Notes to Theories of the Common Law of Contracts

1. Note that although this definition of offer invokes intentions to assume obligations, the contemplated obligations need not, under U.S. American law, be specifically legal. Thus the Restatement adds that

Neither real not apparent intention that a promise be legally binding is essential to the formation of a contract, but a manifestation of intention that a promise shall not affect legal relations may prevent the formation of a contract. (R2 Contracts: §21)

2. An early and prominent account is Kant’s, see The Metaphysics of Morals (1797 [1996]: 6:271, p. 57). More recent elaborations of variants of the will theory include Charles Fried, Contract as Promise (1981), Randy Barnett, “A Consent Theory of Contract” (1986), and Jody Kraus, The Correspondence of Contract and Promise (2009). An unconventional variant appears in Dori Kimel, From Promise to Contract: Towards a Liberal Theory of Contract (2003).

3. As the Restatement says, expectation damages “put [the promisee] in as good a position as he would have been in had the contract been performed, that is, had there been no breach.” (R2 Contracts: §344 cmt. a).

4. The precise content of fiduciary loyalty varies across fiduciary contexts. For a general account see Ernest Weinrib 1975.

5. See, e.g., 200 North Gilmor, LLC v. Capital One, National Association 2012:

A “negligent misrepresentation claim based on statements promissory or predictive in nature” is not viable “[u]nless the plaintiff puts forward evidence tending to show that the ‘promisor’ or ‘predictor’ made the statements with the present intention not to perform….”. But, a promise made with the present intention not to perform is perforce, an intentional misrepresentation, not a negligent one, and thus cannot sustain an action for negligent misrepresentation. Put another way, [i]n order for a negligent misrepresentation claim based upon a promise of future conduct to be actionable, the party making the representation regarding its future conduct must know, at the time it makes the representation, that it does not intend to carry out the promise. (citations omitted).

6. In a characteristic case, a firm’s board of directors offered a long-time employee a pension payable whenever she elected to retire. The employee accepted the offer, worked for a time, and then retired, whereupon a new management refused to pay the pension. No obligation arose on the model of orthodox contract, as the pension-promise was not made to induce retirement (and announced on its face that retirement was just the means of taking up the pension, to be adopted at the employee’s discretion whenever she chose). Nevertheless, a fully formed promise (involving offer and acceptance) existed, and the management making the promise clearly intended it to be legally binding. A court thus employed Restatement §90 to hold that promise binding and require employer to pay the promised pension. See Feinberg v. Pfeiffer co., (1959).

7. Prominent economic analyses of efficient contract remedies include: Robert L. Birmingham 1970; Gwyn Quillen 1988; Goetz & Scott 1983; Anthony Kronman 1978; Richard Craswell 1988; Aaron S. Edlin 1996: 104–11; Aaron S. Edlin & Alan Schwartz 2003: 44–52; Steven Shavell 1980: 472; A. Mitchell Polinsky 1983: 433; A. Mitchell Polinsky & Steven Shavell 1998: 936–38; Daniel Markovits and Alan Schwartz 2011.

8. Scanlon calls these principles against manipulation and in favor of due care M and D. Principle M states:

In the absence of special justification, it is not permissible for one person, A, in order to get another person, B, to do some act, X (which A wants B to do and which B is morally free to do or not do but would otherwise not do), to lead B to expect that if he or she does X then A will do Y (which B wants but believes that A will otherwise not do), when in fact A has no intention of doing Y if B does X, and A can reasonably foresee that B will suffer significant loss if he or she does X and A does not reciprocate by doing Y. (Scanlon 1998: 298)

Principle D states:

One must exercise due care not to lead others to form reasonable but false expectations about what one will do when one has good reason to believe that they would suffer significant loss as a result of relying on these expectations. (Scanlon 1998: 300)

9. This is Scanlon’s principle F, which states:

If (1) A voluntarily and intentionally leads B to expect that A will do X (unless B consents to A’s not doing so); (2) A knows that B wants to be assured of this; (3) A acts with the aim of providing this assurance, and has good reason to believe that he or she has done so; (4) B knows that A has the beliefs and intentions just described; (5) A intends for B to know this, and knows that B does know it; and (6) B knows that A has this knowledge and intent; then, in the absence of special justification, A must do X unless B consents to X’s not being done. (Scanlon 1998: 304)

10. In some respects, Scanlon accepts that the principles of promise and contract that his account justifies depart from conventional understandings of these moral and legal forms and thus proposes a revisionist view. For example, Scanlon asserts (on the face of his principle of Fidelity) that the obligation of promise-keeping arises only when promisors know that their promisees “want[] to be assured” that the promised action will be performed (Scanlon 1998: 304). And he adds that when a promise creates no expectations, perhaps because it is disbelieved, no obligation of promise-keeping arises (Scanlon 1998: 311–314). Both the everyday morality of promising and the law of contract adopt different positions on both issues.

11. Scanlon says:

[I]t is reasonable to want a principle of fidelity that requires performance rather than compensation and that, once an expectation has been created, does not always recognize a warning that it will not be fulfilled as adequate protection against loss, even if the warning is given before any further decision has been made on the basis of the expectation. (Scanlon 1998: 304)

12. More precisely, Scanlon defends a principle, which he calls EF (for enforcing fidelity) which holds:

It is permissible legally to enforce remedies for breach of contract that go beyond compensation for reliance losses, provided that these remedies are not excessive and that they apply only in cases in which the following conditions hold: (1) A, the party against whom the remedy is enforced, has, in the absence of objectionable constraint and with adequate understanding (or the ability to acquire such understanding) of his or her situation, intentionally led B to expect that A would do X unless B consented to A’s not doing so; (2) A had reason to believe that B wanted to be assured of this; (3) A acted with the aim of providing this assurance, by indicating to B that he or she was undertaking a legal obligation to do X; (4) B indicated that he or she understood A to have undertaken such an obligation; (5) A and B knew, or could easily determine, what kind of remedy B would be legally entitled to if A breached this obligation; and (6) A failed to do X without being released from this obligation by B, and without special justification for doing so. (Scanlon 2001: 105).

Scanlon believes that his argument shows only that such legal enforcement of contracts is permitted, not that it is required. See Scanlon 2001: 106.

13. T. M. Scanlon thus embeds these arguments about agreement-keeping in the broader moral theory that he calls “contractualism,” according to which “[a]n act is wrong if its performance under the circumstances would be disallowed by any system of rules for the general regulation of behaviour which no one could reasonably reject as a basis for informed, unforced general agreement” (Scanlon 1982: 110).

14. The benefits that Scanlon mentions include the psychological benefit of the confidence such protection promotes as well as the more direct benefit of increasing the likelihood that promisors will perform as promised (Scanlon 1998: 302–03). Here Scanlon might have added the benefits associated with encouraging reliance that figure so prominently in utilitarian and economic accounts of promise and contract.

15. After all, a person can always avoid the obligation to satisfy expectations simply by warning that she is not making any promises.

16. These benefits accrue, moreover, not just to the promisees who receive them directly but also to promisors who desire to be able to give firm assurances in order to increase the value of their promises and hence of what they can demand in exchange for them. See Scanlon 2001: 108.

17. The error costs that accrue when legal enforcement is ordered against a person who has not in fact made an enforceable contract are kept small, Scanlon asserts, by the strict and fairly formal requirements for entering into a contract (Scanlon 2001: 108). And the compliance costs that accrue when a promisor must make good the expectations created by a promise she has come to regret command little respect in the contractualist calculus, because they can be avoided ex ante at a low-cost by refraining from making contractual promises and can be avoided ex post only by neglecting a moral obligation imposed by the moral principle of promise-keeping, and this is not a cost that promisors can reasonably cite as a ground for rejecting the legal enforcement of contractual expectations (Scanlon 2001).

18. See generally Univ. of Colo. Found., Inc. v. Am. Cyanamid Co. (2003), Dastgheib v. Genentech, Inc. (2006), Daily v. Gusto Records, Inc. (1990), EarthInfo, Inc. v. Hydrosphere Res. Consultants, Inc. (1995).

19. See, e.g., Jones v. Star Credit Corp. (1969). The Jones court applied unconscionability directly to the price term of a consumer contract. Quoting Lord Hardwicke, the court proposed that fraud might be “‘apparent from the intrinsic nature and subject of the bargain itself; such as no man in his senses and not under delusion would make’” (298 N.Y.S.2d 264, 265). Jones thus effectively held that substantive unconscionability, on its own, might establish a (rebuttable?) presumption of procedural unconscionability, and thus enable a party to avoid a contract. This was not far off from holding that the unconscionability doctrine established (at least for retail sales to consumers) the principle of a just price in American law.

20. See, e.g., U.C.C. §2–719(3)

[l]imitation of consequential damages for injury to the person in the case of consumer goods is prima facie unconscionable but limitation of damages where the loss is commercial is not.

21. See, e.g., Patterson v. Walker-Thomas Furniture Co., Inc. 1971. The Patterson court acknowledged that in a proper case gross overpricing may be raised as an element of unconscionability, but it insisted that price (even grossly unreasonable) is only one of the elements of unconscionability. In particular, Patterson holds that unconscionability may not be found without an independent consideration of the whether or not the buyer exercised meaningful choice in entering into the contract.

The doctrinal discussions in this and note 20 follow Daniel Markovits 2012: 1683–1698.

22. The response to economic accounts of contract law in this respect follows Rawls’s well-known criticism of utilitarianism, namely that it “does not take seriously the distinction between persons.” (1971: 27).

23. See Stephen A. Smith 2000: 116–17. Smith observes that reliance can ground obligation only if the promisee is entitled to rely and claims that only a harm-independent account of promissory obligation could generate such entitlements.

24. Scanlon’s suggestion that contract obligation might be built up out of obligations not to manipulate others and to take due care when leading others to form expectations seeks to escape the circle by employing pre-contractual values to explain the wrongfulness of lying or careless contractual promises and then building a general principle of contractual fidelity by reference to the fact that promisees may reasonably trust promisors to avoid these earlier wrongs. But Scanlon’s theory achieves its results only at the cost of remaining unable to account for the fact that contract obligation forbids even honest and careful promisors (who are innocently overtaken by events) from changing their minds. (For a similar criticism of Scanlon’s view see Kolodny & Wallace 2003: 140.) Scanlon thus requires another idea to explain the strictness of contractual obligation, and it is difficult to see how the required idea might simultaneously avoid invoking contingent background conditions that support only some promises but not all and avoid importing the obligation to keep contract that requires a defense.

25. Here Scanlon might have added the benefits associated with encouraging reliance that figure so prominently in utilitarian and economic accounts of promise and contract.

26. After all, a person can always avoid the obligation to satisfy expectations simply by warning that she is not making any promises.

27. These benefits accrue, moreover, not just to the promisees who receive them directly but also to promisors who desire to be able to give firm assurances in order to increase the value of their promises and hence of what they can demand in exchange for them. See Scanlon 2001: 108.

28. The error costs that accrue when legal enforcement is ordered against a person who has not in fact made an enforceable contract are kept small, Scanlon asserts, by the strict and fairly formal requirements for entering into a contract (Scanlon 2001: 108). And the compliance costs that accrue when a promisor must make good the expectations created by a promise she has come to regret command little respect in the contractualist calculus, because they can be avoided ex ante at a low-cost by refraining from making contractual promises and can be avoided ex post only by neglecting a moral obligation imposed by the moral principle of promise-keeping, and this is not a cost that promisors can reasonably cite as a ground for rejecting the legal enforcement of contractual expectations (Scanlon 2001: 108).

29. Not every court has always adopted this approach. See, e.g., Parev Prods. Co. v. I. Rokeach & Sons, Inc. (1941), which comes close to taking a fiduciary duty view of contractual obligations, seeking “the really equitable solution” as opposed to “a limited rule of good faith” (p. 150).

30. For cases, see, e.g., Sessions, Inc. v. Morton (1974), Ryder Truck Rental, Inc. v. Cent. Packing Co. (1965), Perkins v. Standard Oil Co. (1963).

31. I owe this reference to Andrew Gold.

Copyright © 2015 by
Daniel Markovits <daniel.markovits@yale.edu>

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