. In addition, the notion of optimality at the molecular level must be made precise. A molecular trait needs to have an identified phenotypic consequence. The endeavor to identify such a consequence will likely always involve a combination of very detailed molecular, biochemical, and phenotypic analyses. However, despite the difficulty of the needed analyses, there are claims as to the optimality of various molecular traits. A canonical example is the claim that triosephosphate isomerase, an enzyme involved in glycolysis in animals, fungi, plants, and some bacteria, is catalytically “perfect” (Albery and Knowles 1976); this is a claim that hypothesis O is true. For molecular traits, the assessment of the influence of natural selection, i.e., distinguishing between hypothesis N and hypotheses U and I, is facilitated by the degeneracy of the genetic code and the existence of non-coding regions in the genome. We expect heterogeneity of the realized influence of natural selection among sites in the genome, and differences in evolutionary rates between sites where a DNA base change alters the protein sequence and those sites that it does not (see examples in Graur and Li 2000, Kreitman and Akashi 1995, Nielsen 2005, and Yang 2006).

3.2 Testing adaptive hypotheses

The debate over adaptationism contains claims and counterclaims about what hypotheses should be included in an analysis of the adaptiveness of a trait. This is crucial because assessments of evidentiary support depend on what hypotheses we consider (see Sober 1990, Earman 1992). We must consider all the relevant hypotheses in order to provide good evidence for a hypothesis (Stanford 2006, Forber 2010). One common pluralist complaint is that adaptationists neglect this standard of evidence. Such an inclusive standard is essential because many different evolutionary trajectories can lead to the same outcome. As Gould and Lewontin (1979) wrote, “One must not confuse the fact that a structure is used in some way…with the primary evolutionary reason for its existence and conformation”. In addition, subtle differences in evolutionary history may lead to different evolutionary outcomes (Beatty and Desjardins 2009). Thus, we cannot conclude that natural selection played an important role in the evolution of some trait just because we have a plausible adaptive hypothesis in mind. Indeed, finding suitable evidence for an adaptive (or non-adaptive) hypothesis is difficult because we lack good epistemic access to evolutionary history. This lack of access is a premise of Gould and Lewontin's critique, and it motivates their call to evaluate testing methods in evolutionary biology, especially those methods that consider only adaptive hypotheses with no regard for non-adaptive rivals. Biologists have continued to develop new testing methods that do this (see, e.g., Rose and Lauder 1996, Hansen et al. 2008).

This aspect of the adaptationism debate is connected with a general epistemological issue in philosophy of science: underdetermination of theory by evidence. Evolutionary hypotheses are typically underdetermined by available evidence. In principle, rival hypotheses make different commitments about the nature of evolutionary history, but in practice these hypotheses are empirically indistinguishable given the available evidence. Philosophers argue about the consequences of this underdetermination for our understanding of biological science (Turner 2005, Stanford 2006). Yet, there is agreement that the problem of underdetermination should be addressed by developing and using tests that discriminate between rival hypotheses.

Evidentiary relations depend on what hypotheses we compare, and so good testing methods should include all rival hypotheses. If we fail to include a relevant rival, say, one that emphasizes developmental constraint, then we may not have found sufficient evidence for the adaptive hypothesis. Failing to contrast adaptive and non-adaptive explanations weakens any adaptationist analysis (Forber 2009).

Evolutionary hypotheses make a variety of commitments about development, ecology, genetics, and history. As a result, an adaptive hypothesis makes contact with evolutionary history only in conjunction with a number of auxiliary hypotheses. The most convincing case for an adaptive hypothesis will include a variety of evidence, especially independent data that confirm the different facets of an evolutionary hypothesis (Lloyd 1988). Sober's (2008) analysis of a testing protocol for evolutionary hypotheses makes clear the role of auxiliary hypotheses and assesses the evidentiary import of different observed outcomes. He provides an analysis of whether and how fit between an optimality model and the observed population mean favors natural selection over genetic drift.

3.3 Common ancestry and adaptation

The adaptationism debate has helped clarify the importance of comparative methods for testing adaptive hypotheses.

The relatedness among species due to common ancestry can reduce the amount of seemingly independent evidence one has for or against any evolutionary hypothesis. Species with a recent common ancestor may have inherited the same trait from the ancestor, as opposed to evolving it independently of one another. Comparative methods help one assess the extent to which a set of related species provide independent evidence for or against a given evolutionary hypothesis (Harvey and Pagel 1991). The general awareness of the need to use such methods stems primarily from the initially narrower debate that took place within systematics in the 1960s and 1970s over how to create classifications of organisms that are “scientific” and as such, are transparent recipes that are accessible to others, instead of being “private” and non-scientific. This debate generated tremendous controversy (Hull 1988) and it spurred on the development of methods to statistically correct for dependence among species' trait values when assessing an adaptive hypothesis (Felsenstein 1985, Harvey and Pagel 1991). In addition, it became more widely understood that a claim that one trait evolved in response to another is enormously strengthened by phylogenetic confirmation; the history of trait acquisition must be consistent with the hypothesis (see Maddison 1990 and references therein).

These developments are salutary in that they show biologists how to better test adaptive hypotheses and have clarified the phylogenetic assumptions that are necessary to test adaptive hypotheses (Sober and Orzack 2003). As such, they are a methodological improvement that has generally gained a positive reception among philosophers of biology (e.g., Sterelny and Griffiths 1999). Many biologists agree, but controversy continues. Some acknowledge the potential importance of comparative methods but point to limitations that may reduce their usefulness (Reeve and Sherman 2001, Leroi et al. 1994). As such, these critiques are consistent with methodological adaptationism. Others view any allusion to potential non-adaptive influences on trait evolution to be mistaken; in their view, the importance of phylogenetic methods is that they help reveal complete history of natural selection on the trait (Grafen 1989). As such, this is a critique consistent with the espousal of empirical adaptationism.

4. Do optimality models describe evolution?

Claims and counterclaims about the use of optimality models for understanding evolution are a central part of the debate over adaptationism, although some believe that there is no necessary connection between optimality modeling and adaptationism (Potochnik 2009). While many biologists believe that optimality models are useful, whether evolution by natural selection tends to produce optimal traits is controversial (see, e.g., Dupré 1987).

Optimality models put the contingencies of history and developmental and genetic constraints in to the background so as to focus on natural selection. Much work in evolutionary game theory embodies this approach. Most game-theoretic models are used to describe the evolution by natural selection of strategic behavior to a local optimum called an evolutionarily stable strategy (Maynard Smith 1982) (but see Orzack and Hines 2005 and Huttegger 2010 among others). This approach has the assumption that there is direct selection on the trait under analysis. This is often justified on the grounds that there exists a “good fit” between the trait and its current function (Maynard Smith 1978) or that natural selection is ubiquitous in nature (Mayr 1983). The Spandrels paper targeted these general arguments for optimality models.

Biologists have discovered many ways in which the genetic details of trait determination and/or ecological details of the population can prevent the evolution of optima. For example, interaction between loci (linkage or pleiotropy) can prevent the optimal phenotype from being fixed in a population, and thereby prevent the maximization of mean fitness (Moran 1964). Such a deviation from the state of highest fitness is called genetic load. The standard adaptationist response is that genetic and ecological constraints are eliminated over evolutionary time by the introduction of new genetic variation via mutation (Parker and Maynard Smith 1990).

While this controversy has been divisive (Schwartz 2002), there are prospects for a synthesis. First, Eshel and Feldman (2001) distinguished between “short-term evolution”, the evolutionary dynamics of a fixed set of genotypes, and “long-term evolution”, bouts of short-term evolution interspersed with introductions of new genetic variation. They noted (page 162) that “long-term evolution proceeds by an infinite sequence of transitions from one fixed set of genotypes to another fixed set of genotypes, with each of these sets subject to short-term evolution…” Optima are often not accessible in the short-term due to constraints on available variation. However, genetic variation may be introduced over the long term so that the population eventually reaches an optimum. The substantive point is that we now understand how apparent short-term impediments to optimality can be resolved over the long term. Mutations must appear at the right time and the ecology must remain stable over the long term; whether these conditions are met frequently enough in nature to justify the optimality approach is an empirical issue (see also Hammerstein 1996). The second prospect for synthesis is Wilkins and Godfrey Smith's (2009) proposal that the truth of empirical adaptationism, and the concomitant application of optimality models, depends on the intended “grain” of resolution of the evolutionary analysis. At a fine grain of resolution, when there are few peaks in the adaptive landscape, most observed populations may be on or near these peaks. Adaptationism is appropriate at this resolution. If we “zoom out” and look at a grand landscape over large regions of morphospace, the situation changes. At a very coarse grain of resolution, much of morphospace is empty and constraints often explain why certain regions remain unexplored by biological evolution. Adaptationism is inappropriate at this resolution.

Finally, the focus on optimality modeling in connection to adaptationism has led to a precise statement of how the nature of fit between data and the predictions of an optimality model influence the degree of evidentiary support for the adaptive hypothesis (Orzack and Sober 1994a, b). Qualitative agreement by itself is not sufficient to accept the hypothesis of local optimality. Instead, quantitative agreement and an assessment of nature of possible between-individual heterogeneity of fit to model predictions are required in order to have evidence for optimality; without both of these test components, acceptance of the hypothesis of optimality is not warranted (see above).

5. Are constraint hypotheses genuine rivals to adaptive hypotheses?

One issue in the debate over adaptationism and optimality models concerns whether constraint hypotheses count as genuine alternatives to adaptive hypotheses. Gould and Lewontin (1979) view constraint hypotheses as competing with adaptive hypotheses as explanations of traits. Advocates of optimality models (e.g., Maynard Smith 1978, Roughgarden 1998) take the set of evolutionary constraints to be a background commitment of any optimality model. The constraint set may include developmental and genetic constraints on variation and transmission, but it is natural selection that drives evolution and so explains the trait given those constraints. Advocates of optimality models treat constraints as presupposed by adaptive hypotheses. A concern of many critics of adaptationism is that this treatment of constraints undervalues their role in explaining evolutionary form and novelty.

Developmental processes may limit the spectrum of evolutionary trajectories available to a lineage. Maynard Smith et al. (1985, page 266) defined a developmental constraint as “a bias on the production of variant phenotypes or a limitation on phenotypic variability caused by the structure, character, composition, or dynamics of the developmental system.” More recently, the definition of constraint has become more nuanced (see, e.g., Wagner and Altenberg 1996, Winther 2001).

Part of the controversy over constraints can be resolved by distinguishing between “constraint on adaptation” and “constraint on form” (Amundson 1994). In the former, certain trajectories are less likely because they require populations to leave local optima or “peaks” in the adaptive landscape. In this case, natural selection limits the potential evolutionary trajectories. In the latter case, certain trajectories are unavailable due to the structure of the current developmental system.

Advocates of optimality models often argue that building and testing such models provides the best way to identify and discover evolutionary constraints, and that these constraints can then be used to build better optimality models (Amundson 1994, Seger and Stubblefield 1996). Many biologists that analyze the evolution of development or “evo-devo” use a different set of molecular and morphological investigative techniques to uncover robust and important developmental constraints (see, e.g., Müller and Newman 2003, Kirschner and Gerhart 2005). They object that the concept of optimality is a poor tool for answering their research questions. The recognition of two kinds of constraints resolves this dispute. We see then that optimality modeling usually entails the incorporation of or the discovery of constraints on adaptation, whereas studies of evolution and development investigates constraints on form. A full understanding of evolutionary history requires a synthesis of these approaches.

Developmental and genetic constraint hypotheses do not invoke causal processes in the same way that adaptive hypotheses do. Can such different hypotheses compete with one another? This aspect of the adaptationism debate connects biology to an important puzzle about the nature of causation and explanation. If explanation amounts to identifying causes, then constraints must be causes to explain evolutionary outcomes. But how can impediments have a causal influence on the evolutionary trajectory of a lineage? One possible answer is that they don't have any causal influence—they are merely the background against which natural selection operates. Such a view treats causes as part of a process, or involving some kind of energy transfer (Dowe 2008). This view of causation vindicates the adaptationist view that the constraint set is presupposed by any respectable adaptive hypothesis. For adaptationists, new constraints simply mean that we need to build new models. Testing is then just a matter of comparing different adaptive hypotheses that have different constraints. The other possible answer is that constraints do have a causal influence on evolution because they prevent evolutionary trajectories from attaining some outcomes. This view is consistent with counterfactual and interventionist approaches to causation, such as the comprehensive one defended by Woodward (2003), and vindicates the approach of treating constraints as genuine alternatives to adaptive hypotheses.

Linking this debate to philosophical ideas about causation can help us evaluate whether evolutionary constraints count as genuine alternatives. Constraints are defined as biases or limitations on the production of variation. From the perspective of causation, this is a heterogeneous combination. Constraints that bias a lineage towards certain evolutionary trajectories look like productive probabilistic causes, and avoid certain conceptual entanglements that face boundaries or limitations. Innovations in the developmental makeup of an organism can make new changes and subsequent evolutionary trajectories more likely, a hallmark of a causal factor. This helps clarify the importance of evolutionary innovation. Innovations that produce biases may be crucial to explaining major evolutionary transitions, such as the emergence of multicellularity (Sterelny 2008). When certain changes make new evolutionary outcomes more likely they are part of the explanation of those new outcomes. Such biases count as probabilistic causal influences since they change the probability of a lineage taking certain evolutionary trajectories (Hitchcock 2008).

Whether boundaries count as causes, and thereby explain evolutionary outcomes, is more problematic. A prevailing view within evolutionary biology is that constraints must count as causal influences, whatever our account of causation (whether it be by prevention or by omission, see Woodward 2003 for discussion). Gould and Lewontin (1979) adopted this position. Sansom (2003) argued that the debate over the evolutionary importance of constraint amounts to an issue about the relative causal contributions of constraint and natural selection to evolutionary outcomes. The causal contribution of constraint can be assessed by using comparative data in order to compare evolutionary outcomes of lineages with and without the constraint of interest. If there is a difference, then the constraint has an identifiable causal influence, all other things being equal. Pigliucci and Kaplan (2000, 2006) proposed a test protocol based on transition matrices in which probabilities of evolutionary change are specified under natural selection and under one or more competing constraint hypotheses, so as to test natural selection against constraint. More philosophical analysis is required to assess the viability of this approach.

Whatever the position on whether constraints count as causes, the lesson to be taken from this part of the adaptationism debate is that it is essential to precisely specify the rival evolutionary hypotheses. There are many examples of such precise specification in the biological literature. For example, Frank (1985) and Stubblefield and Seger (1990) analyzed the influence on sex ratio optima of different constraints on the information available to parents; Lloyd (2005) described the evidentiary support for explanations of the evolution of the female orgasm. Lloyd's analysis supports Symons' (1979) proposal that the female orgasm exists because of a developmental constraint in combination with strong selection for the male orgasm. If males fail to achieve orgasm then no reproduction occurs. The tissue responsible for the male orgasm appears early in human development, long before sexual dimorphism occurs, and this tissue is found in both male and female sexual organs. This example contains competing hypotheses that have commitments about boundaries and about natural selection. The Symons constraint explanation invokes a feature of development and indirect selection on a different trait, whereas the adaptive hypothesis does not incorporate the developmental constraint and instead, posits a direct role for selection.

There is room for reconciliation here. As adaptationists point out, any evolutionary hypothesis must assume some constraints, so the accusation that optimality models fail to include constraints is incorrect. But pluralists are right to argue that in some cases constraints may play a significant role in the evolution of some trait, and that the correct evolutionary explanation may not even include natural selection for the trait.

Constraints are often understood as biases or limitations on potential evolutionary trajectories. How do we identify potential trajectories? This will depend on how biology provides counterfactual information. We cannot appeal solely to realized evolutionary history, since not all potential trajectories have occurred. Evo-devo research on novelty provides one of the best strategies for exploring potential evolutionary trajectories (Wagner 2000, 2001a,2001b, Muller and Wagner 2003, Calcott 2009). As the causal mechanisms underlying development are better understood, we will gain a better grasp on the nature of constraints and how they explain evolutionary outcomes.

6. Concluding Remarks

Why should biologists and philosophers care about the debate over adaptationism? This debate has been and will continue to be important to biologists because it helps clarify how to do better evolutionary biology. Despite this, a minority of currently-active biologists contribute to the debate about adaptationism, and many ignore it or disparage it. For a variety of reasons, many of the important points that have arisen from the debate, such as how to structure empirical tests of adaptive hypotheses and optimality models, go unheeded. For example, claims for local optimality continue to appear that lack a specification of even a single alternative hypothesis to the adaptive hypothesis. This lack inevitably leaves ambiguous the status of the adaptive hypothesis. In addition, standards for rejection of the (only) adaptive hypothesis continue to be rarely delineated if at all.

The debate over adaptationism will continue to be important to philosophers of biology because much will be gained by a more informed understanding of the use of hypotheses about natural selection by biologists. In the 1970s and 1980s, there was a general tendency to misunderstand the conceptual commitments of users of optimality models. More recently, there has been a growing understanding of the variety of conceptual commitments held by users of such models, especially that the use and development of an optimality model need not bind the user to a blind acceptance of the claim that natural selection is all powerful.


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Other Internet Resources


S. O. was partially supported by NIH R01 DA015789–01, NIA P01–AG0225000–01, NICHD R03 HD055685–01, and the National Academies Keck Futures Initiative. We thank Paul Griffiths and Ken Reisman for helpful comments and discussion.

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Steven Hecht Orzack
Patrick Forber <>

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