Notes to Aristotelianism in the Renaissance

1. cf. Freedman’s arguments in Freedman 1999b, I, 9–12.

2. cf. e.g. Pomponazzi, 1970, 6s and espec. 110

3. Blair, 2008, 381 states concerning the partial independence even of more-or-less avowed Aristotelians:

More generally, the new awareness of the shortcomings of Aristotle even among Aristotelians led them to think of themselves as increasingly independent philosophers. For example, the German professor of philosophy Bartholomaeus Keckermann (1571–1609) distinguished the ‘bad Peripatetics,’ who were concerned only with what Aristotle said, form the good ones, like himself or the Paduan philosopher Jacopo Zabarella (1533–1589), who pursued the truth beyond what Aristotle had established. Indeed Zabarella described his goal as the pursuit of reason rather than Aristotelian authority. In his treatises on logic and method, he drew on the full range of sources available in his day, including medieval and the newly recovered ancient commentaries as well as sources outside the Aristotelian tradition. Many late Aristotelians justified taking liberties with their chosen authority by reiterating in various forms a dictum first coined by Aristotle himself to explain his own independent search for truth: ‘amicus Plato, sed magis amica veritas’ (‘Plato is my friend, but truth is a greater friend’).

4. For a more detailed description of literary genres of “Aristotelian” texts in the Renaissance see Lohr, 1974, 230–232 viz.Lohr, 1988, XIVs. Lohr lists: comentarius, quæstiones, cursus, paraphrase, monograph or independent treatise, compendium or abbreviatio, synopsis or conclusiones, flores or auctoritates, tabula, glossa, oratio, præfatio.

5. Lohr, 1974b, 228 writes concerning the years from 1500 to 1650: “It is an astonishing fact that the number of Latin Aristotle commentaries composed in this brief span exceeds that of the entire millennium from Boethius to Pomponazzi.”; the same sentence is found in Lohr, 1988, XIII.

6. Lohr, 1974b through Lohr, 1982.

7. See the tables in Blum, 1988, 141–148.

8. i.e., Lohr 1967 through 1974a. Ca. 230 of the commentaries listed there can be assigned to the second half of the 14th century (the number for the first half of the 14th century being considerably higher).

9. Risse, 1998a is a magnificent bibliography of printed philosophy texts up to 1800.

10. see previous footnote

11. Schmitt, 1983 is still the best general introduction to the variety and diverseness of Renaissance Aristotelianism in general and to the variety and diversity to be found in Renaissance Aristotle commentaries specially.

12. The same holds true (to an even greater extent) for Renaissance doctoral theses in philosophy. As shown by the literature listed in the bibliography (and the literature listed in the works listed there), the Renaissance is anything but an unstudied field. And yet Renaissance “Aristotelian” philosophical literature is perhaps the corpus with the greatest number of philosophy texts still unscrutinized by modern eyes.

13. See Frijhoff, 1996, 47–80 and Grendler, 2004, 23–28 for the reasons of the problems connected with the definition of “universities” in the Renaissance.

14. A list of universities with their founding dates can be found in Jílek, 1984, 325–339 and a useful bibliography of the “older” literature in Fletcher & Deal, 1984, 338–357.

15. Useful starting points are · Ashworth & al., 1988 (for 17th cent. England), · Baldini, 1998 (for 17th cent. Italy), · Blum, 1988 (for 17th cent. catholic universities), · Brockliss, 1996 (general), · Brockliss, 1993 (for 17th century France), · Courtenay, 1984 (for the influence of late mediaeval English authors especially on philosophy of nature), · Freedman, 1999a (general), · Grendler, 2002 (Italy; probably the best starting point for Italy) Rivera de Ventosa, 1998a & 1998b (Spain, 17th century), · Roberts & al., 1996 (universities outside of Europe), · Sparn & al., 2001 (for the “Sacrum Imperium” and northern and eastern parts of central Europe), · Vanpaemel & al., 1993 (for the Netherlands).

16. See Rubius, 1605a and Rubius, 1605b for the first version of his Logic (as far as it appeared in print), and Rubius, 1641 for the second version of his Logic (as far as it appeared in print), and Redmond, 2002 on the printed versions of these works.

17. On Ethics in Renaissance Italy: see Lines, 2002.

18. Melanchthon, 1843, 282: “Ideo dixi unum quoddam Philosophiae genus eligendum esse, quod minimum habeat Sophistices, et iustam methodum retineat: talis est Aristotelis doctrina.”

19. Erasmus, 1961, 404, arguing from outside universities, was a bit more enthusiastic: “Existere potest, verbi causa, qui doceat aliquid quod latuerit Aristotelem, nullum tamen arbitror exoriturum qui philosophiæ corpus tradit absolutius, quam ille tradit”, but even this statement praises Aristotle for his solid treatment of the whole of philosophy (corpus philosophiæ), not for the truth of his doctrines.

20. Niphus (1554, ††††3ra) says that Euclid and Ptolemy are used for fields not treated by the works we have from Aristotle and has some friendly words for Plato when it comes to theology. Cf. etiam Erasmus’ statement (Erasmus, 1961, 404) that it may well be, that there could be somebody who teaches something in the realm of philosophy that is missing in Aristotle.

21. Cesare Cremonini may have been one of the few exceptions to that generalisation (cf. Kuhn, 1996).

22. The rising number of pages devoted to “Schulphilosophie” in the new Ueberweg volumes on 17th century philosophy might perhaps serve as an indicium of this … .

23. This is not to claim that they cannot be productively studied also as adherents of a certain current or school: Hasse, 2004 might be a good example of such an approach: he (like Renan) uses the concept of “Averroism” to group together the authors studied by him, but he has to admit, that at least two of the three authors studied by him “depart” or “deviate” from Averroes’ doctrine(s).

24. Melanchthon’s De anima and Initia doctrinæ physicæ are examples of such texts.

25. The works by Lefevre d’Étaples (1525a and 1525b) can serve as examples for such texts.

26. Titelmans’ explanation of what is the “number” Aristotle speaks of when he defines time as “the number of motion according to earlier and later” in book IV of his Physics (Titelmans, 1578, 113 [De consideratione rerum naturalium, IV, 19]) can serve as an example of such precise interpretation.

27. This is not meant to say that Patrizi was the first one ever to “group” Aristotelians: this might have started with the first use of the term “averroist” sometime back in the 13th century, and Pererius’s grouping in his preface to De communibus omnium rerum naturalium principiis et affectionibus (1586, probably first published in 1576) is remarkable too. But in my view Patrizi’s sorting of the philosophers is the result of something like a history of philosophy approach, and it is more rigorous in some respects, and it might be the basic text for later attempts at such sorting.

28. as done by Brucker in Brucker, 1766, 117–148 (“De philosophis aristotelico-scholasticis”) & 148–352 (“De philosophis genuinam Aristotelis philosophiam sectantibus”).

29. Cf. Patrizi’s statement (Patrizi, 1581, 145): “… floruit autem Albertus circa annos 1260. fuitque Monachus ordini Dominici. Huius discipuli multi fuerunt, sed præcipuus inter omnes D. Thomas Italus Aquinas. Et Ioannes Duns Scotus. quos secuta est ingens monachorum multitudo, in diversas divisa sectas, Thomistarum, Scotistarum, Nominalium, Realium. Quorum numerum usque ad 12.millia ferunt pervenisse, qui scriptis aliquid vel philosophicum vel Theologicum mandarunt: quos, cum tanto numero innumerabiles sint, silentio præterire est a fastidio procul.”

30. As the Renaissance Studies/Renaissance Quarterly version of Lohr’s catalogue of Renaissance Latin Aristotle Commentaries indicates older secondary literature not listed in Lohr, 1988, it should not be considered as completely replaced by Lohr 1988.

31. This is a slightly revised version (with additions and bibliographical updates) of Schmitt, 1983.

Copyright © 2018 by
Heinrich Kuhn <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free