In very general terms, an agent is a being with the capacity to act, and ‘agency’ denotes the exercise or manifestation of this capacity. The philosophy of action provides us with a standard conception and a standard theory of action. The former construes action in terms of intentionality, the latter explains the intentionality of action in terms of causation by the agent’s mental states and events. From this, we obtain a standard conception and a standard theory of agency. There are alternative conceptions of agency, and it has been argued that the standard theory fails to capture agency (or distinctively human agency). Further, it seems that genuine agency can be exhibited by beings that are not capable of intentional action, and it has been argued that agency can and should be explained without reference to causally efficacious mental states and events.
Debates about the nature of agency have flourished over the past few decades in philosophy and in other areas of research (including psychology, cognitive neuroscience, social science, and anthropology). In philosophy, the nature of agency is an important issue in the philosophy of mind, the philosophy of psychology, the debates on free will and moral responsibility, in ethics, meta-ethics, and in the debates on the nature of reasons and practical rationality. For the most part, this entry focuses on conceptual and metaphysical questions concerning the nature of agency. In the final sections, it provides an overview of empirically informed accounts of the sense of agency and of various empirical challenges to the commonsense assumption that our reasons and our conscious intentions make a real difference to how we act.
- 1. Introduction
- 2. Conceptions, theories, and kinds of agency
- 3. The metaphysics of agency
- 4. Empirical challenges and the role of consciousness
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In a very broad sense, agency is virtually everywhere. Whenever entities enter into causal relationships, they can be said to act on each other and interact with each other, bringing about changes in each other. In this very broad sense, it is possible to identify agents and agency, and patients and patiency, virtually everywhere. Usually, though, the term ‘agency’ is used in a much narrower sense to denote the performance of intentional actions. This way of thinking about agency has a long history in philosophy and it can be traced back to Hume and Aristotle, among other historical figures. In contemporary analytic philosophy, it is most commonly associated with the influential work of Anscombe (1957) and Davidson (1963). Anscombe’s and Davidson’s views differ significantly in many respects, but they share the central doctrine that action is to be explained in terms of the intentionality of intentional action. In the debates that followed, the philosophy of action revolved largely around the notion of intentional action. For some time, the term ‘agency’ was rarely used, and if it was, it was usually taken to refer to the exercise of the capacity to perform intentional actions. This has changed in the more recent debate, where talk about agency has become more and more common in many areas of philosophy (and in other areas of research). To some extent, this focus on the notion of agency has been fuelled by a resistance to the assimilation of agency to intentional action. As we will see in the following section, this resistance amounts in some cases to the rejection of the standard conception of action, in some cases it amounts to the rejection of the standard theory of action, and in some it amounts to the more modest claim that there are different kinds of agency.
2. Conceptions, theories, and kinds of agency
The contributions of Anscombe and Davidson have established a standard conception of action, and Davidson’s work has provided the groundwork for a standard theory of action. At the core of the standard conception are the following two claims. First, the notion of intentional action is more fundamental than the notion of action. In particular, action is to be explained in terms of the intentionality of intentional action. Second, there is a close connection between intentional action and acting for a reason.
There are two ways of spelling out the first claim (which correspond to two different views on the individuation of actions; see section 3.4). According to the first, one and the same event can be more than one action under different descriptions, and an event is an action just in case it is an intentional action under some description. An action, that is, may be intentional under some description and unintentional under others (Anscombe 1957; Davidson 1963). Suppose that you alert the burglar by turning on the light, and suppose that this is one event that is intentional under the description ‘turning on the light’, but not under ‘alerting the burglar’. On this view, alerting the burglar is nevertheless something that you do, given that the event is an intentional action under some description. According to a second way of spelling out the first claim, something is an action either if it is identical with or “generated by” an intentional action (Goldman 1970; see also Ginet 1990). On this view, alerting the burglar is an action of yours either if it is an intentional action or if it is generated by an intentional action (your turning on the light, in this case). If it is merely generated by an intentional action, it is an unintentional action of yours. On both views, intentional action is more fundamental than action itself: action derives from and is dependent on intentional action.
According to the second claim of the standard conception, there is a close connection between acting intentionally and acting for a reason. According to Anscombe and Davidson’s early view, this close connection is identity. Following Aristotle, they both held the view that to act intentionally is to act for a reason, and that to act for a reason is to act in a way that can be rationalized by the premises of a sound practical syllogism, which consists, typically, of a major premise that corresponds to the agent’s goal and a minor premise that corresponds to the agent’s take on how to attain the goal. Furthermore, Davidson held the view that having an intention consists in having a desire and a belief that correspond to the major and the minor premise of the relevant syllogism (Davidson 1963, 1970; see also Goldman 1970; Audi 1986).
One can still find a fairly widespread commitment to this desire-belief version of the standard conception (in the philosophy of mind, the philosophy of psychology, ethics, meta-ethics, and in other areas of research). In the philosophy of action, however, it is now widely thought that intentions cannot be reduced to desires and beliefs (and combinations thereof). On this view, intentions play a crucial and irreducible role in practical reasoning, long-term planning, and in the initiation and guidance of action (see, especially, Bratman 1987; see also Harman 1976; Brand 1984; Bishop 1989; Mele 1992, 2003; Enç 2003). It is nevertheless still widely accepted that there is a close connection between intentional action and acting for reasons and that intentional actions are typically performed for reasons (Mele and Moser 1994; Mele 2003; Enç 2003; Clarke 2010b, for instance).
The standard conception is not committed to a particular account of what it is to act intentionally and for reasons, and it is not committed to a particular account of the nature of reason explanations. It is important to distinguish the standard conception from the standard theory, which provides a causal account of intentional action and reason explanation. This theory says, very roughly, that something is an intentional action and done for reasons just in case it is caused by the right mental states and events in the right way. The right mental states and events are states and events that rationalize the action from the agent’s point of view (such as desires, beliefs, and intentions). The right way of causation is non-deviant causation (see section 3.2). On this view, a reason explanation is an explanation in terms of mental states and events that cause the action and that rationalize it from the agent’s point of view (typically by providing a means-end rationale). This theory is often called “the causal theory of action”. Strictly speaking, it is an event-causal theory and it consists of an event-causal theory of reason explanation and an event-causal theory of intentional action. In conjunction with the standard conception, this causal theory provides us with a theory of action, which has been the standard theory in the contemporary philosophy of mind and action (see also the entry on action).
As indicated, the standard conception is compatible with non-causal theories of intentional action and reason explanation. It is generally agreed that a reason explanation of an action usually renders the action intelligible by revealing the agent’s goal or intention. According to non-causal theories, having the relevant goals or intentions does not consist in the possession of causally efficacious mental states or events (Melden 1961; Ginet 1990; O’Connor 2000; Sehon 2005). Non-causal theories are, however, widely rejected (the most influential critique is due to Davidson 1963; see also Goldman 1970: 76–85; Mele 2003: 38–51; Clarke 2003: 21–24). The standard conception is compatible, furthermore, with dual standpoint theories. We will turn to this view in section 3.3.
2.1 Agency as intentional action
The standard conception of action provides us with a conception of agency. According to this view, a being has the capacity to exercise agency just in case it has the capacity to act intentionally, and the exercise of agency consists in the performance of intentional actions and, in many cases, in the performance of unintentional actions (that derive from the performance of intentional actions; see section 2). Call this the standard conception of agency. The standard theory of action provides us with a theory of agency, according to which a being has the capacity to act intentionally just in case it has the right functional organization: just in case the instantiation of certain mental states and events (such as desires, beliefs, and intentions) would cause the right events (such as certain movements) in the right way. According to this standard theory of agency, the exercise of agency consists in the instantiation of the right causal relations between agent-involving states and events. (Proponents include Davidson 1963, 1971; Goldman 1970; Brand 1984; Bratman 1987; Dretske 1988; Bishop 1989; Mele 1992, 2003; Enç 2003.)
The most serious problem for this standard theory has been the problem of deviant causal chains. Further, some have argued that this view altogether fails to capture agency, because it reduces actions to mere happenings. We will turn to those issues in section 3. Recently, it has been argued that reasons for actions cannot be the causes of actions, because reasons are facts or states of affairs, not mental states or events (Dancy 2000; Alvarez 2010). But the standard theory is not committed to the claim that reasons are identical with mental entities. It is, in particular, compatible with the view that reasons are the things that are represented by the contents of the relevant mental states and events (see Scanlon 1998: 56–64; Mele 2003: 82–84; Setiya 2007: 28–31).
2.2 Agency as initiation by the agent
It has often been claimed, and it is widely agreed, that agency involves the initiation of action by the agent. But it has been controversial what this consists in. The standard conception is compatible with the claim that intentional actions are initiated by the agent, and proponents of the standard theory have argued that initiation can be explained in terms of causation by the agent’s mental states and events. According to desire-belief versions of the view, initiation by the agent consists in causation by the relevant desire-belief pairs (Goldman 1970; Davidson 1971; Dretske 1988). According to more recent versions, initiation consists in causation by the relevant intentions (Brand 1984; Bratman 1987; Bishop 1989; Mele 1992, 2003; Enç 2003). Opponents of the standard conception argue, however, that an agent’s power to initiate action cannot be reduced to the capacity to act intentionally and for reasons. They argue that the exercise of agency may be entirely spontaneous, in the sense that an agent may initiate an action for no reason and without prior intent. On this view, reasons and intentions may have a strong and even a decisive influence on how an agent acts. But agency has its source in the power to initiate, and the exercise of this power cannot be reduced to the agent’s being moved by reasons or intentions. This is an alternative conception of agency (Ginet 1990; O’Connor 2000; Lowe 2008; see also McCann 1998; for critical discussion see Mele 2003: 38–51, 71–76; Clarke 2003: 17–24). Proponents of this alternative conception reject the standard theory and they reject, more generally, any account of agency in terms of causal relations between agent-involving states and events. According to some, the initiation of action consists in irreducible agent-causation, others appeal to uncaused mental acts of the will. The main positions on this issue correspond to the main positions in the metaphysics of agency, to which we turn in section 3.1.
2.3 Agency and distinctively human action
In an influential article, Frankfurt (1971) argued that the difference between persons and other agents consists in the structure of their will. Only persons reflect on and care about their motivations. According to Frankfurt, this reflective evaluation of our motives usually results in the formation of second-order desires: desires that are directed at first-order desires (which are directed at goals and actions). When a person wants to have a certain desire and wants to be moved by it, then he or she is said to “identify” with the desire and its motivational efficacy. On this hierarchical account of agency, the role of higher-order attitudes is essential to the kind of agency that distinguishes persons from other agents. Taylor (1977) took this as a starting point for an account of distinctively human agency, under the assumption that the distinction between persons and non-persons is, essentially, the distinction between human and non-human agents. It is not entirely clear whether Frankfurt and Taylor meant to provide an alternative to the standard theory of agency or an extension of it. On one reading, they accepted the account of intentional agency provided by the standard theory, and they proposed a hierarchical extension of the standard theory that captures the kind of agency that is distinctive of persons or human agents. (For an influential critique of such hierarchical accounts see Watson 1975.)
According to Velleman (1992), Frankfurt’s observation that an agent may fail to identify with a particular motive points to a fundamental flaw in the standard theory. As it seems always possible that an agent “disowns” the mental attitudes that cause an action, those attitudes do not “add up to the agent’s being involved” (1992: 463). This shows, according to Velleman, that the standard theory captures, at best, actions that are defective. It fails, in particular, to capture “human action par excellence”, because it fails to account for the agent’s participation. Velleman rejects the appeal to irreducible agent-causation (see section 3.1), and he argues that this leaves only one strategy for solving the problem: we must find a mental attitude that the agent cannot disown and that is, therefore, fit to play the role of the agent. We must, that is, find a mental attitude that is the agent, functionally speaking. According to Velleman, the desire to act in accordance with reasons is fit to play this role.
Bratman (2000, 2001) agrees with Velleman that the standard theory does not explain genuine self-governance. On his view, though, an account of “full-blown agency”, as he calls it, does not require reference to a mental attitude that the agent cannot disown. Building on his work on temporally extended planning agency (Bratman 1987), he argues that an agent’s “self-governing policies” have the “authority to speak for the agent”, because they help to establish and support the agent’s identity across time, and because they specify which desires are to be treated as providing justifying reasons in practical deliberation. According to Bratman, these self-governing policies explain what it is for an agent “to take a stand in favor of or against certain motivations, a stand that can itself be subject to reexamination and revision” (2000: 50–51). (For a critical discussion of Bratman’s account see Hornsby 2004 and Franklin 2017.)
In defense of the standard theory, Mele (2003: Ch. 10) has argued that the search for a mental attitude that plays the role of the agent is misguided and that Velleman’s critique of the view is off target. As Mele points out, it seems clear that a desire cannot possibly be the agent, because agents deliberate, decide, and act. Desires do none of these things. He suggests that any talk of a mental attitude as playing the role of the agent can at best be metaphorical. Further, there is no obvious reason why an agent’s failure to identify with a motive should be diagnosed in terms of the agent’s failure to participate. It seems more plausible to suggest that the agent does participate in such cases, but in a defective manner. Once defective participation is distinguished from a failure to participate, it is easy to avoid Velleman’s conclusion that the standard theory “leaves out the agent”. Moreover, one can then separate the question of whether the standard theory accounts for the agent’s participation from the question of whether it captures human action par excellence. According to Mele, the human agent is simply a human being who acts. On this view, the agent does play some role in all instances of agency, no matter how deficient. The standard theory provides, first and foremost, an account of what it is for an agent to perform intentional actions. It does not claim that the capacity to perform intentional actions is the capacity that separates human from non-human agency, and it does not claim to give an account of more refined or excellent kinds of human agency, such as self-controlled, autonomous, wholehearted, or free agency. It is an interesting and important task to investigate whether or not the standard theory can be extended so as to account for the more refined or excellent kinds of human agency (Mele 1995; Bratman 2007, for instance). But to reject the view because it fails to do so is to misconstrue its aim and scope (see also section 3.3).
2.4 Agency without mental representations
Arguments for the claim that the standard theory does not account for important aspects of agency are usually driven by a focus on distinctively human agency. Once we shift our focus to non-human agents, and simpler organisms, a very different challenge emerges. When we turn to such agents, it seems that the standard theory is clearly too demanding. The view explains agency in terms of the agent’s desires, beliefs, and intentions. Usually, it is assumed that this is an explanation in terms of mental representations: in terms of intentional mental states and events that have representational contents (typically, propositional contents). It seems, however, that there are beings that are capable of genuine agency and that do not possess representational mental states. We can distinguish here between three claims (and three challenges). According to the first, there are non-human beings that are capable of agency and that do not possess representational mental states. Second, there are many instances of human agency that can and should be explained without the ascription of representational mental states. Third, all instances of agency can and should be explained without the ascription of representational mental states. We turn to each claim in turn.
We have a pervasive tendency to interpret and explain behavior in terms of intentional mental states. We tend, even, to interpret the interaction between animated objects in terms of desires, beliefs, and intentions (Heider and Simmel 1944). This raises the question of when it is appropriate to attribute mental states in the explanation of behavior. According to an instrumentalist stance (Dennett 1987: Ch. 2), the question of when it is appropriate to ascribe mental states cannot be separated from the question of when it is appropriate to ascribe agency, and both questions are to be answered in terms of predictive success: it is appropriate to attribute mental states in the explanation of agency when doing so supports successful predictions of behavior. However, most proponents of the standard theory presume some form of realism, according to which the ascription of mental states is appropriate only if the agent in question possesses the right internal states with the right representational contents. The question of what the possession of representational mental states consists in is one of the most controversial questions in the philosophy of mind and cognitive science, and it is clearly beyond the scope of this entry (see the entries on mental representation and cognitive science). Consider, though, the following remarks. Davidson (1982) held the view that only human agents have the relevant mental attitudes, because he thought that having such attitudes requires linguistic competence. Others have argued that we are justified in ascribing representational mental states to non-human agents if doing so provides the best explanation of their behavior (Allen and Bekoff 1997, for instance). Sometimes it is rather difficult to decide whether or not the best explanation of an agent’s behavior requires the ascription of representational mental states. Sterelny (2001: Ch. 11, 12), for instance, has argued that plausible explanations in terms of desires can sometimes be replaced by equally good explanations in terms of drives. The ascription of a desire is usually construed as the ascription of a representational mental state, whereas a drive can be construed in terms of more basic mechanisms (and without the ascription of representational content). What is important to bear in mind, here, is that the issue concerns not only the possession of the relevant mental states and events. It concerns, moreover, the capacity to combine or process the contents of such attitudes in rational inferences: the capacity to treat the relevant contents as premises in practical reasoning (as emphasized by Anscombe 1957 and Davidson 1970).
Suppose, for the sake of argument, that it is appropriate to ascribe representational mental states to non-human beings of various kinds. It may still be the case that there are other kinds of non-human beings that are capable of agency and that do not possess representational mental states. Would this show that the standard theory is too demanding? Only if the standard theory is construed as providing an account of agency as such. According to a less demanding view, the standard theory provides an account of one particularly interesting and central kind of agency: intentional agency (and the kind of unintentional agency that derives from it; see section 2). On this construal, the standard theory is perfectly compatible with the claim that there are more basic kinds of agency, including kinds of agency that do not require the possession of representational mental states. It is, for instance, compatible with what Barandiaran et al. (2009) call “minimal agency”. On their view, an agent is a unified entity that is distinguishable from its environment and that is doing something by itself in accord with a certain goal (or norm). This view departs from the standard conception and theory in its characterization of action (“doing something”) in terms of the “adaptive regulation” of the agent’s “coupling with the environment” and in terms of metabolic self-maintenance (inspired by Varela et al. 1974). They suggest that organisms as simple as bacteria exhibit this minimal kind of agency. The crucial point is that this provides an account of goal-directed behavior that does not appeal to the mental representation of goals. Barandiaran et al. suggest, rather, that even very simple organisms can be said to have the intrinsic goal to be: to bring about the continuation of their existence.
We turn now to the second claim, which says that many instances of human agency can and should be explained without the ascription of representational mental states. This view is usually based on and motivated by embodied and enactive approaches in the philosophy of mind and cognitive science. Some versions of this approach are inspired by the works Husserl, Heidegger, and Merleau-Ponty (Dreyfus 1991, 2002), others are based on more recent developments in robotics and dynamical systems theory (Brooks 1991; Beer 1995). Common to such views is the focus on skillful and “online” engagement with the world: the ability to engage with others and with one’s circumstances by responding to the demands of the situation in a skillful and often effortless manner, without conscious deliberation, reasoning, or planning (often called “skilled coping”). Examples of human agency include instances of habitual action, such as the actions that one performs while driving a car, and cases where the agent is engaged in a responsive flow of interaction, such as in jazz improvisation or in verbal exchanges. Examples from robotics include skills like the coordination of limb movements and the ability to navigate through novel environments. The challenge to the standard theory often involves the following three points. First, it is argued that the explanation of such skills and abilities in terms of mental representations is both costly and clumsy: it imposes very high demands on the agent’s information-processing resources and it leads to an inelegant and implausible overpopulation of highly specific mental representations. Second, it is pointed out that current accounts of mental representation are untenable or, at least, controversial and that there is no obvious reason to think that there will ever be a generally accepted account of mental representation. Third, it is argued that the explanation of skilled coping does not require the ascription of representational mental states, because it can be explained in terms of behavioral dispositions and direct guidance by the relevant features of the situation. The proposed conclusion is that we should, therefore, explain instances of skilled coping without reference to representational mental states and events.
In response, proponents of the standard theory (and of representational theories of mind) usually argue as follows. First, it is pointed out that the standard theory does not require that the agent considers the relevant mental contents in conscious deliberation or reasoning. This reduces the information-processing demands to a significant degree. Second, it is argued that the standard theory is compatible with explanations of habitual actions in terms of motor schemata (or motor intentions). Motor schemata are not represented in the contents of personal-level mental states, and they are usually recruited automatically in the service of personal-level goals and intentions. The utilization of motor schemata further reduces the required processing load. Third, it is pointed out that most instances of skilled coping do not occur in an intentional vacuum, as it were. They are, rather, usually constrained by and often integrated with the agent’s long-term goals and intentions. Given this, it seems that a full explanation of skilled coping must, at some point or level, make reference to representational mental states after all. (For more on this see Clark and Toribio 1994; Antony 2002; Rey 2002; Adams 2010; Clarke 2010b; Schlosser 2018.)
According to the third claim, all instances of agency, including all instances of human agency, can and should be explained without the ascription of representational mental states. This position is usually motivated by radical versions of the embodied and enactive approach to the mind (Chemero 2009; Silberstein and Chemero 2011; Hutto and Myin 2014). The main strategy here is usually to generalize the argument outlined above: explanations in terms of representational mental states are costly and clumsy; there is no generally accepted account of mental representation; and there is reason to think that we will, eventually, be able to explain all kinds of agency without the ascription of representational mental states. This radical view raises some obvious and difficult questions. How can one explain our ability to deliberate about the future without assuming mental representations? How can one explain reasoning about abstract concepts, counterfactuals, and theoretical generalizations? And how can one explain that our agency is to a significant extent motivated, guided, and constrained by our long-terms plans and commitments? Temporally extended planning agency (Bratman 1987, 2000) is clearly a “representation-hungry” phenomenon: it is difficult to see how it can be explained without the ascription of representational mental states (Clark and Toribio 1994; Schlosser 2018; see also the entry on embodied cognition).
2.5 Other kinds of agency: mental, epistemic, shared, collective, relational, artificial
There is, as we have seen, good reason to distinguish between different kinds of agency. The standard theory offers an account of what is, arguably, the most central kind of agency: intentional agency (and the kind of unintentional agency that derives from it; see section 2). This can be distinguished from higher or more refined kinds of agency, such as self-controlled, autonomous, and free agency, and it can be distinguished from more basic kinds of agency that do not require the ascription of representational mental states. Apart from that, there are several candidates for further kinds of agency. They include mental agency, shared agency, collective agency, relational agency, and artificial agency. In each case, we can ask whether the agency in question can be explained in terms of the standard conception and theory, or whether it is indeed a different kind of agency. The main focus in this section will be on mental agency, and we will address the other candidates only very briefly.
It may seem obvious that our mental lives are filled with mental action. We attend, consider, judge, reason, deliberate, accept, endorse, decide, try, and so on. It may seem that these are all things that we do. If we consider such cases through the standard theory of agency, we encounter immediately two difficulties. First, it seems that such mental occurrences are hardly ever, if ever, intentional actions. According to the standard theory, an event is an intentional action of the type A only if the agent has an intention that includes A in its content. In the basic case, this would be an intention to A. In an instrumental case, this would be an intention to perform some other action B in order to A. Now, thoughts are individuated in part by their contents. Take the thought that p. According to the standard theory, thinking that p is an intentional action only if the agent has an intention that includes “think that p” in its content. This is rather odd and problematic, because we would have to have the intention to think a certain thought before we think it. Second, there are problems with the central case of decision-making. According to the standard theory, deciding to A would be an intentional action only if one already had the intention to make a decision that includes “deciding to A” in its content. This seems, again, rather odd and problematic. Further, our reasons for making a decision to A are usually our reasons to A—they are reasons for performing the action. According to the standard theory, something is an action only if it has a reason explanation (in terms of the agent’s desires, beliefs, and intentions). As reasons are usually reasons for action, it is again difficult to see how making a decision can ever be an action. Considerations of this kind may lead one to conclude that thoughts are hardly ever, if ever, mental actions (see Strawson 2003).
It is not difficult to avoid this conclusion, as Mele (1997, 2003: Ch. 9, 2009b) has shown. Consider again the central case of decision-making, and assume that making a decision consists in the formation of an intention. According to the standard theory, the formation of an intention is an action if it is an intentional action under some description (or if it is either identical with or generated by an intentional action; see section 2). What could plausibly be the agent’s intention in making a decision? Mele suggests that processes of decision-making are usually motivated by the intention to settle the practical question at hand. This proposal avoids the problem outlined above. Suppose the agent decides to A. For this to be an action, it is not required that the agent has the intention to decide to A. For if the agent has the intention to settle the question by making a decision, making the decision is intentional under a description. In particular, making a decision is then an intentional action and making the decision to A is then an unintentional action (that is either identical with or generated by the intentional action of making a decision). Similar considerations apply to the mentioned issue concerning reason explanation and to other cases, such as remembering. Mele (2009b) argues that remembering something is never an intentional action, because no one has ever the intention to remember the particular content in question. But there is nevertheless a closely associated intentional mental action that one might perform: intentionally trying to bring it about that one remembers the particular content in question. See Shepherd (2015) for a defense of the view that decisions are intentional actions by construing them as extensions and conclusions of deliberative activity.
Hieronymi (2009) takes a very different line. She thinks that we engage in mental agency whenever we settle the question of whether to do or whether to believe something, and she argues that this kind of mental agency differs from ordinary intentional agency, primarily due to a difference in control. According to Hieronymi, we have “evaluative control” over our mental attitudes. This consists in the ability to form and revise “our take on things”, and it is to be distinguished from the kind of voluntary control that we have over our overt bodily actions. According to volitionist theories of agency, mental acts of willing (choosing or trying) are also different in kind from overt bodily actions. On such views, mental acts of willing are furthermore fundamental, in the sense that they are the source of overt agency (Ginet 1990; McCann 1998; Lowe 2008; more on this in section 3.1).
Epistemic agency concerns the control that agents may exercise over their beliefs (and other doxastic states). It is common to distinguish between two main positions: indirect doxastic voluntarism and direct doxastic voluntarism. The former concerns the ways in which we may acquire or revise beliefs by doing research, evaluating the evidence, considering opposing opinions, and so on. It is fairly uncontroversial that we can exercise control over our beliefs in such indirect ways. In contrast, direct doxastic voluntarism is very controversial. It says that we have direct voluntary control over some of our beliefs, where voluntary control is usually understood as the kind of control that agents exercise in the performance of intentional actions. A main issue here is that direct doxastic voluntarism appears to be incompatible with the nature of beliefs. Beliefs are supposed to represent the world (or “aim at truth”). One may argue that there is no fundamental difference in the control over action and belief-formation, because in both cases the control consists basically in reason-responsiveness. But this proposal overlooks the central role of intentions. According to the standard theory, actions must be initiated and guided by intentions, in addition to being responsive to reasons. The challenge is to find beliefs-formations that are initiated and guided by intentions in the same or similar way as intentional actions. (For a more extensive overview and references see Vitz 2019.)
Shared agency occurs when two or more individuals do something together (such as carry a piece of furniture or sing a song). Collective agency occurs when two or more individuals act as a group (in accordance with certain principles or procedures that constitute and organize the group). Research on shared and collective agency has flourished over the past two decades or so. One central question has been whether shared and collective agency can be reduced to the agency of the individuals involved, or whether they are constitutive of different kinds of agency—whether they are, in some sense, something over and above individual agency. An account of collective agency in terms of the standard theory raises the question of whether it makes sense to attribute mental states and events (such as desires, beliefs, and intentions) to groups of individuals. (For references and discussion see the entries on shared agency and collective intentionality.)
The notion of relational agency derives from relational accounts of autonomy. According to feminist critiques, traditional accounts of autonomy are overly individualistic, insofar as they overlook or neglect the importance of interpersonal relationships in the development and sustenance of an autonomous individual. As Westlund (2009) points out, however, most traditional accounts are compatible with the feminist emphasis on interpersonal relationships as long as relationships and dependence on others are construed as being causally necessary for the development and sustenance of an individual agent. Autonomy is genuinely relational only if interpersonal relationships and dependence are constitutive of autonomy. On Westlund’s own view, autonomous agency requires an “irreducibly dialogical form of reflectiveness and responsiveness to others” (2009: 28). On this account, autonomy is an irreducibly relational kind of agency. (For more on this see the entry on feminist perspectives on autonomy.)
Finally, we turn briefly to the question of whether robots and other systems of artificial intelligence are capable of agency. If one presumes the standard theory, one faces the question of whether it is appropriate to attribute mental states to artificial systems (see section 2.4). If one takes an instrumentalist stance (Dennett 1987: Ch. 2), there is no obvious obstacle to the attribution of mental states and intentional agency to artificial systems. According to realist positions, however, it is far from obvious whether or not this is justified, because it is far from obvious whether or not artificial systems have internal states that ground the ascription of representational mental states. If artificial systems are not capable of intentional agency, as construed by the standard theory, they may still be capable of some more basic kind of agency. According to Barandiaran et al. (2009), minimal agency does not require the possession of mental states. It requires, rather, the adaptive regulation of the agent’s coupling with the environment and metabolic self-maintenance. This means, though, that on this view artificial systems are not even capable of minimal agency: “being specific about the requirements for agency has told us a lot about how much is still needed for the development of artificial forms of agency” (Barandiaran et al. 2009: 382).
3. The metaphysics of agency
What is the nature of agency? How should we construe the relation between agents and actions? How can agency be part of the event-causal order? In this section, we will first turn to the three main approaches in the metaphysics of agency that provide three different frameworks for how to think about such metaphysical questions (the event-causal, the agent-causal, and the volitionist framework). After considering some problems and objections, we turn to an alternative approach that rejects the project of providing a metaphysics of agency (dual standpoint theory). Finally, we briefly consider the individuation of actions and some further issues in the metaphysics of agency.
3.1 Three metaphysical frameworks
According to an event-causal approach, agency is to be explained in terms of event-causal relations between agent-involving states and events. On this view, actions are events, and an event is an action just in case it has the right event-causal history. We may call this a reductive approach to agency, as it reduces the agent’s role in the exercise of agency to the causal roles of agent-involving states and events. Obviously, the standard theory belongs to this reductive event-causal framework, because it explains agency in terms of causation by the agent’s mental states and events. (Proponents include Davidson 1963, 1971; Goldman 1970; Brand 1984; Bratman 1987; Dretske 1988; Bishop 1989; Mele 1992, 2003; Enç 2003.)
According to an agent-causal approach, agency is to be explained in terms of a kind of substance-causation: causation by the agent, construed as a persisting substance. On this view, actions are events, and an event is an action just in case it has the right agent-causal history. This framework provides a non-reductive account of agency insofar as it holds that an agent’s role in the exercise of agency is to be construed in terms of the exercise of an irreducible agent-causal power (Chisholm 1964; Taylor 1966; O’Connor 2000; see also Clarke 2003; Lowe 2008).
According to a volitionist approach, agency is to be explained in terms of acts of the will, usually called “volitions”. On this view, volitions are the source of agency: an overt movement is an action just in case it is caused, in the right way, by a volition. Volitions themselves are entirely uncaused and they are sui generis acts: they are acts in virtue of their intrinsic properties, not in virtue of some extrinsic or relational property (such as having the right causal history). This is also a non-reductive approach to agency, but it differs sharply from both the event-causal and the agent-causal framework in the important respect that it rejects the suggestion that all actions are events with a certain causal history (Ginet 1990; McCann 1998; see also Lowe 2008).
The event-causal framework is by far the most widely accepted view in the contemporary philosophy of mind and action. One reason for this is that the commitment to the event-causal framework is tantamount to a commitment to a very minimal and widely endorsed kind of naturalism, according to which any appeal to irreducible substance-causation or teleology is to be avoided. Further, this commitment to the event-causal framework is sustained by a widespread dissatisfaction with alternative agent-causal and volitionist theories of agency. Some objections to agent-causal theories derive from more general objections to the notion of substance-causation, others address more directly the agent-causal account of agency. It has been argued, for instance, that appeal to substances leaves both the timing and the manner of causation mysterious (Broad 1952). Further, it has been argued that substance-causation collapses into event-causation, once it is acknowledged that a substance has its causal powers in virtue of its properties (Clarke 2003: Ch. 10). Others have argued that an appeal to the agent as a cause is vacuous, because it has no explanatory import (Davidson 1971), and because it cannot explain what an agent’s exercise of control consists in (Schlosser 2010). A common objection to volitionist accounts is that they generate a regress of mental acts (Ryle 1949). Arguably, though, this objection begs the question. The view holds that overt actions are to be explained in terms of volitions. There is no need to appeal to further mental acts of the will in order to explain why volitions are actions, because volitions are actions sui generis (see Enç 2003 for discussion). This, however, points also to the reason why the view is widely rejected. Volitionist theories stipulate as primitive what appears to be in need of explanation. In particular, they do not explain what an agent’s exercise of control consists in, as the agent is merely the subject or the bearer of volitions (O’Connor 2000: 25–26; Clarke 2003: 17–24). Moreover, if, as most contemporary philosophers would assume, volitions are realized by events in the brain, the view appears to be in tension with the fact that there are no events in the brain that are entirely uncaused.
3.2 Deviant causal chains
In the 1950s and 60s, several philosophers argued that the event-causal framework is incoherent. Their main argument was the so called “logical connection argument”, which says, very roughly, that the relation between mental attitudes and actions cannot be causal, because the connection between them is logical, conceptual, or in some sense non-contingent (Hampshire 1959; Melden 1961; Kenny 1963, for instance). It is widely agreed now that this attack was unsuccessful (the most influential reply is due to Davidson 1963; see also Goldman 1970: 109–116). Shortly after that another challenge emerged, which turned out to be the most serious and most persistent problem for the standard theory and the event-causal framework: the problem of deviant causal chains.
In general, the problem is that it seems always possible that the relevant mental states and events cause the relevant event (a certain movement, for instance) in a deviant way: so that this event is clearly not an intentional action or not an action at all. It is common to distinguish between cases of basic deviance and consequential deviance (also called primary and secondary deviance). A murderous nephew intends to kill his uncle in order to inherit his fortune. He drives to his uncle’s house and on the way he kills a pedestrian by accident. As it turns out, this pedestrian is his uncle. This is a case of consequential deviance (Chisholm 1966). In a standard case of basic deviance (Davidson 1973), a climber intends to rid himself of the weight and danger of holding another man on a rope by loosening his grip. This intention unnerves him so that it causes him to loosen his hold on the rope. The difference between the cases is best explained in terms of the distinction between basic and non-basic actions. Very roughly, basic actions are the things that one can do without doing something else (such as raising one’s hand), whereas the performance of non-basic actions requires that one does something else (such as giving someone a signal by raising one’s hand). In the consequential case, the nephew has an intention to perform a non-basic action (to kill his uncle). He successfully performs several basic actions, but it is a sheer coincidence that he brings about the intended end. The climber, in contrast, does not perform any action at all. The mental antecedent causes a movement that would have been a basic action, had the causal chain not been deviant.
Any event-causal theory of agency must require that the relevant mental attitudes cause the action in the right way. The right way of causation is non-deviant causation. The challenge is to spell out what non-deviant causation consists in within the event-causal framework; without, in particular, any appeal to some unanalyzed notion of agent-causation or control. Davidson (1974) was pessimistic about the prospects for finding an event-causal account of non-deviant causation, and he suggested that the standard theory is best understood as providing only necessary conditions for agency. Goldman (1970) suggested that giving an account of non-deviant causation is an empirical rather than a philosophical task. Since then, however, most proponents of the event-causal approach have acknowledged that the problem of deviant causal chains is a serious philosophical problem, and various solutions have been proposed (see Peacocke 1979; Brand 1984; Bishop 1989; Mele 2003; Schlosser 2007, 2011; Wu 2016).
3.3 Disappearing agents, naturalism, and dual standpoint theory
Sometimes it is suggested that the problem of deviant causal chains is merely a symptom of the deeper problem that event-causal theories altogether fail to capture agency, because they reduce actions to things that merely happen to us (Lowe 2008: 9, for instance). Put differently, this challenge says that the event-causal framework is deficient because it leaves out agents: all there is, on this view, is a nexus of causal pushes and pulls in which no one does anything (Melden 1961; Nagel 1986; see also Velleman 1992). This has been called the problem of the “disappearing agent” (Mele 2003: Ch. 10; Lowe 2008: 159–161; Steward 2013).
According to Mele (2003: Ch. 10), some formulations of this disappearing agent objection are easily dismissed. Some proponents of this challenge use the terms ‘event-causal order’ and ‘natural order’ interchangeably. This would seem to suggest that, on their view, agency is a supernatural phenomenon—a view that most contemporary philosophers find hard to take seriously. However, sometimes the challenge is raised in order to motivate alternative agent-causal or volitionist theories of agency, and the main proponents of agent-causal and volitionist theories maintain that their views are compatible with naturalism. They would argue that it is a mistake to presume that the event-causal order exhausts the natural order of things.
Further, the disappearing agent objection is not always put forward as a general objection to the event-causal framework. As we have seen (section 2.3), Velleman (1992) argued that the standard theory leaves out the agent, or the agent’s participation, and he proposed a solution to this problem within the event-causal framework. In his reply, Mele (2003: Ch. 10) suggested that it would be more appropriate to call this the problem of the “shrinking agent”. According to Velleman, the standard theory captures only deficient instances of agency, in which the agent’s participation is “unwitting” or “halfhearted”. Instances of deficient agency can be explained in terms of various capacities or properties that the agent does not possess, exercise, or instantiate; capacities and properties such as conscious awareness, reflective awareness, reason-responsiveness, self-control, self-governance, and so on. Given this, there is no need to conceptualize instances of deficient agency in terms of the agent’s absence. Further, doing so creates a rather implausible dichotomy between a kind of agency in which the agent does participate and a kind of agency in which the agent does not participate (Schlosser 2010).
Others, yet, press the disappearing agent objection in order to motivate a dual standpoint theory. According to dual standpoint theories, agency cannot be explained from any theoretical standpoint or metaphysical framework. Agency can only be understood from a practical and normative standpoint (Nagel 1986; Korsgaard 1996; Bilgrami 2006, for instance). Arguably, this view has its roots in Kant’s account of practical reason (see the entry on Kant and Hume on morality). Usually, dual standpoint theories do not reject metaphysics as such, and they often provide a metaphysical framework of their own. But they reject both reductive and non-reductive theories of agency, and they reject, in general, the notion that we can have a metaphysical account of what the exercise of agency consists in. They align themselves naturally with non-causal theories of reason explanation (see section 2). Both views tend to emphasize the normative and irreducibly teleological nature of reason explanation and, hence, agency. Dual standpoint theories have received relatively little attention in the philosophy of action. To many, it seems that such views are deeply unsatisfactory precisely because they refuse to face a central question in the metaphysics of agency: how can agents exercise control over their actions in a world in which all movements can be explained in terms of event-causation? It seems that this is in need of explanation, and it seems that this requires a metaphysics of agency (see Bishop 1989; Schlosser 2010). Nelkin (2000) has questioned the coherence of dual standpoint theories on the basis of an argument for the claim that they entail commitments to contradictory beliefs about free will.
3.4 Actions, events, processes, and omissions
We now turn, in brief, to some further issues in the metaphysics of agency. The first concerns the individuation of actions. You flick the switch, turn on the light, illuminate the room, and you thereby also alert the burglar. How many actions do you perform? According to coarse-grained (or minimizing) views on the individuation of actions, you perform one action under different descriptions (Anscombe 1957; Davidson 1963). According to fine-grained (or maximizing) views, how many actions you perform depends on how many act-properties are instantiated. If you instantiate four act-properties, then you perform four distinct actions (Goldman 1970; see also Ginet 1990). According to a third alternative, actions can have other actions as their components or parts (Thalberg 1977; Ginet 1990). According to all three views, actions are events, and the individuation of actions derives from different views on the individuation of events (see the entry on events). Not much work has been done on this recently (see, however, Enç 2003: Ch. 3). This is partly because it is now widely agreed that the individuation of actions has little or no bearing on other issues. To illustrate, the question of whether agency is to be explained within an event-causal or an agent-causal framework bears directly on various issues in the debate on free will and moral responsibility (see the entry on free will). But event-causal and agent-causal theories are both compatible with coarse-grained and fine-grained views on the individuation of actions. Similarly, it seems that the views on the individuation of actions have no substantial bearing on the question of whether or not reason explanations are causal explanations.
A related issue is whether actions are to be identified with the outcomes of causal processes or with the processes themselves. According to most versions of event-causal and agent-causal theories, an action is an event that is caused in the right way: the action is identical with or constituted by the outcome of that process. According to process views, the action is either identical with or constituted by that process (Searle 1983; Dretske 1988; Wu 2011; see also Thompson 2008). This issue has also not received much attention. Again, this is mainly because it is widely assumed that this issue has little or no substantial bearing on more fundamental issues in the metaphysics of agency and on debates outside the philosophy of action.
Another issue in the metaphysics of agency that has received more attention in the recent debate is the nature of omissions (in particular, intentional omissions). According to Sartorio (2009), an intentional omission is the absence of an action that is caused by the absence of an intention. She argues, on the basis of this account, that intentional omissions cannot be accommodated easily by the standard theory. In reply, Clarke (2010a) has argued that in cases of intentional omission the agent usually does have an intention not to act that plays an important causal role, and he has identified various parallels between intentional actions and intentional omissions. On his view, there are no major obstacles to an account of intentional omissions that is compatible and continuous with the standard theory of intentional action. Further, he argues that a failure to account for intentional omissions would not obviously be a shortcoming of a theory of intentional action. There are, after all, significant differences between actions and omissions, and so we should not expect that a theory of action provides all the resources that are required for an account of omissions. (For more on this see Clarke 2014.)
4. Empirical challenges and the role of consciousness
4.1 Reasons and causes
According to our commonsense conception of agency, our reasons and conscious intentions tend to make a real difference to how we act (D’Andrade 1987; Malle 2004, for instance). This assumption is part and parcel of the standard theory and of numerous psychological theories of intentional action and motivation (Fishbein and Ajzen 1975; Locke and Latham 1990; Heckhausen 1991; Gollwitzer 1993; Austin and Vancouver 1996, for instance). There are, however, various empirical findings from psychology and cognitive neuroscience that have been taken to show that this commonsense assumption is unwarranted, and that have raised interesting and challenging questions concerning the role of consciousness in the initiation and guidance of agency. This section provides an overview of the most relevant research.
An early and highly influential source of the skepticism concerning the causal relevance of our reasons is a theoretical review by Nisbett and Wilson (1977). This article reports numerous experiments and studies in which participants appear to construct or confabulate rationalizing explanations by giving reasons that could not possibly have been the reasons they acted for. Despite some rather serious methodological problems (White 1988), this research has achieved and retained the status of textbook knowledge within psychology and cognitive science. Moreover, it has been taken to show that ordinary reason explanations are not causal explanations, even though the authors themselves rejected this conclusion. On their view, the evidence shows, first and foremost, that verbal reports of mental states are based on self-interpretation (theorizing or rationalization), rather than on direct or introspective access. They noted that this epistemic view is perfectly compatible with the assumption that we can and often do give the actual causes of our actions when we give an ordinary reason explanation. The upshot is that, even if the proposed epistemic view is correct, there is nothing in the evidence which shows that reason explanations cannot be causal explanations, and there is nothing in the evidence which shows that reason explanations are usually not causal explanations.
It seems that the empirical evidence in support of situationism raises a challenge for our commonsense conception of agency. According to situationism, empirical research shows that commonsense explanations of actions in terms of character traits (such as honesty, kindness, or courage) are systematically mistaken or inaccurate, because this research shows that the actions in question are better explained in terms of situational features (Ross and Nisbett 1991; Harman 1999; Doris 2002). But none of the common philosophical theories of agency say that actions are to be explained in terms of the agent’s character traits, and so it seems that situationism does not raise a problem for the standard theory and other philosophical accounts of agency. Moreover, the interpretation of the empirical evidence in question and the argument for situationism have been controversial (Sreenivasan 2002, for instance). It has been argued, however, that this evidence raises the further question of whether we are genuinely reason-responsive. The evidence suggests that our actions are, under certain conditions, driven by situational and morally irrelevant factors even when there are salient moral reasons to act otherwise. This suggests that we (or most of us) are not as reason-responsive as we would like to think. But it is controversial whether or not the evidence supports any stronger claims than that (for more on this see Nelkin 2005; Schlosser 2013; Vargas 2013).
4.3 The Libet experiment and Wegner’s challenge
The most influential empirical challenge concerning the role of conscious intentions stems from Libet’s seminal neuroscientific work on the initiation of movements. In the Libet experiment (Libet 1985), participants were instructed to initiate a simple and predefined movement when the wish or urge to do so arises. During this, EEG measurements were taken to record the readiness potential, a brain potential that was known to precede intentional movements. The main finding was that the readiness potential precedes the occurrence of the conscious wish or urge to move by about 350ms. According to Libet, this shows that movements are not consciously initiated and that we do not have free will in the sense we commonly think we do (Libet 1999). The methodology of this experiment has been scrutinized extensively and criticized on a number of points. Some of those methodological issues have been addressed in follow-up experiments (Soon et al. 2008; Fried et al. 2011).
Most philosophers who have addressed Libet’s work have argued that the conclusions about the role of conscious intentions and about free will do not follow, even if it is granted that the experimental methods and results are sound. They have argued that there are alternative interpretations of the evidence that preserve a causal role for conscious intentions and that are as plausible and probable as Libet’s own interpretation of the evidence (Flanagan 1992: 136–138; Zhu 2003; Mele 2009a; Schlosser 2012b). Further, it has been argued that the experiment creates a very unusual and artificial context in which participants are instructed to decide spontaneously. Due to this, it is questionable that the results of the experiment can be generalized (Keller and Heckhausen 1990; Roskies 2011; Waller 2012; Schlosser 2014). Schurger et al. (2012) have proposed and tested a model that addresses this issue. According to this model, the timing of the movement in the Libet experiment is determined by random threshold crossings in spontaneous fluctuations in neural activity. In particular, the model says that a decision when to move is determined by random threshold crossings only when it is not constrained by any evidence or reasons for action. The fact that this model has been tested successfully supports the claim that the results from the Libet experiment and from similar follow-up studies do not generalize, because most of our everyday decisions clearly are constrained by evidence and by reasons for action.
A related challenge concerning the role of conscious intentions stems from Wegner’s model of apparent mental causation. According to this view, conscious intentions provide mere “previews” of our actions: they precede our actions, but they do not cause them (Wegner and Wheatley 1999; Wegner 2002). Wegner provided evidence of dissociations between the sense of agency and the actual exercise of agency, and he argued that the model of apparent mental causation provides the best explanation of the data. This view has been strongly criticized for conceptual ambiguities and argumentative flaws (see also section 4.5). One common objection is that the fact that the sense of agency can come apart from the exercise of agency is perfectly compatible with the assumption that conscious intentions tend to cause the intended actions. (See Bayne 2006; Mele 2009a; for a reply to Wegner’s inference to the best explanation see Schlosser 2012a.)
The work of Libet and Wegner has nevertheless raised interesting and challenging questions concerning the role of consciousness in agency. Proponents of the standard theory often qualify the view with the claim that the relevant mental attitudes need not be consciously accessed in order to play the right role in the exercise of agency. When, for instance, Davidson (1978: 85–86) considered the example of an agent who adds some spice to a stew with the intention of improving the taste, he claimed that intentional agency requires only that the agent would have reasoned on the basis of the relevant attitudes that the action is to be performed, had he been aware of those attitudes at the time. Few, though, would be prepared to accept the view that all of our actions might be like this: initiated and guided by attitudes that are not consciously accessed at the time. This raises various questions that are rarely addressed. How often, or in what kinds of cases, should actions be preceded by conscious intentions or conscious reasoning? What kind of consciousness is required? In cases where the relevant attitudes are not consciously accessed, must they be accessible? And so forth.
4.4 Automaticity and dual-system theory
One strand of empirical research that is relevant to questions concerning the role of consciousness in agency is the work on automaticity; in particular, the research on automatic goal pursuit. It has been shown, for instance, that the goal to perform a certain task accurately can be primed, so that the agent pursues the goal without any awareness of doing so (Bargh et al. 2001). There is a large body of research on this, and it has been suggested that this research shows that most of our actions are executed automatically and without conscious control (Bargh and Chartrand 1999, Custers and Aarts 2010). This claim is less radical than the claims put forward by Libet (1999) and Wegner (2002), as it concerns only the extent or scope of conscious control. Further, this appears to be much less challenging once it is noted that the great majority of automatic actions are sub-routines that are in the service of higher goals and long-term intentions. Consider, for instance, all the sub-routines that one performs while driving a car. The claim that such actions are performed automatically and without conscious control can be reconciled with our commonsense conception of agency and it can be accommodated by the standard theory, provided that conscious intentions and plans can recruit the relevant routines automatically, either by generating the relevant motor intentions, or by activating the relevant motor schemata. (For more on this see Pacherie 2008; Adams 2010; Clarke 2010b.)
Another relevant strand of research is the work on dual-process (or dual-system) theories of decision-making. According to such models, there are two distinct types of mental processes (or systems) that underlie decision-making and agency: one is typically characterized as automatic, effortless, and heuristics-based, and the other as conscious, deliberate, and rule-based. Dual-process models have been deployed widely and successfully in many areas of research (for overviews see Sloman 1996; Evans 2008; for critical reviews see Osman 2004; Keren and Schul 2009). In philosophy, it is commonly assumed, explicitly or implicitly, that there is one mechanism (or faculty) of practical reason that underlies practical reasoning and reason-based agency. This appears to be incompatible with the dual-process framework. What complicates this issue, though, is that there is no consensus on the details of the dual-process model. There is, for instance, no commonly accepted view on how the two processes (or systems) interact. Conscious and deliberate processes may have a top-down influence on automatic processes; the two processes may interact with each other; they may interfere with each other in some cases; there may be cases in which processing switches from one to the other; and so on. Not all of those possibilities are obviously incompatible with the assumption that there is one mechanism (or faculty) of practical reason. Further research is needed in order to investigate whether the two types of processes are in the relevant respects independent or whether they can be construed as interacting parts of one mechanism of decision-making. For a discussion of whether the dual-system framework is compatible with the philosophical standard theory of action see Schlosser 2019.
4.5 The sense of agency
There has been some debate concerning the kind of knowledge we have of our own actions. Most prominently, Anscombe (1957) argued that the knowledge of our actions is direct, in the sense that it is not based on observation or inference (see the entry on action). This section provides an overview of the closely related debate on the so called “sense of agency”. It seems that when we act, we have a sense of doing something: a sense of control and of being the agent or owner of the action. The debate about this has been driven largely by empirical findings from psychology and cognitive science, and it has become common to distinguish between the following three main positions.
The first is largely due to Wegner’s work on the “model of apparent mental causation” (Wegner and Wheatley 1999; Wegner 2002). According to this view, the sense of agency (or the “experience of conscious will”, as Wegner called it) arises when we interpret a conscious intention to perform a certain action as its cause. It says, in particular, that an agent interprets an intention as the cause of an action when the following conditions obtain: the intention proximately precedes the action, the action is consistent with the intention, and the agent is not aware of any factors that could provide an alternative explanation. Wegner’s argument for the model of apparent mental causation is based on various experiments, studies, and observations concerning illusions of control and failures in the ascription of agency. This work initiated the empirical study of the sense of agency, but Wegner’s model is now widely rejected. Philosophers have criticized the view for various conceptual ambiguities and flaws in the interpretation and use of the evidence (Nahmias 2002; Bayne 2006; Dennett 2008; and Mele 2009a, for instance). Moreover, there is now plenty of empirical evidence to suggest that the sense of agency is not merely a matter of self-interpretation (Haggard 2005; Bayne and Pacherie 2007; Gallagher 2007; and Synofzik et al. 2008).
The second account of the sense of agency is based on a feedback-comparator model of motor control. According to this model, the motor control system uses copies of motor commands in order to generate predictions of the ensuing bodily movements. Those predictions (so called “forward models”) are then used for comparisons between the predicted and the intended trajectories of movements, and for comparisons between the predicted and actual trajectories (based on information from sensory feedback). The model holds that a sub-personal system of motor control uses those predictions and comparisons in order to adjust and fine-tune the execution of bodily movements (Wolpert and Kawato 1998; Frith et al. 2000; Haggard 2005). It has been suggested that this system may also play a crucial role in the generation of the sense of agency. On this view, positive matches in the comparator system generate a sense of agency, whereas mismatches generate error signals that disrupt the sense of agency. This model can explain a wide range of phenomena concerning the sense and control of agency (Frith et al. 2000; Blakemore et al. 2002). More recently it has been argued, however, that this comparator model provides at best a partial explanation of the sense of agency (Haggard 2005; Bayne and Pacherie 2007; Gallagher 2007; Synofzik et al. 2008).
The third account of the sense of agency is a hybrid of the first two. Proponents of this approach usually distinguish between a basic sense of agency and post-act judgments concerning one’s agency. The basic sense of agency is construed as an online and phenomenologically rather thin experience that accompanies the performance of actions, and that does not necessarily require the presence of a conscious intention. Judgments about one’s agency, in contrast, are offline and usually post-act, and they are, thereby, subject to various biases that may distort the interpretation of one’s own agency. The feedback-comparator model is well suited to explain the basic sense of agency, whereas a self-interpretation theory, akin to Wegner’s, can explain why judgments about one’s own agency tend to be distorted or illusory under certain conditions (Bayne and Pacherie 2007; Gallagher 2007; Synofzik et al. 2008).
Pacherie (2008) develops the feedback-comparator model into an account of the phenomenology of agency that postulates three integrated feedback loops at three different levels of intention: the level of distal (or future-directed) intention, proximal (or present-directed) intention, and motor intention. These are levels of action specification in which progressively more detailed representations of the action are generated, at the later stages in response to perceptual and proprioceptive feedback. Pacherie’s main thesis is that the component representations of the stages in the process of action specification are strongly interconnected with the components and contents of the phenomenology of agency. At the level of proximal intentions, for instance, the model explains how the conceptual information that is inherited from the distal intention is integrated with perceptual input and situational constraints. Concerning the sense of agency, the model distinguishes between the awareness of what (the goal), awareness of how (the means), the sense of intentionality, the sense of initiation, the sense of situational control, and the sense of motor control. Shepherd (2017) argues that the components in the phenomenology of agency are so richly integrated that they can be regarded as fused in the total experience.
4.6 Perception and attention
The analytical philosophy of action neglected the role of perception and attention in the guidance of agency for a long time. Concerning perception it was common to assume, often without any elaboration, that the reference to the guiding role of beliefs takes care of the role of perception. The standard theory does not limit the causal role of beliefs to those that the agent considers or possesses prior to the execution of the action, and so we may assume that the beliefs that are supposed to play a causal guidance role include perceptual beliefs that the agent acquires during the performance of the action. More recent work (Mele 2003; Pacherie 2008; Schlosser 2012a) has shown that the standard theory is compatible with the feedback-comparator model of movement control outlined above (see section 4.5). This model accounts not only for the role of perceptual and proprioceptive input, but also for the guidance provided by internal predictions in the fine-tuning and execution of motor control.
The role of attention, however, was almost entirely unacknowledged, as pointed out by Wu (2011, 2016). Whenever we pursue a goal, we must not only select appropriate means. We must also select which features of the situation to attend to in the guidance of action. Wu conceptualizes this in terms of a “many-many problem”: in the pursuit of a goal we face typically too many perceptual inputs and too many possible behavioral outputs. The formation of an intention provides only a partial solution. The content of an intention usually includes the selection of the appropriate means. One intends, for instance, to open the window in order to let in some fresh air. This constrains the range of behavioral outputs and the range of perceptual inputs that one needs to attend to. But it does not determine a specific enough input-output mapping. Generally, the content of intentions is not fine-grained enough in order to properly guide the execution of movements and the direction of attention. Wu suggests that the many-many problems at those finer-grained levels are solved by attention. Following William James, Wu proposes that attention is the missing selection for action: the selection of perceptual inputs for the implementation of motor control. On this view, intention-mediated attention is an essential component of embodied agency. This raises the question of whether the selection of attention can itself be a genuine exercise of agency, and whether the proposed account can be extended so as to account for the intentional direction and control of attention.
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Thanks to Alfred Mele and Randolph Clarke for very helpful comments on an earlier draft of this entry.