Notes to Compatibilism

1. Referring to free will as a “term of art,” Timothy O'Connor (2002) makes the same point in the opening sentences of the entry Free Will:

Most philosophers suppose that the concept of free will is very closely connected to the concept of moral responsibility. Acting with free will, on such views, is just to satisfy the metaphysical requirement on being responsible for one's action.

2. Randolph Clarke (2000) begins his entry Incompatibilist (Nondeterministic) Theories of Free Will by characterizing free will in terms of control, “To act with free will is to exercise a certain type of control over one's behavior.”

3. Other reasons for attaching importance to the free will problem include the presumed connection between free will and either agency, autonomy, creativity, meaning in life, or aesthetic value (See Kane, 1996). It should be noted that some regard the free will problem as significant independently of the topic of moral responsibility. Others hold that even if the free will problem derives its significance primarily from its connection with moral responsibility, the problem is better approached, at least initially, without reflecting upon the notion of moral responsibility. This, however, is a minority opinion, especially among compatibilists. This entry will proceed under the assumption that the free will problem draws much of its significance from its connection with issues of moral responsibility, and that the problem, as well as compatibilist solutions to it, are usefully formulated and addressed by acknowledging the connection between the two notions.

4. As a substitute for the role of causal necessitation, the free will problem can also be expressed in terms of God's foreknowledge. This entry will set aside the problem of the relationship between free will and God.

5. I would like to thank Edward Zalta, principal editor of The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy, for encouraging me to present the free will problem in terms of entanglement, and for suggesting this Classical Formulation of it.

6. For example, see the compatibilist positions advanced by Dennett (1984b), Fischer (1994), Fischer and Ravizza (1998), Frankfurt (1971), Haji (2002) Mele (1995), Wallace (1994). For incompatibilist examples, see Hunt (2000), Mele (1995), Pereboom (2001), and Stump (1996a).

7. Consider another weakness of the Classical Formulation. According to this formulation, the most natural way to assert the thesis of indeterminism is by denying (3), that every event has a cause. But this seems plausible only if it is assumed that all causal relations are necessitating or deterministic. Some contemporary libertarians, event indeterministic libertarians, wish to deny that causal determinism is true by denying that all events in the universe are causally necessitated or causally determined (they understand “necessitated” or “determined” in these contexts to be synonymous). Yet these libertarians do not wish to deny that every event is caused by other events. (See, for example, Robert Kane (1996) or Mele (1995).) The event indeterministic libertarians only mean to claim that there is a kind of causal relation between events that is weaker than the one involving the notion of necessity or determination. On this account, event X can indeterministicly cause event Y by raising the probability that Y will occur. Notice that the Classical Formulation of the free will problem does not provide this sort of event indeterministic libertarian a clean way to situate her position. She would not deny (3), that every event has a cause, because she endorses this presupposition of natural science. In asserting that indeterminism is true, she is not denying that every event has a cause.  But denying (4), which is open to her, is misleading. Other sorts of libertarians, agent causal libertarians, deny (4) and yet hold that a causal relation is a necessitating or a determining one. These agent causal libertarians simply claim that there is a different species of (necessitating or determining) causation than one that occurs only between events. Hence, on the agent libertarian view, when an event that is an action is caused by an agent, it is causally necessitated by the agent; it is not merely one in which the probability that it will occur is raised. (For example, see Chisholm (1964), Taylor (1974), or O'Connor (2002).) The action, however, is not part of a fully causally determined world—that is, a world in which all events are determined by an unbroken chain of prior causally determined events (tracing back to origins in the distant past). What the Classical Formulation lacks is a way of distinguishing between a denial of (4) that still assumes that all causal relations involve the notion of necessity or determination, and a denial of (4) that rejects that assumption.

8. This is the characterization of free will that O'Connor (2002) adopts in the SEP entry, “Free Will.” O'Connor writes, “Free Will’ is largely a philosophical term of art for a particular sort of capacity of rational agents to choose a course of action from among various alternatives” (2002).

9. See Borges' story, “The Garden of Forking Paths” (1974, pp.81-92). The reference is from Fischer (1994, p.3).

10. I would like to thank Edward Zalta, principal editor of The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy, for suggesting (roughly) this formulation of the argument.

11. For incompatibilists who understand free will primarily in terms of a Garden of Forking Paths, and who thus embrace the Classical Incompatibilist Argument (or some variation of it), see Chisholm (1964), Ginet (1990), Kane (1996), O'Connor (2000), Rowe (1991), van Inwagen (1983), Wiggins (1973), and Widerker (1995).

12. This is similar to the way that Randolph Clarke (2000) characterizes free will in his SEP entry, “Incompatibilist (Nondeterministic) Theories of Free Will.” Clarke writes, “To act with free will is to exercise a certain type of control over one's behavior; what you do, when you act freely, is up to you” (my emphasis) (2000).

13. I would like to thank Edward Zalta, principal editor of The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy, for encouraging me to develop this argument.

14. For incompatibilists who understand free will primarily in terms of a Source Model, and who thus embrace the Source Incompatibilist Argument (or some variation of it), see Hunt (2002), Mele (1995), Pereboom (2001), and Stump (1996a).

15. Thanks to Derk Pereboom for pointing out that some classical compatibilists are better interpreted as “one way” compatibilists.

16. The notion power necessity was developed by Carl Ginet (1980, 1983), and endorsed by John Martin Fischer (1994). A more precise way to state that a person, S, has no power over a fact, p, might be to say: “p obtains, and S cannot so act that p would be false” (Fischer, 1994, p.8). There are various other formulations designed to make power necessity, or some similar notion, more precise (see references in note 17 below). For our purposes, however, it is sufficient to speak in terms of an agent's power over facts.

17. For advanced formulations and discussions, see Fischer, 1983, 1986, 1994; Ginet, 1966, 1980, 1990; Kapitan 2002; Lamb, 1977; McKay and Johnson, 1996; O'Connor 1993, 2000; van Inwagen 1975, 1983, 2002; Widerker, 1987; and Wiggins, 1973.

18. Critics of Frankfurt's argument include Ginet, 1996; Kane, 1996; McKenna, 1997; Naylor, 1984; O'Connor, 2000; Otsuka, 1998; Rowe, 1991; van Inwagen, 1983; Widerker, 1995; Wyma, 1997; and M. Zimmerman, 1988.  Advocates include Fischer, 1982, 1994, 1999; Haji, 1998; Hunt, 2000; McKenna, 2003; Mele, 1995; Mele and Robb, 1998; Pereboom, 2001; and Stump, 1990, 1996a. For the most recent discussions see Widerker and McKenna (editors) 2003.

19. For an extremely helpful in-depth discussion of these issues, see Kapitan 2002.

20. For an excellent assessment of these compatibilist replies to the consequence argument, see Fischer 1994. Fischer presents thoughtful reasons for rejecting each of the three attempts considered here, though he endorses none of them.

21. “The New Dispositionalism” is a term coined by Randolph Clarke in a recent critical paper on this compatibilist strategy (2008).

22. For another important sort of mesh theory that is not hierarchically structured, see the one advanced by Gary Watson in his impressive paper, “Free Agency” (1975). There Watson advances a mesh theory between the motivational and the evaluative features of rational agency.

23. All page references to Frankfurt 1971 are to the reprint in Watson (ed.) 1982.

24. But perhaps Wolf would not object to this incompatibilist challenge. There is room, on her view, to hold that praiseworthiness is compatible with determinism though blameworthiness is not. (Thanks again to Derk Pereboom for bringing this point to my attention.)

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D. Justin Coates <>

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